2011.06.23

Ernest Sosa

Knowing Full Well

Ernest Sosa, Knowing Full Well, Princeton University Press, 2011, 163pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691143972.

Reviewed by Adam Morton, University of Alberta


In this book Ernest Sosa develops further the ideas about grades of knowledge for which he is known. It is interesting, novel, often convincing, and extraordinarily clearly written. I admire it, though much of this review will express some doubts about some of Sosa's conclusions. Before that, let me state very generally two things that I think are extremely right here. The first is the insistence on a symmetry between the evaluation of belief or inquiry and the evaluation of action. In fact, inquiry is a special kind of action, aimed at the special target of true belief, and normative attributes of belief ought to be special cases of more general attributes of actions. The second is a refusal of intuition-mongering in favour of describing attributes of belief and action and explaining why they are valuable. The only problem is: I don't see what these attributes really are.

As in previous work, Sosa evaluates beliefs as Accurate (true), Adroit/competent (epistemically virtuous), and Apt (accurate because adroit). As before, Sosa compares this to purposeful action, in particular shooting at a target. But now the metaphor has become a generalization. All directed actions fall under the AAA scheme of evaluations. Apt beliefs are "animal knowledge", and although Sosa does not use the term we could call apt actions animal accomplishments: getting what you want because of your efforts and capacities. The value problem for knowledge can now arise in a more general form: what is better about acts that achieve their end because of one's efforts, above the value of achieving one's end?

There is a simple and I think obviously correct answer that Sosa suggests (p. 64) but does not state in so many words. Distinguish between a good and gaining the good: the value of gaining the good is the form the good takes when one has gained it. What is gained is one's end, in the particular case truth, and the form that this takes when it has been gained is gained-by-one end, that is success, and in particular knowledge. (What's the value of a can of beans? Flavor and nutrition. What's the value of beans-that-you've-gained? The same: that's what beans are when you've gained them, and you can't try to gain beans-that-you-haven't-gained. A can of beans can fall on your head randomly and unexpectedly while you walk down the street, but this isn't something you can bring about.) So while getting to Larissa by accident might be good, if that is where you want to be, you couldn't try or aim to get to Larissa by accident, because if you succeeded in getting there you would have failed in getting there by accident. Similarly, a true belief about the road to Larissa would be useful in getting you there (from Athens I'd suggest the E75 toll road), and succeeding in having this true belief would be knowing the road to Larissa, while trying to get there by guessing would be insane.

We don't need to write books about this: the value problem for simple knowledge dissolves as soon as we see that knowledge is a special case of achieving an aim. Or, put differently, if there were any extra value associated with simple knowledge it would be a peculiar kind that we cannot try for except by trying to get truth. For more complex knowledge there are more interesting problems, as we can try for one specific kind of knowledge rather than another. Sosa presents us with a number of more complex forms of knowledge. In chapter one he discusses beliefs that are well-aimed, resulting from a capacity to proceed to or refrain from acquisition. As he says, this is a special case of well-chosen action. He takes the core of good choice to be proper risk-management, so in effect a well-aimed belief is one that maximizes the chance of attaining epistemic goods. Sosa expresses this (p. 11) as "a performance is fully apt only if its first order aptness derives sufficiently from the agent's assessment … of his chances of success." The crucial element here is "assessment", which for Sosa takes the form of a meta-belief about the inquiry, so that he can identify this form of full aptness, knowing full well, with reflective knowledge.

It is clear that reflective knowledge, so defined, need not maximize the chances of obtaining truths, let alone other epistemic goods. For one can think very hard about whether and how to learn the answer to a trivial and limiting question. It is not clear how much it need fit an intuitive picture of reflective knowledge. Part of the uncertainty comes from Sosa's not specifying whether, for example, a cognitive mechanism that chooses means for acquiring beliefs will count as giving an assessment. (The processes that set one's balance between seeking truths and avoiding falsehoods on particular topics surely operate largely unconsciously, and are not to be understood by reflection.) It seems clear, on the other hand, that a conscious choice of a risky strategy for discovering whether p -- e.g., establishing by elaborate scholarship something that one could find out by looking -- can result in genuine and intuitively reflective knowledge.

