2011.05.01

Bernard Gert

Hobbes: Prince of Peace

Bernard Gert, Hobbes: Prince of Peace, Polity, 2010, 183pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745648828.

Reviewed by Susanne Sreedhar, Boston University


Bernard Gert's new book, Hobbes: Prince of Peace, is a clear and highly readable contribution to the increasingly popular genre of introductions to key figures in the history of philosophy directed at audiences of students and other non-specialists. Though general overviews of major philosophers have existed for decades, recently there has been a flurry of such books, with almost every academic press issuing one -- or often two or three -- of its own.[1] Gert's book is part of Polity Press's "Classic Thinkers" series, which describes itself as "suitable for students and for the interested general reader". As Polity Press's self-description makes clear, this is meant primarily to be a kind of 'Hobbes for Beginners', so to speak, accessible to the general reader. Gert's Hobbes: Prince of Peace is of interest to the philosophical scholar not only for its usefulness as a teaching tool, but also as an instance of its kind. Reflecting on the successes and failures of Gert's particular enterprise reveals much about the scope and aims of the genre, taken as a whole, as well as the outcomes and opportunity costs of this particular trend in academic publishing.

The most distinctive feature of Gert's take on 'Hobbes for Beginners' may well be its unapologetically partisan character. Gert diverges from standard practice here in two notable ways. First, on the two topics to which he dedicates the majority of the second and third chapters -- i.e., Hobbes's account of human psychology and Hobbes's account of the laws of nature -- Gert does not merely introduce and identify his own interpretive position as one among others. Rather, he explicitly and self-consciously defends his own interpretation, framing the discussion in terms of how others have misunderstood Hobbes and positioning his own view in (successful) opposition to them. Second, Gert's own philosophical views and their relation to Hobbes's philosophy, as he understands it, assume a noticeable role in the narrative -- particularly in the Preface and the final chapter. Gert is very much a character in the text, second only to the protagonist, Hobbes. In a somewhat dramatic moment, Gert comes out as a proponent of many of the views that he ascribes to Hobbes. Since Gert is one of the most prominent, well-established, and influential Hobbes scholars to emerge from the English-speaking academic world during the second half of the twentieth century, the addition of this autobiographical element is both intriguing and appealing. I suspect it will appear so to new readers of Hobbes, as well as to those of us immersed in his work and the scholarship surrounding it.

The book consists of five substantive chapters: Chapter One, "Hobbes's Life, Times, and General Philosophical Views"; Chapter Two, "Human Nature"; Chapter Three, "Hobbes's Moral Theory"; Chapter Four, "Hobbes's Political Theory"; and Chapter Five, "After Hobbes". The structure of the book is indicative of the philosophical focus. As is inevitable with this kind of project, some topics must lose out significantly to others. For instance, Chapter One is less than thirty pages long: it begins with a five-page overview of the highlights of Hobbes's biography, writings, and the historical context in which he wrote -- including the political upheavals through which he lived; this is followed by two pages on Hobbes on religion. This leaves only about seventeen pages to cover Hobbes on science, language, epistemology and metaphysics. Those interested in Hobbes's own scientific and mathematical work, as well as his views on the philosophical fields of science, language, metaphysics, and epistemology -- not to mention his interventions in theological debates -- are likely to find that the book has frustratingly little to offer in this regard. Of course, Gert is not alone in prioritizing Hobbes's moral and political theory over his other interests, but there are costs to this focus. For example, Gert correctly notes that Hobbes intends his moral and political theory to coincide with Christianity, correctly understood, but the structure of the book makes it hard to see precisely what Hobbes took a correct interpretation of Christianity to entail.

Putting these issues of scope to the side, Gert's overview introduces readers to the important ideas in Hobbes's moral and political philosophy: he covers most of the expected points of philosophical discussion, and in many cases his explanations are lucid and insightful. Still, given the increasing preponderance of introductory texts of this kind, we might ask whether the standard has risen beyond exegetical adequacy, that is, whether new attempts must be exceptionally careful, striking, or original to earn their place in the literature. If so, then Gert's own efforts may leave something to be desired -- indeed, as is the case in his discussion of psychological egoism, they may well suffer in comparison to his own previous scholarship. In what follows, I will discuss what I take to be the most important and distinctive aspects of the book, calling attention to the more and less successful, especially from the pedagogical or general reader perspective.

