2011.05.18

Nicholas Rescher

Philosophical Inquiries: An Introduction to Problems of Philosophy

Nicholas Rescher, Philosophical Inquiries: An Introduction to Problems of Philosophy, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2010, 219pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822960751.

Reviewed by Dennis M. Senchuk, Indiana University


Perhaps the most prolific serious American philosopher writing today, Nicholas Rescher has favored his readers with a survey of sorts of some interrelated areas he adjudges to be of basic philosophical concern. Alerting his reader that this book is not a student's introduction as such, Rescher proceeds to offer a survey of problems that is at once something of a distillate of his thoughts about the nature of philosophical inquiry and of his particular take on that array of problems. While it might not be readily accessible to the average beginning college student, the book would seem pitch perfect for the proverbial 'educated layperson' earnestly curious about what philosophy does and how one sober-minded academic philosopher deals with "fundamental" issues, many of which will have occurred to thoughtful non-academics. Professionals will find much of interest, too; and they won't have much occasion to complain that the discussions have been dumbed down for popular consumption. Still, philosophers in the groves of academe will find ample material for carping, and this reviewer is no exception.

Rescher begins with a discussion of the nature of philosophy. Given the etymological link of "inquiring" to "asking," his suggestion that philosophical inquiry is a matter of questioning is no cause for concern. But when he goes on to suggest that the task of this inquiry is to answer questions about "the world's scheme of things and our place within it" (p. 1), some practitioners may fear that their specialties -- e.g., aesthetics -- may be left out. Of course if there is some one scheme of everything, the fear may prove unwarranted. Is there?

We're told that, aside from its proprietary problems, philosophy has "no distinctive subject matter … and furnishes no novel facts but only offers insights into relationships"; it "strives after that systematic integration of knowledge that the sciences initially promised but never managed to deliver" (p. 2). The sciences, he suggests, got sidetracked and lost sight of this grand ambition; but philosophy's "defining mission is that of coordinating the otherwise available information in the light of big questions regarding man, the world, and his place within its scheme of things." (p. 3) In a word, the mission is some sort of synthesis. One might worry that this is an overly presumptuous characterization, assuming synthesizability and being a bit too credulous about the information at hand. Rescher does avow the fallibility of the sciences, but he apparently, I speculate, credits them with self-corrective methods of their own. His emphasis on synthesis would seem to give short shrift to doubt-raising, to that time-honored calling into question of received information. Rescher's account of philosophy wants attention to its idiosyncratic methodology of skepticism. This reader's impression is that Rescher wants answers, not questions per se; and he may well implicitly mean to be resisting philosophy's bad reputation for failing to give answers. Skeptics are accused of wanting to cease doing philosophy. (p. 7)

The only methodology Rescher credits (non-exclusively) to philosophy is one of reasoning, of striving for "overall rational coherence". This, I would suggest, may be easier to achieve than is commonly supposed: stick to making simple declarative statements of the logically atomic variety, ones with no implicit truth-functional structure, and connect them all and only with the truth-functional conjunction. Having done so, you will have no fear of the only sort of rational incoherence Rescher makes mention of in his book -- viz., logical inconsistency. You will, almost of necessity, be wrong; but that's none of your affair if you're a Rescherian philosopher -- scientists will be called upon to make all needed corrections.

Rescher says that philosophy's aim is both "to provide rational coherence to our thoughts and rational direction to our actions" (p. 3), but his emphasis is on the former "cognitive enterprise, a venture in question-resolution subject to the usual standards of rationality." (p. 4) Like many philosophers before him, Rescher tends to transmute, non-logically, the actively, rationally pursued love of wisdom, philosophy, into a love of reason itself. (Wo)man is, as per Aristotle, essentially a rational animal -- one fashioned by evolution to have a "need for information, for knowledge to nourish the mind" (p. 5). Darwinians might opine that evolution yielded reason as a means to address needs, not to create them; but who's to say that the cognitive need couldn't be a by-product, too? Rescher implies that, given our 'need to know', "suspensions of judgment … exact a substantial price from us." (p. 5) Attic skeptics found them calming, instead -- more a benefit than a cost. At a minimum, this disagreement suggests a lack of species-specificity regarding human reactions to cognitive dissatisfaction.

