2011.05.07

Rebecca Comay

Mourning Sickness: Hegel and the French Revolution

Rebecca Comay, Mourning Sickness: Hegel and the French Revolution, Stanford University Press, 2010, 202pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804761277.

Reviewed by Andrew Cutrofello, Loyola University Chicago


Rebecca Comay's insightful study of Hegel's philosophical reflections on the French Revolution clarifies Hegel's conception of the temporality of absolute knowing. On her account, absolute knowing is neither an atemporal intellectual intuition of the absolute nor the immediate self-presence of a persisting subject. It is, instead, a conceptual elaboration of the ubiquity of delay. This is not to say that thought is discursive in the Kantian sense of requiring the performance of temporal syntheses. The delay of the concept registered in absolute knowing is not due to the fact that concepts are second-order representations that succeed or postpone intuitions of objects. Absolute knowing represents thought as essentially belated (subsequent to events never apprehended and so unavailable for synthesis) and premature (prior to events whose essential, and therefore irreducible, futurity again makes them unavailable for synthesis). Acknowledging itself to be a Johnny-come-lately-and-early, spirit abandons previous conceptions of itself as a gathering subject of retentions and protentions (Self-certainty), or the gathered Da of a three-fold temporal ekstasis (Sittlichkeit). Terror, not anxiety, has taught it that time is out of joint. The moral impossibility of setting right a time disjoined by terror is brutally summarized by Lady Macbeth: "What's done cannot be undone." Despite the definitiveness of this hard, if banal, lesson, Hegel allows the confession of un-undoable evil to be answered -- not without a crucial delay (123) -- by an act of forgiveness that purports to undo past crime (146): "The wounds of the Spirit heal, and leave no scars behind" (129). This response marks, for Comay, the advent (in every sense of the term) of absolute knowing. Whether Hegel succeeds in reconciling Lady Macbeth's thesis with his own antithesis -- a veritable antinomy in Comay's juxtaposition of the two -- is the difficult question posed by Mourning Sickness.

As the title of her book indicates, Comay represents Hegel's philosophical response to the French Revolution in the vocabulary of psychoanalysis: trauma, repetition compulsion, mourning, melancholia, introjection, incorporation, etc. This approach is justified by the fact that the Phenomenology of Spirit prefigures (both conceptually and lexically) psychoanalytic descriptions of the experience of loss (96). Comay does not seek to psychologize Hegel's dialectical analyses of shapes of consciousness, but rather to bring out their "normative" significance (6). As she says of her guiding concept: "by 'trauma,' I don't mean anything psychological… . My interest is philosophical: to explore trauma as a modal, temporal, and above all a historical category" (4). This raises the stakes, inviting us to wonder not only about the philosophical significance of psychoanalytic concepts, but about what it might mean to absolve them of psychological significance.

As an historical category, trauma is a kind of cultural malaise -- one translation of Das Unbehagen in der Kultur[1] -- or, as Comay prefers, une Misère, a term she borrows from Marx's reference to "die deutsche Misère" (2). In his "Introduction to the Contribution to the Critique of Hegel's Philosophy of Right," Marx lampoons "German history" for commemorating revolution only "on the day of its burial" (3). Comay discerns in the "German ideology" (17) the structure of melancholia, understood as mourning for a lost object never possessed. The French Revolution played the role of such an object for German intellectuals who constructed a national self-identity around its available unavailability. Comay represents the logic of this experience of "vicarious" self-constitution as one of obsessive translation. Exposing its narcissistic character is, on her reading, one of the chief burdens of Hegel's account of Kantian and post-Kantian moral philosophy.