Psychological egoism is without a doubt one of the dominant themes of the book. Discussions of it in one form or another take up the majority of Chapter Two, though Gert also gives relatively short explanations of Hobbes on topics such as the passions, reason, sense and imagination, appetites and aversions, self-preservation, and even mental disorders. But Gert's preoccupation with psychological egoism pervades the book -- references to it appear multiple times in every chapter and infuse Gert's explanation of most aspects of Hobbes's philosophy, even those relatively far removed from the topic.

Given that so much time is spent on the attempt to disabuse us of the notion that Hobbes believed in psychological egoism, it is first necessary to get clear on what Gert takes his target to be, that is, how he understands psychological egoism as a theory of human psychology. Gert defines psychological egoism in what he calls an "all-inclusive manner" -- as "the view that all of the actions of all people are motivated by self-interest" (p. 31). This characterization of psychological egoism is the strongest possible version, but it is also a crude or simplistic one, leaving no room for nuance or sophistication. The idea is that every single motivation of every single person can be cashed out entirely in terms of that person's self-interest -- no exceptions. This is not a generalization about most people or most motivations or even simply a general pessimism about human nature; rather it is a definitive and categorical statement about human motivation as such. The psychological egoism that Gert targets is one with this scope -- by his own definition.

There are, of course, a host of questions about how to understand Hobbes's account of human nature and his views about various aspects of human psychology, and scholars have debated whether, how, and to what extent Hobbes espouses some sort of egoism. On a relatively natural reading of the various works in Hobbes's corpus, his views on the issue seem ambiguous, ambivalent, and even inconsistent. There are passages in which Hobbes sounds very much like he is espousing the kind of crude egoism captured by Gert's definition. Consider one of his most well known claims, namely, "of the voluntary acts of every man, the object is some good to himself" (Leviathan XIV 8, quoted in Gert, p. 38), or the comparison Hobbes draws between human life and a "race [in which] we must suppose to have no other goal, nor other garland, but being foremost" (The Elements of Law IX, 21, quoted in Gert, p. 30). On the other hand, Hobbes also clearly recognizes that people sacrifice their interests and even their lives for the sake of others and, perhaps more importantly, out of a commitment to certain moral, ideological, political, and especially religious ideals. While sometimes Hobbes characterizes such self-sacrifice as irrational or foolish, it is impossible to dismiss every single piece of seemingly inconsistent text under those auspices. Thus, while it is easy to see why readers have been tempted to attribute a kind of fundamental self-interest to Hobbesian actors, it is unclear what to do with the various textual outliers that seem to allow for motivations that are genuinely other-directed and not irrational. One may wonder whether Hobbes holds a coherent view of human psychology at all.

Gert's argument against attributing psychological egoism, as he defines it, to Hobbes has a number of parts. First, he tackles the textual evidence. Gert acknowledges the egoistic-sounding claims, like the ones cited above, but he argues that taken in context, they lose their egoistic bent. More importantly, he does an impressive job of cataloging the countervailing evidence -- for example, Hobbes's claim that civil war is motivated by false moral views rather than self-interest, and the numerous references to the sacrifices people are willing to make in order to protect or preserve their loved ones (and even their own reputations or honor). But perhaps the strongest pieces of textual evidence come from the technical definitions that Hobbes gives as part of his philosophical account of the human passions. For example, consider Hobbes's definition of benevolence as "Desire of good to another" (Leviathan VI, 22, quoted in Gert, p. 37) and lack of charity as insensibility "to another's evils" (De Homine XIII, 9, quoted in Gert, p. 63).

Gert also makes the case that neither acting only for one's own self-interest nor pursuing self-preservation above all else are rationally required for Hobbes. With all of this in mind, Gert concludes that attributing psychological egoism to Hobbes is textually unsupportable. Second, Gert rehearses the helpful distinction between psychological egoism and tautological egoism -- the view that "people always act in order to satisfy their own desires" (p. 36). The latter is true by definition given how Hobbes defines voluntary action, the will, good, and so on; but like most tautologies, it does not prove to be particularly interesting or controversial. Third, Gert shows how psychological egoism does not follow from Hobbes's materialism. Finally, in an especially perspicuous passage, Gert makes the absolutely crucial point that all Hobbes needs for his argument is that "altruism is limited" (p. 64) -- one cannot found a political theory on the assumption of natural human benevolence.

