2011.06.04

John Hick

Between Faith and Doubt: Dialogues on Religion and Reason

John Hick, Between Faith and Doubt: Dialogues on Religion and Reason, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 176pp., $20.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780230251670.

Reviewed by Andrew Cullison, SUNY Fredonia


John Hick's Between Faith and Doubt is a clear, non-technical introduction to his philosophical views about religion. Although it's written in dialogue form, Hick has written himself in as one of the characters. It will be of interest to professional philosophers who simply want to get a quick introduction to Hick's views on a wide range of religious topics, but it is so accessible that it will also be of interest to laypersons. It is worth considering as a text in a philosophy of religion class, particularly for classes with a heavy emphasis on religious experience or religious pluralism. However, as I’ll note below, it is missing some elements that I would like to see in a primary text for a class.

It would be unfair to hold a work like this to the same standards of rigor and precision as one would if this were a research monograph. It's clearly an informal introduction to John Hick's views, and given the breadth and scope of Hick's work it attempts to cover a wide range of topics in a mere 166 pages. In what follows I will briefly summarize the core themes of the book, and I'll restrict my philosophical criticisms to issues that I think are fair to raise for an introductory book like this.

There are 15 short chapters, and while it is not labeled as having separate parts, the book does naturally divide into three basic sections. In the first four chapters, Hick outlines a rough sketch of his positive view and distinguishes it from a primary alternative, classical theism. He also presents his reasons for rejecting classical theism. The next five chapters make up a defense of the thesis that religious experience can ground the rationality of religious belief, particularly religious belief of the sort that Hick endorses. Religious experience is what Hick regards as the primary (and best) evidence for his view. The last six chapters discuss implications of his views for other world religions and life after death. They also attempt to explain why suffering and wickedness in the world are not problems for Hick's views.

In "Defining the Issue: Naturalism vs. Religions" (chapter one), John and his friend David discuss whether it's reasonable to believe that science will eventually explain everything. David says that it is, and John argues that no matter how complete our scientific theory is there will always be something that science will not explain (e.g., why the universe exists at all in the particular way that it exists).

In the next chapter, they tackle the question of whether God's existence can be proved. John and David quickly discuss some classic arguments for the existence of God. They discuss Anselm's version of the ontological argument, but it's curious that the only response presented, which John concludes is decisive, is Kant's objection that existence is not a predicate. There is no discussion of other responses, or of other versions of the ontological argument.[1]

Next they discuss Aquinas' first-cause argument, and John rejects it on the grounds that the Universe could be the first cause, or that the first cause need not be an omnipotent, omniscient, omnibenevolent being (hereafter OOO-being). They discuss a version of the fine-tuning argument and reject it on the grounds that the multiverse is an equally good hypothesis. John also notes that, at best, the fine-tuning argument points to an intelligent designer, but not the God of classical theism.

The chapter closes by briefly considering Swinburne's argument that God is the best explanation of a wide variety of phenomena, including that there is something rather than nothing and that the something exhibits (a) incredible complexity yet (b) remarkable uniformity. Swinburne claims that you would expect this on the theistic hypothesis, so we should think that the existence of God is the best candidate brute fact to explain everything. John claims that an uncreated universe is a better candidate brute fact.

This is one of the chapters that concerns me about using this book for a philosophy of religion class. It lays out a few core arguments in a simple, accessible way, but doesn't include the level of detail that I would want even for my intro students (e.g., by discussing motivations for the premises in detail, discussing a few more possible objections to each of the arguments, and perhaps a few candidate responses to those objections). That said, some prefer readings that don't lay out all the core issues in order to let some of these issues come out naturally in class discussion. If you're in this latter camp, the level of detail on these arguments in this chapter may suit your purposes.