"Philosophy may well be … an acquired taste" (p. 1) and "a situational imperative for a rational creature" (p. 8) -- some tension here but no inconsistency. The best one may hope for, given what Rescher regards as our inevitably imperfect grip on reality, are rationally optimal "answers to our information-in-hand-transcending questions about how matters stand in the world." (p. 12) Experience based theorizing, we're advised, "is the most promising available instrument for question resolution in the face of imperfect information." (p. 12) Systematization is the key method for philosophizing: the appropriate theorizing is "rational conjecture as based on and emerging from systematic considerations" (p. 14). This sounds innocuous enough, though the term "systematization" does hint at some unwarranted presupposition to the effect that the systemically arrived at product should have things hanging together into some sort of unified philosophical system. More than a hint is available in this express advice: "If you cannot fit your philosophical contentions into a smooth systematic unison with what you otherwise know then there is something seriously amiss with them." (p. 18)

The only substantive criterion Rescher actually mentions for rational coherence is logical consistency. Minimal though it may be, the criterion carries with it some philosophical baggage; for only in the context of some sort of (tacit or explicit) logical framework replete with a basic or definable notion of negation will the notions of logical consistency and inconsistency gain a foothold. One would think, then, that Rescher ought to include some logical theory among the philosophical fundamentals he surveys in this book. He does not. Let's look briefly at what he does pass in review.

Rescher takes the unnamed "skeptic" to task for "bolster[ing] cognitive nihilism by inserting into the evidential gap the sharp wedge of a knowledge defeating possibility" (p. 21). The skeptic is a radical one of the Cartesian variety; the possibilities are of the "certainty-defeating" sort -- e.g., Descartes' evil demon hypothesis. There's always a gap, Rescher contends, between the content of our knowledge claims and the available evidence; but the skeptic tries to widen it. The "always" claim sounds like Quine's under-determination dogma, and some less radical skeptics might well ask how such a thing could possibly be known to be the case. Following epistemological tradition, Rescher seems too credulous of the notion that the classical analysis of knowledge as justified true belief implies that one's knowledge claims be certain, else unwarranted. (Fallacy alert: that your claim to know X requires that X be true scarcely implies X must certainly be true. All that's implied is something to this harmless effect: if you know X, then X will be true.) As is usual in such discussions, Rescher chips away at the radical skeptic's hyperbolic demands for certainty of rational warrant. While he breaks no new ground in this area, he does add some Jamesian-style remarks about the need to take cognitive risks if one is to have any hope of securing information about the world and of addressing our cognitive "needs" as rational animals.

In his discussion of "Limits of Science", Rescher examines what he takes to be some impossible ideals requisite for a perfected condition of science. One such ideal is that of "erotetic completeness": being capable of answering all legitimately raisable descriptive and explanatory questions. This ideal is said to be an "unattainable mirage" and, yet(!), a theoretical possibility. Its unattainability and/or infeasibility is said to be grounded on "Kant's principle of question-propagation." Though details aren't forth-coming as to the content of or warrant for the principle, we're assured it "means that inquiry … can never get to the bottom of things." I question that: perhaps we could get to the bottom of things without realizing we had done so. After surveying several other "Conditions of Perfected Science", Rescher would seem, in conclusion, to agree: "what is unrealizable is not the perfection as such but the epistemic condition of recognizing its attainment." (p. 49) He ends by reassuring us that there's practical utility in aiming at such perfection: doing so facilitates "the ongoing evolution of inquiry." (p. 50)

In his treatment of the abstruse metaphysical debate between Idealism and Realism, Rescher comes down in favor of a "conceptual idealism" according to which "some commerce with mental characteristics and operations always occurs in any viable [philosophical] explanatory exposition of 'the real world.'" (p. 53) This doctrine, previously urged in his Conceptual Idealism (1973), is said to be compatible with a wide array of explanatory causal theories, since it is not itself any such competing theory. Rather, it is "an analytical theory regarding the nature of the conceptual mechanisms of the categories of understanding." (p. 60) As such, I presume, it might well be a version of or a competitor of Kant's brand of idealism.

Turning to a more newsworthy topic, Rescher offers a limited defense of the notion that the world we inhabit exhibits some meaningful measure of "intelligent design". While stopping short of drawing any firm theological conclusions, he defends the notion that the universe is "noophelic" ("intelligence friendly") to the extent of "calling for the prospering of intelligence in the world's scheme of things." (p. 63) An intelligible world (with fairly simple laws, for example) is needed if evolutionary processes are to yield intelligent creatures. It would have been fun to have some consideration in this chapter of what a non-noonphelic, non-"ratiophilic" order of creation would be like, but presumably it would be hopelessly complicated, highly random, and chaotic. Rescher alleges that there is some "efficiency tropism inherent in the modus operandi of evolutionary development" (p. 73) and that this makes it likely that evolution is itself intelligently designed; I'm far more inclined to see that process as highly random and to see us as damn lucky to have evolved.