Before turning to Hegel, Comay identifies several of the ideology's component beliefs. One was that, since the Germans went through the Reformation, they didn't need a political revolution (18). Another was the converse notion that, since the Germans had the Reformation (and Kantian critique), they were the only ones who could properly complete it (19-20). In holding these two contrary thoughts together, German writers represented "their" Revolution as something simultaneously past and future. A third idea, advanced by Kant, was that the true revolution was moral, taking place in the supersensible (and therefore supra-temporal) hearts of men (48). If this revolution could be detected at all, it was in the paradoxical affect of disinterested sympathy that witnesses felt for the cause of the political revolutionaries (34). Together, these three mutually incompatible (yet somehow mutually supporting) beliefs exhibit Freud's "kettle logic," or what Hegel, borrowing a metaphor from Kant, calls a "whole nest" of contradictions (102).

Comay finds Hegel getting caught in the nest himself despite his best efforts to disentangle it: "He shows how a fantasy can be simultaneously enjoyed and deconstructed" (6). For much of the Phenomenology's chapter on spirit, such ambivalence is shunted along a series of representations of the logic of ("French") revolutionary terror and ("German") morality. It catches up with spirit -- and Hegel -- the moment that belated forgiveness purports to wipe the "slate" of history clean, as if the pure negativity of absolute Terror could thereby accomplish what it had been after all along, namely, to start everything all over again from scratch (a fantasy of self-birthing that would effectively translate mourning sickness into morning sickness[2]) (125, cf. 118). With and independently of Hegel, Comay shows how ruthlessly the Terror in France destroyed monuments that the Revolution had built, only to find it necessary to efface all traces of the destruction itself (61-3). This self-defeating mania for destruction was no less pitiless for being self-contradictory; on the contrary, the Terror exhibited a kind of pitiless pity (52). If the aim of pitiless cruelty -- torture -- is to inflict unforgettable scars,[3] the aim of terror, as Hegel and Comay understand it, is pure "obliteration" (72). Comay underscores this difference by highlighting the professed "humanitarian" motives for the introduction of the guillotine, which supposedly killed instantaneously and painlessly (176 n.1). The flip side of the logic of the guillotine can be found in Sade, for whom the seemingly immortal body of Justine (brilliantly linked by Comay to the troubling corpse of Polyneices [117]) is an ever-renewed surface for the inscription of new torments -- the converse fate of the corpses of those victims of the Terror who committed suicide only to have their heads cut off anyway (73).

Part of the worry about Hegel's representation of forgiveness as absolute forgetting is that forgiveness, so understood, is formally indistinguishable from terror qua pure negativity or death drive (73). Comay thinks Hegel deserves credit for not disavowing this connection, as Kant disavows the formal identity between principled moral action and diabolical evil (43). For Kant, political revolution is the diabolical crime par excellence. As such, it is not only impermissible -- morally impossible -- but unthinkable: logically impossible. A legally sanctioned execution of a monarch would be, at best (or worst), a performative contradiction (27). Were such a crime possible, it would be an unforgivable -- and therefore unforgettable -- blot on human history. Kant discerns an equally "unforgettable" sign of moral progress in the sympathetic responses of contemporaries to the Revolution (28). One way to square Kant's sympathy and horror is to emphasize the difference between the Revolution and the regicide. Instead of dividing the object this way, Comay's strategy is to represent the two affects as inseparable components of a single (if complex) sublime feeling of "horrified fascination" at a tragic spectacle (28).

Stanley Cavell has asked why spectators watching a performance of Othello don't rush on stage to try to prevent Othello from strangling Desdemona.[4] One obvious, if ultimately unsatisfying, response is to say, well, we're in a theater, and this is a play. Comay argues that Kant's theory of the dynamical sublime points toward a more satisfying response, namely, that vicarious trauma is the vehicle of self-constitution: "Kant's analytic of the dynamic sublime is perhaps the first fully modern theory of the tragic, in that it links the experience of catharsis to the heroic self-production of the subject by way of the fantasy of its own annihilation" (50). We purport to keep our hands clean by drawing clean distinctions, first and foremost that between actor and spectator. By tearing down Kant's "fourth wall," Hegel exposes the narcissistic investments of the spectator, but the "dramaturgical distinction between actor and spectator" persists up to the confrontation between forgiving and forgiven consciousnesses (151). Hegel's "hard heart" initially refuses to forgive evil, attempting to erect and maintain an unbreachable wall separating his/her quasi-psychotic beautiful soul from worldly evil (i.e., from the evil of belonging to the world). What eventually enables the hard heart to offer forgiveness is its discovery that it is like Sartre's peeping Tom suddenly caught unaware by another witness. Such an experience is staged in Duchamp's Étant donnés, a work that forces us to acknowledge the essential complicity of the gaze -- a gaze whose object could very well be Sade's "undead" Justine. For Comay, the crucial fact in Hegel's analysis is not the hard heart's discovery of the culpability of its initial withholding of forgiveness, but, rather, the logically subsequent realization that the pretense of being entitled to offer forgiveness is itself culpable and so in need of forgiveness (126).