In the third chapter, Hick starts laying out his positive view. He thinks there is something supranatural that he calls The Transcendent, but that it's not

an all-powerful divine being who knows everything, is infinitely wise, good and loving, and who is the creator and ruler of the universe, and who intervenes from time to time on earth, either on his own initiative or in answer to prayer, as recounted in the Bible. (21)

He says he has two reasons for rejecting the above version of theism[2]: "one religious and the other philosophical" (21). His philosophical reason is that he doesn't think the idea of an infinite person makes sense:

We know what we mean by a person because we are ourselves a person. And to be a person is to be a particular person, distinct from other persons, with our own boundaries. When two people are interacting with each other as persons, this is only possible because each of them has his or her own individual borders -- otherwise they would not be two distinct persons. In other words, personhood is essentially finite. (22)

Here I think it is fair to note a philosophical problem with this argument. It is far from clear that personhood is essentially finite in any sense that rules out the possibility of a person being capable of having something like infinite wisdom or goodness. John seems to think that individuating persons requires that persons have "individual and finite borders", but I'm not sure I understand what individual and finite borders are; in so far as I do understand the terms, they don't seem necessary for person individuation.

Suppose a person is some kind of self-aware sphere of consciousness. I see no conceptual barrier to thinking that you could have two self-aware spheres of consciousness and one or more could have the capacity for infinite wisdom and goodness by having an infinite number of beliefs and other mental states. And I don't see how having an infinite number of mental states that might be required for infinite wisdom and goodness blurs the boundaries between persons. Why couldn't whatever infinities are involved with respect to an OOO-being happen within that being's sphere of consciousness? There may be a quick and easy answer to this, but we should have it in this discussion, especially since this argument is the core philosophical reason John has for favoring his view over classical theism.

John's religious reason is basically a variant of the problem of evil. He thinks there is something bad about a God who answers some prayers but not others. He gives us an example where someone prays to be saved and survives a car crash while others die. He then says,

Suppose the survivor then thanks God for saving her, really meaning what she says. Should we be forgetting that if it was, so to speak, okay from God's point of view to intervene miraculously on earth, then God must not only have decided to save her but also decided not to save the other three. What then becomes of God's universal love? Why does he or she not intervene to prevent terrible events all over the world? Why be so selective? The age-old problem of God and evil now comes to the fore. (23)

John is endorsing some variant of the problem of evil which may be a good reason to reject classical theism, but my worry here is that this passage is difficult to reconcile with claims John makes later in the book that suggest that he thinks that evil is compatible with the existence of both a theistic God and a non-theistic but in some sense friendly universe. I'll say more about this below.[3]

In the fourth chapter, "Religion without Transcendence", the religious anti-realist is introduced, someone who thinks that God is some kind of metaphorical personification of human ideals and that talk about eternal life must reference some quality of life that we can achieve here on earth. John spends much of this chapter pointing out what a bleak picture of the human condition naturalism is committed to and that religious anti-realism seems to have an equally bleak picture of the human condition. John thinks they should embrace the pessimistic outlook that naturalists like Bertrand Russell seem to embrace and stop pretending that you can get all that is really important about realist theism from the more naturalistic anti-realist theism. I don't have much in the way of direct criticism of John's position here, but it's puzzling given some things that are said later in the chapter about John's own views of the afterlife.

For the next five chapters John and David discuss whether or not religious experience can ground rational religious belief. John thinks that his own religious experiences and the experiences of other people are the best reasons for holding religious beliefs. He does not think that we necessarily argue from religious experiences to religious propositions; rather, he thinks they are more like perceptual experiences that provide immediate, epistemically basic justification for religious beliefs.

We first get nice introduction to some facts about religious experience. John describes experiences that lead people to think that there is a basic goodness to the universe. Some experiences involve isolated feelings of peace, but some also involve simply encountering humans being good to other humans. John then defends something like phenomenal conservatism. He argues that it is rational to trust perceptual experiences unless we have some reason in a particular case to not trust them. He then argues that people with religious experiences should do the same.

The rest of John and David's discussion centers on David's claim that we have several reasons to distrust religious experiences. Perceptual experiences are compulsory; the external world forces itself on us. Perceptual experiences are universal; nearly everyone has them. Perceptual experiences are also uniform; everyone has basically the same experiences. David says that the fact that religious experiences lack these three features give us good reason to distrust such experiences.

John's explanation for why religious experience is neither compulsory nor universal begins by first explaining why an OOO-being would have good reasons to hide. Hiding would insure that belief in the OOO-being wasn't compulsory, and John says that there are good reasons for an OOO-being to give creatures some freedom with respect to belief. However, this doesn't quite address the issue, because John has already argued that there is not an OOO-being, and he is non-committal about whether or not The Ultimate is the sort of thing that would control religious experience based for these kinds of reasons. David even asks how non-theistic traditions could use this explanation, and we don't get a clear answer from John. This discussion left me thinking that if we accepted John's explanation for why an OOO-being would not want compulsory and universal religious experiences, then the classical theist is in a better position to appeal to religious experiences than someone in Hick's position.

