2011.04.09

David Foster Wallace

Fate, Time, and Language: An Essay on Free Will

David Foster Wallace, Fate, Time, and Language: An Essay on Free Will, Steven M Cahn and Maureen Eckert (eds.), Columbia University Press, 2011, 252pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780231151573.

Reviewed by Daniel Speak, Loyola Marymount University


I accepted the invitation to review this collection, headlined by Wallace's undergraduate senior thesis, on something of a lark. Though I knew Wallace's fiction at the time only by reputation, I had been impressed by the graduation address he delivered at Kenyon College in 2005. This address, you will likely recall, had gone more or less viral among academics because of its profound and quirky defense of the value of a liberal arts education (sending up the whole graduation speech genre while nevertheless saying the sorts of things we have been hoping to hear from sweaty commencement speakers since we first were forced to attend these events). Of course, I was also aware of Wallace's 2008 suicide and the convulsions in the literary world it had caused. Frankly, however, I had my worries that the publication of his undergraduate thesis was a purely opportunistic endeavor under these circumstances. I convinced myself that accepting the invitation might nevertheless have at least two positive results. First, I could use it as a provocation and motivation to tackle Wallace's supposedly mind-bending Infinite Jest (1000+ pages!). Second, an honest and negative assessment of the philosophical merit of the volume, I told myself, might cast some useful light on the opportunism I was afraid was behind its publication.

Having confessed my antecedent suspicions, I now publicly repent them. Fate, Time, and Language contains a great deal of first-rate philosophy throughout, and not least in Wallace's extraordinarily professional and ambitious essay -- an essay that, at 80 pages, composes about a quarter of the volume. The collection (including Wallace's contribution) is tightly focused around the traditional problem of fatalism, especially as this problem was invigorated for contemporary philosophy by Richard Taylor's characteristically elegant and inventive explication in his 1962 Philosophical Review article (also included in the volume). Quite apart from the inclusion of Wallace's essay, the collection of essays in response to Taylor's article could stand alone as a useful (if short) anthology. The addition of Wallace's essay, together with the various bits of reflection on his life as a student and writer, make it both intellectually rich and psychologically illuminating.

Structurally, the volume is composed of four parts. First, there is an excellent general introduction by James Ryerson that provides some useful history with respect to both the contemporary fatalism debate and Wallace's intellectual development up to and after the completion of his thesis at Amherst College in the spring of 1985. In addition, Ryerson does some explaining to non-philosophers of how the central argument of Wallace's thesis works (here I think philosophers will do better to skip these explanations and read the thesis itself first -- not because there is anything misleading in Ryerson's treatment but because it seems clear to me that Wallace's argument will be able to speak for itself). Finally, Ryerson connects Wallace's philosophical interests to his larger work as a novelist and essayist.

The second part of the volume attempts to provide the immediate philosophical background to Wallace's thesis: a collection of thirteen short essays beginning with Taylor's initial essay and followed by the most important responses to it appearing over the next three or four years (and each appearing in either Analysis, The Philosophical Review, or The Journal of Philosophy). These essays are of a uniformly high quality authored by visible figures in the field (including, for example, John Turk Saunders, Bruce Aune, and Steven Cahn). There are also two further short notes from Taylor himself, commenting on the responses provoked by his argument. All of this quite nicely serves the stated purpose of putting Wallace's essay in context and raising the level of intrigue with respect to the central problem it addresses and the solution it offers. In addition, however, these background articles also provide an illuminating glimpse into the mood and methodology of professional philosophy in the 1960s.

The third section opens with Maureen Eckert's brief introduction to Wallace's essay, which emphasizes the new formal resources for semantics and modality that emerged in the 1970s in the work, in particular, of Saul Kripke, David Lewis, and Richard Montague. As Eckert notes, Wallace's strategy (remarkably sophisticated in its own right, but especially so for an undergraduate) was to bring these new resources to bear on the old problem. With all of the stage-setting now in place, Wallace's thesis, entitled "Richard Taylor's 'Fatalism' and the Semantics of Physical Modality," is printed in full.

Finally, the volume concludes with Jay Garfield's short recollection of Wallace as a student (especially during the writing of his senior thesis) and an appendix. The appendix is Richard Taylor's earlier (1957) article "The Problem of Future Contingencies."