Comay's account of Hegel's Aufhebung of the actor/spectator distinction presents a much more complicated picture than Arendt suggests when she accuses Hegel (and Marx) of privileging the spectatorial stance of the historian over that of the engaged political actor.[5] Comay reminds us that, for Arendt, crimes falling outside the purview of law are strictly unforgivable: "one cannot forgive what one cannot punish" (135). For Arendt, what is unforgivable is unforgivable simpliciter: full stop. For Comay's Hegel, as for Derrida, what is unforgivable is also unforgivable simpliciter, but (by a strange logic) it is therefore the only thing that can be forgiven (126). For Arendt, as we might put it, the unforgivable is unforgivable! (exclamation point), whereas for Hegel and Derrida, it is simply unforgivable period -- a period marking the full pause of a necessary delay only after which forgiveness may be granted. Comay emphasizes the immeasurability (and possible interminability) of such a pause, for otherwise the confession of evil would be reduced to the mere purchase of forgiveness (122). If everything is forgiven, nothing is forbidden, a thought that caused Kant great consternation.

Comay's Hegel seems to accept the antecedent, but only by way of a quasi-Derridean experience of the "impossible." The Christian provenance of Hegel's treatment of this experience is encapsulated for Comay in the Gospel of Matthew: "Judge not, lest ye be judged" (134). This is also the central theme of Shakespeare's Measure for Measure, so it presents a nice test case. At the end of Shakespeare's play, Isabella, unaware that her brother still lives, kneels to the Duke to plead for the life of his supposed murderer Angelo. By the logic of Hegel's account, it would have been a worse crime for Isabella not to have forgiven him than it was for Angelo to order Claudio's execution. By passing the Duke's test (however impossible such a test may be), Isabella allows the lingering potential for tragedy to resolve itself into Christian comedy.[6] However, the fact that forgiveness remains essentially spectatorial and belated suggests that Isabella herself stands in need of forgiveness more than Angelo, as Portia would more than Shylock. Here we can begin to see how Comay's reading of Hegel complicates our understanding of his understanding of the religious meaning of forgiveness. Hegel's Aufhebung looks more and more like a deconstruction that demonstrates the impossibility of escaping from terror unscarred or "unscathed" (another Derridean term).

If melancholia runs the risk of perpetually killing the other for the sake of maintaining a relationship with it, mania runs the converse risk of terror itself. Comay associates these twin dangers with Adorno and Lukács, who accused each other of succumbing, respectively, to aestheticizing melancholia and Thermidorian mania (150). From a psychoanalytic point of view, the tendency to cycle back and forth between the two represents a failure to complete a "normal" work of mourning. Whether "normal" is taken in a normative or a descriptive sense, problems arise here too if mourning is understood as remembrance with a term limit: remembering for the sake of forgetting (like confessing for the sake of being forgiven). For mourning to be meaningful, it must run the risk of being interminable -- and so formally indistinguishable from melancholia. Such is the nature of the Misère, or what Comay calls "mourning sickness" (103, 139). Comay suggests that Hegel understood its logic better than Marx because Hegel recognized it to be a universal feature of historical experience, something that couldn't be magically, manically overcome through the performance of actual and actualizing revolutionary deeds. This theme, also developed by Derrida, does not entail a valorization of the standpoint of the spectator over that of the actor, let alone a denigration of revolutionary deeds. It only serves to remind us that we cannot not be "latecomers and precursors," even with respect "to our own experiences" (4-5).