David then presses John again by reiterating that religious experiences are not uniform and that people have apparently conflicting religious experiences. Here John makes a distinction between naive realism and critical realism with respect to ordinary perception. The naive realist thinks that we all perceive the world in the same way and as it really is. Critical realism with respect to perception holds that there is an external world that we perceive, but our perceptions of this reality might be drastically different from one another (and in some cases apparently contradictory).

John thinks critical realism is much more plausible and that if you accept critical realism for perception, then there should be no issue with an analogous view for religious experience. The idea here is that people from different religious traditions are likely having legitimate religious experiences of the transcendent reality, but they are just experiencing this reality in different ways. The main point is that mere appearance of contradiction is not sufficient evidence to think that religious experiences are not of some transcendent reality. At best, the apparent contradictions might count against the veridicality of accidental religious differences, but they can still, according to John, justify some very general propositions about the existence of a basically good and friendly supranatural reality.

This series of chapters on religious experience ends with two chapters discussing the challenge that neuroscience poses for religious experiences. The challenge is that there are purely natural, neurological explanations for why someone would have religious experiences. We've identified neural correlates in the brain for religious experiences, which is supposed to cast some doubt on the claim that these are experiences of a supranatural reality. In the first of these two chapters John discusses two philosophical puzzles that don't quite seem relevant. First, he spends time arguing against mind-brain identity. However, it's unclear why the discussion takes this turn. Presumably, even a substance dualist could embrace the neurological explanation of religious experience and thus argue that such experiences are not good evidence for a supranatural reality. After the discussion of mind-body identity, there is a quick discussion about whether or not determinism is true. But again, whether or not determinism is true doesn't seem to threaten the neurological explanation of religious experience. Indeterminists and libertarians about freewill can consistently maintain that our perceptual and religious experiences have causes, and they can also maintain that what they are caused by has some bearing on what epistemic work they can do.[4]

Ultimately, it is never made clear how refuting mind-body identity or determinism is relevant to undermining the neurological explanation of religious experiences, because the naturalistic explanations seem compatible with both the denial of determinism and the denial of mind-brain identity. It is precisely because these connections are unclear and not obvious that I think more time should have been spent explaining to the layperson why determinism and mind-body identity have any bearing on the neurological explanations of religious experience.

David sticks with the point in the next chapter and cites several instances where various drug-induced states seem to produce the same kinds of experiences that people who have had religious experiences report. Here we get much clearer objections that one tends to also find in the literature on religious experience. John argues that the mere fact that we have found neural correlates to religious experiences that can be stimulated by alternative mechanisms does not constitute a naturalistic explanation of religious experience. It's still open that when the neural states occur in sober states these are ways in which we perceive "the Ultimate", and it's also open that drug-induced states enhance awareness of the ultimate.

The last six chapters discuss the implications that John's view has for other world religions and life after death. They also cover some additional puzzles for John's views about evil. In the chapter on Christianity, John discusses his evangelical conversion to Christianity and why he now rejects Christianity based on historical critiques of the New Testament. With respect to Islam, John discusses the work of Islamic reformers, in particular the views of Abdolkarim Souresh. Souresh seems to be pushing for a version of Islam similar in many respects to Hick's global interpretation of religion. There are essentials and accidentals according to Souresh; the essentials are being one with God and obedience to God, while almost everything else about Islam, including things like sharia law, are accidental.

The two remaining puzzles for John's views that he discusses are the Problem of Evil and the claim that many have raised that there is something bad about religious belief because of all the harm done for religious reasons.

With respect to the claim that religion is the source of significant harm, John concedes that this is true, and he spends much of the chapter discussing accounts of what look like religious persecution of religious pluralists. There are even some auto-biographical examples that are interesting to read. At the end of it all John suggests that the issue is likely a wash. Religion has been a source of harm, but it has also been a source of good.