The target problem of this volume is, of course, perennial. According to the form of fatalism that Taylor's influential paper appears to commend, whatever does occur is the only thing that ever could have occurred. This applies also to occurrences that are actions. Thus, whatever you in fact do is the only thing you ever could have done. As Taylor puts it, the fatalist "thinks he cannot do anything about the future." What is especially spooky (or suspicious) about fatalism is that this counterintuitive conclusion about our powerlessness over the future is supposed to follow from what initially appear to be uncontroversial and largely formal commitments. In other words, fatalism is the claim that it is something like a conceptual or semantic truth that no one acts freely. Taylor constructs his fatalistic argument from six presuppositions and a story.[1] The six presuppositions are:

1. Any proposition is either true or, if not true, then false.

2. If one state of affairs is sufficient for another, then the first cannot occur without the second occurring.

3. If one state of affairs is necessary for another, then the second cannot occur with the first occurring.

4. If one set of conditions is necessary for another, then the second is sufficient for the first (and conversely).

5. No agent can perform an act in the absence of some necessary condition for the occurrence of that act.

6. The mere passage of time does not enhance or decrease an agent's powers or abilities.

The story, inspired by Aristotle, goes like this:

Let us now imagine that I am a naval commander, about to issue my order of the day to the fleet. We assume, further, that, within the totality of other considerations prevailing, my issuing of a certain kind of order will ensure that a naval battle will occur tomorrow, whereas if I issue another kind of order, this will ensure that no naval battle occurs. Now, then, I am about to perform one or the other of these two acts, namely, one of issuing an order of the first sort or one of the second sort. Call these alternative acts O and O' respectively. And call the two propositions, "A naval battle will occur tomorrow" and "No naval battle will occur tomorrow," Q and Q' respectively. We can assert, then, that if I do act O, then my doing such will ensure that there will be a naval battle, whereas if I do O', my doing that will ensure that no naval battle will occur (p. 46).

But now we have the makings of an argument that either the commander didn't have the power to issue O or he didn't have the power to issue O'. That is, we have the makings of an argument for the conclusion that, appearances notwithstanding, none of us ever enjoys the sort of genuine two-way power we ordinarily associate with free will.

The argument goes like this:

1'. If Q is true, then it is not within my power to do O' (for in case Q is true, then there is, or will be, lacking a condition essential for my doing O', the condition, namely, of there being no naval battle tomorrow).

2'. But if Q' is true, then it is not within my power to do O (for a similar reason).

3'. But either Q is true or Q' is true.

\4'. Either it is not within my power to do O, or it is not within my power to do O'.

In sketching Wallace's distinctive response to Taylor's argument it is worth noting first what seems most to have drawn and kept his attention here. More than one of Wallace's teachers recount that he appeared to have been sincerely disturbed by something like the form of the argument. Reflecting back on his initial discussions with Wallace about the thesis project, Garfield recalls that the young Wallace "was outraged that Taylor sought, and claimed to have derived, an explicitly metaphysical conclusion from purely logical or semantic premises; and he was genuinely offended by the failure of professional philosophers to have put things right" (p. 220). Not only does this reveal a sophisticated philosophical sensibility, it also allows us to see both why Wallace was not satisfied with many of the responses to Taylor's argument that had already appeared in the literature and what was unique in his own approach. Showing that the Taylor argument is unsound simply would not be enough for Wallace, since this would leave the structure of the argument (and its aspirations) essentially intact. What needed to be vindicated was the thought that a metaphysical conclusion cannot follow from purely semantic premises. Therefore, what needed to be shown was that the Taylor argument is invalid -- that the conclusion does not follow from the premises (and the assumptions underlying them). For this reason, Wallace makes every effort to maintain Taylor's six assumptions.

Wallace's strategy for revealing the invalidity in the Taylor argument is to demonstrate the logical nonequivalence of two propositions that the argument runs together. Notice that premises 1' and 2' of Taylor's argument are derived, by the application of something like contraposition, from the stipulations that the occurrence of O will ensure that Q is true and the occurrence of O' will ensure that Q' is true. Given these physical modalities, we can conclude that the falsity of Q would physically necessitate the absence of O and the falsity of Q' would physically necessitate the absence of O'. Having taken these points into consideration, there are still two different ways to understand the claim expressed in 1' (and the same point could be made, obviously, with respect to 2'):

MT1: If there will be no sea battle tomorrow, then today it is not physically possible for the commander to issue the order.