Comay takes issue with Derrida's characterization of the Phenomenology's "rush toward the economy of a reconciliation" (cited on 128). For Derrida, this rush is symptomatic of a desire to be done with delay (a spatial as well as a temporal category), but Comay convincingly shows that it is better understood as a certain kind of "gamble" (149) that is "precipitated" by the delay that precedes it (128). The logic of this delay would be equivalent to that analyzed in Lacan's essay on "Logical Time," in which hesitation precipitates hastening, except for one crucial difference, namely, that Lacan is describing a game-theoretic situation governed by nothing but calculating reason.[7] The gamble run by Lacan's prisoner (deducing the color on his back from the behavioral responses of his fellow prisoners) is "restricted" rather than "general," whereas that run by Hegel's guilty criminals is -- or rather purports to be (I will return to this Kantian phrasing) -- absolute. Hegel's account of forgiveness is not unambiguous, but Comay suggests that the ambiguity in question is a function of the "shape of consciousness" in question. Just as it is impossible to distinguish a genuine knight of faith from a "bourgeois in his Sunday best," so it is impossible to tell whether a "rush toward reconciliation" is that of a calculating prisoner or a knight of forgiveness. It is equally uncertain whether an act of forgiveness is "diabolical" or benevolent, absolute or relative, a forgetting without remainder or the mere repression of what is destined to return as ressentiment.

Comay discerns an acknowledgment of such undecidability in Hegel's use of the participial versöhnende in the phrase "das versöhnende Ja" -- the "reconciling yes" -- at the end of the Phenomenology's chapter on spirit. Hegel's wording suggests that reconciliation through mutual forgiveness is something that merely "ought" to occur. Reconciliation would thereby remain or become a regulative ideal, undercutting Hegel's disparagement of regulative ideals as essentially unattainable pretexts supporting Kant's moral view of the world (136). Comay finds a second Kantian slippage in the last paragraph of the Phenomenology, where Hegel unexpectedly inserts a counterfactual "as if": "Spirit has to start afresh … as if, for it, all that preceded it were lost" (cited on 147; Comay's italics). Comay is sympathetic with Hegel's official critique of Kantian morality, particularly his proto-psychoanalytic (and proto-Nietzschean) detection of Kantian morality's internalization of terror ("The categorical imperative smells of cruelty"). Yet she is equally sympathetic with Hegel's Kantian slippages. To understand why, let us turn to the antinomy between "What's done cannot be undone" and "The wounds of the Spirit heal, and leave no scars behind."

In "The Spirit of Christianity and Its Fate," Hegel associates "the fate of the Jewish people," "the fate of Macbeth," and "Kant's ethics."[8] Each represents an experience of evil that forecloses the possibility of reconciliation through forgiveness. Macbeth "destroyed … the friendliness of life" by killing Duncan and Banquo, and since life itself could not be destroyed, Banquo came back to haunt him as "an evil spirit."[9] Macbeth's crime could only be expiated by the punishment of fate, just as the Jewish people, having similarly "stepped out of nature," could know no reconciliation with the divine.[10] Finally, Kant's subordination of Christian love to moral law represents, for Hegel, a lapse back into the abstract Jewish world-view. From this perspective, "What's done cannot be undone" represents a kind of Kantian-Judaic fatalism whose suppressed counterfactual ought -- "If only" -- expresses despair at the impossibility of reconciliation through forgiveness.