The arguments in Chapter Two (which I've just summarized) are clear, concise, and convincing. Much of this discussion appears in a more robust and nuanced form in Gert's earlier work on the topic.[2] For the reader who wants more detail and more systematic argumentation, I would suggest looking there as well. There are worries that one could raise in response to these arguments -- in particular to the way in which Gert privileges some texts over others. Sharon Lloyd makes this criticism.[3] But Gert invokes a methodological principle to safeguard his views; he says, "It is, of course, not a conclusive argument against an interpretation that it results in inconsistencies and contradictions, but when a plausible interpretation avoids such harsh results, it is certainly to be preferred" (p. 45). This is not uncontroversial, but I will not pursue it here.

The reader may be curious about why Gert spends so much time rehearsing these arguments. He admits in the opening paragraph of the chapter that psychological egoism was once a dominant (or popular) way of reading Hobbes, but it has not been such for at least fifty years. Gert himself can be credited in large part with effecting this much-needed change (see the works cited in footnote 2). While Gert says that no Hobbes scholar continues to endorse this interpretation at the outset, in other places he is less clear on that point; for example, he later accuses recent commentators of "accepting the mistaken egoistic interpretation of Hobbes's account of human nature" (p. 71; see also p. 63). But diagnoses of the state of the literature aside, Gert's official explanation for spending so much time on the topic is one that appeals to the beliefs of undergraduates; he says "because psychological egoism is such a popular view among beginning students of philosophy, it is worthwhile to explain the confusions that lead them to accept this view and to mistakenly attribute it to Hobbes" (p. 32).

In my view, the reason that psychological egoism has proven so intractable as an interpretation of Hobbes, despite its implausibility as a philosophical view and in spite of the indefensibility of attributing it to Hobbes, is more complicated and more important than Gert suggests. From my perspective, the persistence of this error has as much to do with teachers as with students. Hobbes continues to be a main figure in introductory or survey courses in ethics, political philosophy, and early modern philosophy, and in my experience, he is commonly portrayed as nothing more than a kind of crude egoist. Teachers perpetuate this view, for instance, to avoid complicating what is already very hard material or to set philosophers up as foils for -- or in opposition to -- each other. When Hobbes is invoked in scholarly writing devoted to some other issue (i.e., not focused on careful Hobbes scholarship), similar caricatures appear. But this fate is not unique to Hobbes's views. In fact, it plagues cursory discussions of all great thinkers, from Plato to Rawls. But regardless of our differing explanations for the persistence of this (mis)interpretation of Hobbes, Gert does a good job here (and elsewhere in his work) of dismantling it. As such, it is a necessary and welcome corrective for those who still hang on to that reading of Hobbesian psychology.

Gert's second major interpretive intervention concerns the proper reading of Hobbes's account of natural law and related questions about what kind of moral theory (if any) Hobbes espouses. Unlike Hobbes's stance on egoism, his moral theory remains a live topic of discussion among Hobbes scholars. There are numerous and heated debates over how to understand Hobbes's moral theory, his account of natural law in general, and the specific laws of nature he enumerates. Gert offers a nonstandard and indeed a quite unusual description of the various Hobbesian laws of nature.

In Chapter Three, where he takes this topic up, Gert seems to have three main goals: first, to discredit other interpretations of Hobbes on natural law; second, to defend the claim that Hobbes has a substantive moral theory grounded on considerations of virtue; and third, to classify the various laws of nature that he finds in Hobbes's philosophy. Gert is upfront that what he provides is not Hobbes's classification; in fact, at points it strays fairly far from Hobbes's actual text. I worry that this discussion will not be helpful to those who have not already read a great deal of Hobbes and the secondary literature on the topic. Since Gert's view departs -- at some points drastically -- from the way in which Hobbes himself classifies things, I suspect that his account is as likely to confuse as to illuminate the novice trying to work his or her way through the ideas and texts for the first time. On the other hand, Gert's analysis is original and provocative from a scholarly perspective, and I would welcome a systematic explanation and defense of his novel classificatory scheme and the interpretive framework into which it fits. Unfortunately, as it is presented in this book, the view is not sufficiently developed for me to evaluate it properly or productively.

Finally, I want to call attention to a particular trend in Gert's writing, one that constitutes a potential strength but also a potential weakness when thinking about how best to introduce Hobbes's thought to beginning readers. Gert has a pronounced tendency to make sweeping generalizations about the secondary literature without giving any examples of the specific people who espouse the views to which he refers. He repeatedly uses phrases such as "other commentators", "many readers", "the standard interpretation", and "the received view" without citations to indicate which authors or bodies of scholarship he has in mind. These generalizations are ubiquitous throughout the book. In some cases, it is relatively innocuous, as when Gert remarks that "many contemporary philosophers put forward views very similar to Hobbes's, though often in a slightly more sophisticated form" (p. 54); in this case, the reader may wonder whom Gert has in mind, but at the end of the day it does not really matter. But in other cases -- indeed in the vast majority of cases where Gert offers these unspecified generalizations -- he is articulating a dispute with particular Hobbes scholars and with positions that have actually been espoused by numerous commentators.