MT2: If there will be no sea battle tomorrow, then tomorrow it will not be physically possible for the commander to issue the order today.[2]

To bring out the nonequivalence, Wallace develops a sophisticated semantics for the physical modality he takes to be at work in Taylor's argument (the "not within my power" locution of Taylor's argument should be understood in terms of physical -- rather than logical or metaphysical -- impossibility). With the semantics worked out, Wallace is able to offer a formal argument for his claim that while (the properly formalized expression of) MT1 entails (the properly formalized expression of) MT2, the converse is false. Furthermore, Wallace argues that, while it is only MT1 that can get us to fatalism, Taylor's argument can, at best, establish only MT2.

This is, of course, far too quick an explication of Wallace's argument and it does little justice to the insight and rigor of his work. In particular, what I have said above may have slipped past you without commanding your recognition. He really does develop, essentially from scratch, a sophisticated semantics for an intuitive brand of physical modality (that he titles "system J") modeled on the work in logical modality of Kripke and Montague. And he really does deploy this system to reveal the formal nonequivalence between MT1 and MT2 in this system. Thus, what Wallace takes himself to have shown is that accepting the validity of the fatalist argument would require rejecting his system J. It turns out to be very difficult to see how one would go about rejecting system J. It is, therefore, not as surprising as you might have anticipated that Jay Garfield reports: "I regarded his argument as decisive then, and I still do." I have noted Garfield's considered assessment not in order to scrutinize it but only to emphasize the serious treatment this volume (and Wallace's thesis in particular) merits. Whether or not Garfield's judgment can ultimately be vindicated, the judgment itself gives the readers of this review a forceful reason to take Wallace's argument seriously.

If there is a clear shortcoming in Wallace's thesis, it is that Wallace has misunderstood certain aspects of Taylor's argument and motivations. This possibility is brought out (gently) by Steven Cahn both in his very brief introduction to the background essays and in his epigraph to the appendix (included, one thinks, to help emphasize just the point Cahn makes in his introduction). It is true that for all Wallace says in his essay he may indeed have thought that Richard Taylor was a fatalist; which would have been a mistake -- a mistake that, Cahn reports, has been quite widely made even by professional philosophers. Taylor's infamous fatalism paper was intended, it seems, not as a defense of its title position but rather as a reductio ad absurdum of the six presuppositions on which his argument depends. As the appendix paper makes clear, Taylor followed Aristotle in rejecting presuppositions 1 and 6. That is, Taylor believed that the truth-value of future contingent propositions is indeterminate and that the passage of time alone could make the determining difference (thereby affecting the powers of agents). On a related note, recall Wallace's resistance to the idea that a metaphysical thesis could be established by appeal to purely semantic premises. Upon reflection (and, again, Cahn makes this point), the sixth presupposition does not appear to be a purely semantic claim. It seems, instead, to be a full-blooded metaphysical claim (about the relationship between time and power). But even if Wallace was mislead about Taylor's wider aims and motivated by a misunderstanding (an explanation of which I can't quite reconstruct) of the status of the fatalist argument's premises, his essay is impressive philosophy. It is possible that its most important contribution will be to return some contemporary attention to the ancient problem and to the worthy work of Richard Taylor.

Having read Infinite Jest alongside the collection under review here, I cannot ignore the parallels between Hal Incandenza (the novel's intellectually precocious teen-aged central character) and the collegiate David Foster Wallace -- who feverishly wrote his thesis in the Amherst philosophy department during his senior year while also penning a complete novel for a second thesis in the English department.[3] In a gesture we are now in position to appreciate, Wallace has Hal Incandenza submit an essay for his college applications entitled "Montague Grammar and the Semantics of Physical Modality". Perhaps more tellingly, we find Incandenza late in the novel, trying to come to terms with his own almost involuntary intellectual precision, noticing that "The dedication and sustained energy that go into true perspicacity and expertise were exhausting even to think about." Whatever this kind of dedication and sustained energy ultimately exacted from Wallace himself, reading his careful and fulsome response to Taylor's fatalism argument reveals that it did contribute to his being an enormously promising philosopher. I find it hard to disagree with Garfield in his conclusion that had Wallace stuck with philosophy, and had he lived, he would have been a major figure in our field. There is also no denying the strange excitement of looking in on the development of a young and uniquely powerful intellect. Those who have read John Rawls' undergraduate thesis will, I think, have a similar experience in reading Wallace's.


[1] Actually, Taylor tells two stories, but we don't need them both here.

[2] I have tried to put these disambiguations in natural language (rather than in the various more formal languages Wallace deploys).

[3] This novel became The Broom of the System, Viking Penguin Inc., 1987.