Comay suggests that by the time Hegel wrote the Phenomenology of Spirit, he had left "this overtly anti-Semitic approach" behind, yet without "soften[ing] his earlier position on Kant" (95). She does not refer to Hegel's discussion of Macbeth, but she does liken Lady Macbeth to the beautiful soul, who "cannot stop washing and wiping as it fades into a somnambulist swoon of 'yearning consumption'" (119). Together, Macbeth and Lady Macbeth commit an unforgivable crime that allows neither of them to be "restored to life."[11] "What's done cannot be undone" -- uttered twice in the play -- may be characterized as Lady Macbeth's despairing confession to her partner in crime: first in his presence and then when she is sleepwalking, removed from the world (despite the presence of spectators) in the solipsistic nightmare from which she manages to escape (if at all) only by committing suicide. "The wounds of the Spirit heal, and leave no scars behind" is precisely what neither Macbeth nor Lady Macbeth can say to each other. Hegel does say it, and the fact that he does represents, for Comay, the most dangerous moment of the Phenomenology -- but also the most audacious, and precisely because of the Kantian slippages.

If Comay can endorse both Hegel's critique of Kant and his Kantian slippages (as she can Lady Macbeth's thesis and Hegel's antithesis), it is by reading Hegelian forgiveness and reconciliation in terms borrowed from Benjamin. If the wounds of the Spirit heal and leave no scars behind, it is through a messianic intervention into the past, one that purports to fulfill the law through love for the sake of "those without hope." The key to this reading is Comay's temporal -- and modal -- construal of the "ought" and "as if." Every "ought" and "as if" is a counterfactual of a special sort, whether it concerns the past, the present, or the future. Kant's counterfactuals direct us toward the future: the question posed by past and present evil is whether the human race is constantly progressing "toward the better."[12] Benjamin's counterfactuals direct us toward the past: toward "a missed encounter, a lapsed experience, or even, in the end, another's experience" (153). Here we can begin to appreciate the modal significance of Comay's conception of trauma and of her implicit suggestion that not only time, but modality, is out of joint, since, through forgiveness, the actual reverts to the merely possible. Extending to Hegel the benefit of this doubt, Comay concludes that Hegelian forgiveness -- qua undoing -- is "rapidly approaching [i.e., 'rushing toward'] Benjamin's idea of a 'Messianic cessation of happening,' the revolutionary caesura in which the locomotive course of history is arrested" (146). It is this "possible" reading that saves Hegel from himself -- and us from ourselves, were we to play the hard heart toward his own (witting or unwitting) confessions of evil.


[1] As noted by James Strachey in his introduction to Sigmund Freud, Civilization and Its Discontents, trans. and ed. James Strachey, W.W. Norton, 1989, p. 4.

[2] My thanks to Virginia C. Barry for calling my attention to this point.

[3] Elaine Scarry, The Body in Pain: The Making and Unmaking of the World, Oxford University Press, 1987.

[4] Stanley Cavell, Disowning Knowledge in Seven Plays of Shakespeare, updated edition, Cambridge University Press, 2003, pp. 98ff. Cf. A.D. Nuttall, Why Does Tragedy Give Pleasure?, Oxford University Press, 1996.

[5] Hannah Arendt, On Revolution, Penguin, 1988, pp. 52-4.

[6] For a discussion of Hegelian forgiveness in relation to the comedy of Shakespeare's Romances, see Jennifer Bates, Hegel and Shakespeare on Moral Imagination, State University of New York Press, 2010.

[7] Jacques Lacan, "Logical Time and the Assertion of Anticipated Certainty," in Écrits: The First Complete Edition in English, trans. Bruce Fink in collaboration with Héloïse Fink and Russell Grigg, W.W. Norton & Company, 2006, pp. 161-75.

[8] G.W.F. Hegel, "The Spirit of Christianity and Its Fate," in Hegel, Early Theological Writings, trans. T.M. Knox, University of Pennsylvania Press, 1971, p. 205.

[9] Ibid., p. 229.

[10] Ibid., p. 205.

[11] This Dickensian phrase is meant to invoke the world of A Tale of Two Cities -- another exploration of national self-constitution through the spectacle of the French Revolution, one in which the borderline separating actors from spectators is crossed.

[12] Immanuel Kant, The Conflict of the Faculties, trans. Mary Gregor, University of Nebraska Press, 1992, p. 141.