In writing a book that is "suitable for students and for the interested general reader" (to quote again from Polity's self-description of the series), it is understandable why Gert would be tempted to use such generalizations about the secondary literature. He might not want to interrupt the flow of the prose or to complicate the narrative with side discussions of the vast, complicated, and nuanced commentary on Hobbes and the complexities involved in negotiating the debates between various scholars, especially where these views have changed over time. But this gain in the simplicity of reading also constitutes a loss in various ways. For example, the reader is left without any resources to locate the commentators that Gert has in mind. Those familiar with the literature will almost always know about whom Gert is talking, but this book is not meant for the specialist. The reader who wants more information about competing interpretations will not be able to find such information in Gert's book.

Gert does include a bibliography with suggestions for further reading. However, I found it curious that the bibliography only contains collections and books, when so much of the important work on Hobbes has appeared in journal articles. More importantly, since the bibliography is simply an alphabetical list of titles, the reader will not be able to match up particular secondary sources to the "some commentators" or "many readers" Gert mentions throughout the book. An annotated or topical bibliography and specific representative examples at crucial junctures in the book itself would have been helpful in this regard.

Beyond the unspecified nature of Gert's characterization of the secondary literature, I am more concerned with the nature of his characterizations, which are overwhelmingly terse and critical. This is especially pronounced in the chapter on Hobbes's moral theory. In his portrayal of the scholarly landscape, he gives short, undifferentiated, and relatively uncharitable descriptions of the major positions in the literature. He then presents what he clearly takes as definitive refutations of those interpretations in ways that are often surprisingly brief and underdeveloped. Again, it is understandable that this would happen in light of the desire to avoid interrupting the exegesis by offering references or by introducing complexities that might confuse the beginning reader. Moreover, phrases like "the standard interpretation" are common tropes in historical scholarship; I have used them a number of times myself. But one always needs to give at least a couple of representative examples to make it clear that the view really is "the standard interpretation". And, if one's discussions are framed in terms of what other commentators have said and how they were wrong, it seems even more incumbent on the author to provide the necessary documentation. Those familiar with the body of secondary literature on Hobbes's laws of nature will, no doubt, be able to identify with ease the targets of Gert's attack. But the beginning reader will not have this advantage, and again, specific references and/or an annotated bibliography would have gone a long way toward addressing this concern.

While there is no substitute for engagement with the actual primary text, it is important to develop new materials to introduce students to the richness and depth of the work of great philosophers such as Hobbes. In this regard, Gert's Hobbes: Prince of Peace is surely a significant contribution.


[1] A quick search revealed a surprisingly large number of such books including, but not limited to: Tom Sorell's Hobbes (Routledge, 1986); Al Martinich's Hobbes (Routledge, 2005), A Hobbes Dictionary (Blackwell, 1995), and Thomas Hobbes (St. Martin's Press, 1997); Richard Tuck's Hobbes (Oxford, 1989) and an updated Hobbes: a Very Short Introduction (Oxford, 2002); Glen Newey's Guidebook to Hobbes and Leviathan (Routledge, 2008); Laurie M. Johnson Bagby's Hobbes's Leviathan: A Reader's Guide (Continuum, 2007); and Stephen J. Finn's Hobbes: A Guide for the Perplexed (Continuum, 2007). I would recommend the works by Martinich and Tuck as the best of this kind of genre. Additionally, there are volumes such as The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes (1996) and now also The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes's Leviathan (2007), which are aimed at scholars or advanced graduate students.

[2] For example, see his groundbreaking article, "Hobbes and Psychological Egoism," Journal of the History of Ideas 28 (1967): 503-520, and his introduction to his edition of Man and Citizen (1991). Similar themes are explored in his 1996 piece "Hobbes's Psychology" in Tom Sorell, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes, 157-174. In fact, sections of Gert's recent book borrow liberally (sometimes verbatim) from sections in these earlier works.

[3] Sharon Lloyd. Morality in the Philosophy of Thomas Hobbes: Cases in the Law of Nature (Cambridge 2009), p. 8.