In discussing freedom of the will, Rescher takes the tack of considering nine fallacies he alleges to be committed when this topic is addressed. The lesson, he writes, is that the fallacies result from misconceptions surmountable "by drawing appropriate distinctions whose heed makes for a more viable construal of how freedom of the will -- if such there be -- should be taken to work." (p. 87) His construal supplants acts of will, if such there be, with a process of intelligent deliberation culminating in quite revisable choices and decisions. Emphasizing the determinism-compatible antecedents of final resolution, he is mute about its actional aftermath -- apparently assuming that free-will is, if anything, a feature of a decision making process exclusively. This strikes me as an excessively intellectualistic construal.

His chapter on "Mind and Matter" purports to have it that their interaction works more by coordination than causality. The two are construed as metaphysically correlated but categorically distinct. Which may be said to cause the other is variable, depending upon the direction of their dependency -- a direction ascertained on the basis of the temporal order of mental and physical responses.

The chapter on "Pragmatism and Practical Rationality" may be said to convey a non-classical account of pragmatism that aligns this meaning-criterion philosophy more closely with the non-philosophical notion that what's best is what works well. Peirce would not be pleased at this. Rescher also relies on a full-blown distinction between means and ends. Dewey would not be pleased at that.

The chapter on "The Demands of Morality" is a meta-ethical discussion that ties objective moral evaluation to "considerations of purposive efficacy." (p. 113) Morality itself is described as a uniform project functioning to get people's behavior "in line with a care for one another's interests." (p. 115) One's prominent "real" interest is to be a moral person, where being so involves a complex relationship between one's rationality and due concern for the interest of others. An immoral person is said to fail to realize one's human potential -- 'rational animal' that one is. Some anti-relativistic themes initiated in this chapter are further developed in the next, "By Whose Standards?" Somewhere between moral absolutism and moral indifferentism, Rescher settles on an objectivism which would have us tread carefully when morally evaluating the actions of others in different times or cultural contexts. We should avoid judging people's acts by standards unavailable to them since "it is irrational to demand that … agent[s] should govern their doings by considerations outside their ken." (p. 137) Perhaps so, though this could seem to replace one sort of moral condescension, judgmentalism, for another, viz., for the suggestion that better standards are simply beyond someone's rational capacity in context.

The next chapter, apposite for our political times, urges that the utopian ideal of consensus be replaced by "arrangements that [would] make it possible for people who disagree to nevertheless contribute to a common good." (p. 157) Details are not provided. "The Power of Ideals" chapter reiterates some points about their pragmatic value and ends by affirming that a life without ideals will be deficient in purposes lending themselves to "reflective satisfaction." Ecce homo philosophicus, though I, contrarily, see no philosophical or "spiritual impoverishment" in being rational without giving rationality preeminence as one's life's goal.

In a surprising turn from his veritable religion of rationality, Rescher moves on to a defense of religion proper. Much of his discussion proceeds without reference to a divine being -- religion is said to take a non-cognitive, "appreciative approach of affinity, awe, and wonder" (p. 171) toward the world. But I'd be inclined to say that religious souls are more commonly insufficiently thus appreciative -- wanting something more than the imminently awesome wonders of this world. Rescher himself, as if to prove my point, describes religion as serving "to enrich reality and our relation to it by adding meaning, significance, and value." (p. 172) The felt need of humans for religion is defended as likely well-grounded in the world, else rather less likely to have evolved. Here, I think, Rescher once again expresses too much affinity to the natural order and too little appreciation for the chancy, all too capricious character of its evolutionary processes and products.

"An ethically good and evaluatively fruitful life" (p. 182) is possible but harder without religion, he opines. But matters cognitive and rational are, on his view, in no need of divine assistance; and among these matters are, also on his view, morality and reflective philosophical inquiry. Besides, mightn't religion-bred ethical behavior often be doing right for the wrong reasons? He applauds religion's spirit-lifting virtue "in easing people's anguish and anxieties in the face of life's frustrations and difficulties." (p. 186) An efficacious "opiate of the masses," perhaps? Might it not sometimes be an expression of anxiety? And why are religious types more likely, as surveys suggest, to be fearful of death -- quite apart from specific worries about eternal damnation?

Finally, I'd like to take brief notice of Rescher’s Leibnizian ruminations on the impossibility of improving this imperfect but "best of all possible worlds." His discussion is more nuanced than I'm able to convey here, but let me simply say that taking the topic seriously in the first place is surely a symptom of his excessively zealous commitment to a belief in some rationalistic, systematic conception of the cosmos.