With respect to the Problem of Evil, John argues that classical theists and non-theists who believe in a basically good universe can avoid the problem. He presents the free-will defense, and in response to the problem of natural evil (which is designed to avoid the free will defense) he presents perhaps Hick's most well-known contribution to debates in philosophy of religion: his soul-making (or person-making) defense. Roughly, the idea is that one of the fundamental purposes of life is so that we can grow as persons. And growing as persons requires a world that has the kinds of trials and tribulations we experience here.

The book closes with a discussion of Hick's views about the afterlife. John thinks that person-making requires a finite mortal life because that creates the sort of urgency that allows for person-making. But he thinks that the goodness of the Universe suggests that there won't ever be an end to chains of person-making events. This pushes him to think that some kind of reincarnation is likely, but it's not the comforting sort of reincarnation according to which there is some hope of possibly recalling past lives. What passes on is some kind of dispositional structure. Regarding the bleakness of this picture, David and John have the following exchange:

David: Doesn't it mean that the present conscious me and the present conscious you are going to perish completely at death?

John: Yes, it does. And that's something most of us find hard to face. We have to learn to accept our mortality, and to think of ourselves as like runners in a relay race, each passing the torch onto the next. (157-8)

That concludes my summary. I have been somewhat reserved in raising philosophical objections and have only highlighted a few that I think are fair to raise for an introductory level survey of the positions discussed in this book. But I'm now in a position to elaborate on two criticisms that I think are fair to raise that will, I hope, make more sense now that the entire book has been summarized.

Puzzle About John's Position on the Problem of Evil

My first worry has to do with apparently conflicting things Hick says about the problem of evil. Recall that early in the book, John cites something like the problem of evil as his religious reason for rejecting classical theism, but near the very end of the book he seems to indicate that he thinks that the problem of evil is not a problem even for classical theism. There may be a way to reconcile these two positions, but in an introductory book this will seems confusing to undergraduates, and I think it would have been worth saying something about why the two positions are incompatible.

Puzzle About the Role of Experience

My other criticism has to do with the role of religious experience. One of John's other main points against the rationality of classical theism is that he thinks that the reasonableness of classical theism, unlike his view, cannot be grounded in religious experience. The reason for this is that John claims that one could never have an experience of something having infinite wisdom, power, or goodness. But his claim here is in tension with two other things he seems to endorse.

First, given his endorsement of something like phenomenal conservatism, it's not clear why people could not reflect on the proposition "I am in the presence of an OOO-being" and get a strong seeming that this is "right" or "true" and get prima facie justification for classical theism. We can reject phenomenal conservatism to avoid this consequence, but Hick's endorsement of it makes it more difficulty for him to avoid this consequence.

Second, Hick seems to think that the universe will always be a friendly, hospitable place for persons. The cycle of reincarnation and person-making won't end. His basis for this seems to be largely religious experiences that the universe is generally good and friendly, but how could a religious experience contain an impression that the universe is eternally good or that the ultimate source of goodness won't fizzle out some day? It seems odd to insist that religious seemings couldn't ground belief in an OOO-being because religious experiences could not contain any impressions of eternality or infinity, but then claim that one's own religious experience of the Ultimate grounds the belief that the Universe will always and forever be good and provide room for moral agents to perpetually develop their character. Again, this is something that I think is worth addressing in an introductory volume.


[1] Although it's worth noting that Hick points us to a reference for his discussion of another version of Anselm's argument developed by Charles Hawthorne and Norman Malcolm.

[2] I say two reasons, but I suspect Hick has more. He briefly alludes to various puzzles about the divine attributes such as the problem of freedom and foreknowledge and the paradox of the stone.

[3] John is quick to point out that he does not deny the existence of powerful, loving personal beings but that these are likely gods "with a lowercase g", what Christians might call angels. John seems to think that if there are any personal relationships between humans and transcendent higher powers, it is with these deas. And his primary reason for thinking that you shouldn't think that you're having a relationship with an OOO-being rather than one of these deas is that you could never experience infinite power and wisdom. You might have an experience of having interacted with a very powerful and very knowledgeable being, but never an omnipotent or omniscient being.

[4] It's also worth noting that we don't really get a refutation of determinism. John simply argues that determinism is self-defeating, because if it is true no one would be rational in believing it because no one would be able to freely arrive at their beliefs. It's not clear why this would be true.