In any case, there is a real and interesting question of the ways in which such knowledge is valuable, over and above the value of having an answer to one's question. Will reflective knowledge à la Sosa result in a better grasp of a proposition; will it better exhibit the agent's epistemic capacities; will it result in a greater proportion of true beliefs? I see no reason to think that the answer to any of these questions is in all cases affirmative. A person could want to be so much in favor with the gods that just by guessing she would obtain true beliefs on some topic. Suppose she gets what she wants. While it might be argued that she had first order knowledge (since the gods deliberately steered her guessing towards truth), she would not have managed her inquiry in a way that produced its success. So we can ask in what ways her result is valuable and what it loses in comparison with a careful evidence-based study of the same questions. My answer would be that her gains are personal: she has got to satisfy a weird and idiosyncratic aim. The losses are best described in terms of epistemic virtues -- thick virtues of epistemic character -- that will normally result in truth and understanding but which she is failing to exhibit. I am not sure in detail what Sosa's answer would be, but I am sure it would be different.

Questions of kinds and levels of knowledge return later in the book with an interesting discussion of cases in which false beliefs in nearby situations do not seem to interfere with knowledge. In a central case a person correctly identifies the color of a surface in spite of the fact that there are nearby surfaces that would fool him. For Sosa, the crucial fact is that he has employed his perceptual faculties to good effect (Sosa makes him a professional color inspector, so his faculties are well honed and we take it that he is doing what he should in employing them.) These cases contrast with others in which a person is correct about the color of a surface though it was chosen from a set of surfaces that she would have misidentified. She does not know. It seems right to say that the inspector still knows if he is driven to the location of his surface, which is chosen at random, and the other destinations have surfaces that would have foxed his powers. (Compare: you know what you see in a random flash of lightning, though in nearby worlds you form no such belief.) Notice that these cases too generalize to action. A person who pulls a lever opening a dam, from a row of levers the others of which are all dummies, has not achieved the opening of the dam. But a person who is taken to the control room of a dam and pulls the only lever there, which is properly connected, has achieved it, even if he could easily have been taken to the control room of another dam where the identical lever was disconnected.

What can the difference consist in, if not something about thin capacity virtues? Sosa argues against considerations of safety (stability of the fact in nearby situations having the belief). One important consideration is the specificity of the capacities the inspector deploys. Suppose that he has honed to a high degree a set of color-recognizing skills with a lazy feature: a certain pattern of reflectance triggers a short cut which is often right. The comparison surfaces in the other locations have this reflectance pattern but the shortcut will give the wrong answer in these cases. Lastly, in the actual location we have the same reflectance pattern plus, by accident, a gas that disables the short-cut, enabling the much practiced basic process to give the right answer. This does not seem like knowledge, and it is one way of filling in the details in the basic inspector scenario. So the correct exercise of generally effective capacities does not seem to be sufficient. The counterfactual behavior of the token processes involved seems to matter.

Note that the case transfers to action. The dam-opener's much practiced grip will be supplemented by a nudge with the elbow when she puts more weight on her left foot, as she would in all the control rooms she might have visited that day, jamming the unusual mechanism. But a spider web drifting onto her arm prevents the nudge so she uses her usual grip with the result that, by pure fluky luck, the dam opens.

Intuitions are very delicate in these cases. The labels are in the end not important. What does matter is the values of distinguishable kinds of knowledge and accomplishment. In these cases a person can receive credit for exercising her capacities in an exemplary way, even though she is not performing the task in the way we would ideally plan. In this fragile sense she has violated a normative constraint. "Norm" and "normative" are used rather carelessly in a lot of epistemology, and in chapter three Sosa tries to pin down the links between norms of assertion, knowledge as a norm, and epistemic values. This chapter repays careful study. I think that, reduced to the crude terms I am comfortable with, it amounts to the idea that an ascription of knowledge is a prerequisite for a value attribution. Some knowledge is not praiseworthy, but if we are to praise someone's inquiry we must first take the result to be knowledge. (Again there is a symmetry with action: to praise someone's efforts we must first take their result to be something that person has done.)

There are exceptions, not mentioned by Sosa. We can praise someone for not knowing what was private or, more interestingly, not bothering to know things that would distract them. ("She had the sense only to guess here, but went on to think hard about the real question.") But perhaps here what we value is the epistemic performance as act, and so we take the refraining from knowledge as an accomplishment. Sosa writes of full and flawed performance, and of epistemically better and worse results. I am suspicious of these terms, given the many ways in which we value inquiry and its results, and so I resist the terminology of knowing full well: there is plain simple knowledge which is just success in obtaining a true belief, and there are more and more refined forms of success. Do we reach a limit? We're still collecting little chunks of extra reassurance about special relativity.

I have ignored important strands and sections. There is a sharp but impatient discussion of contextualism and a sensitive comparison of testimony and the use of instruments. And at the end of the book there is a stimulating and inconclusive discussion of bootstrapping that I find fascinating and puzzling. I take from it a need to refine kinds and grades of knowledge. We use evidence from the senses to understand how perception works and eventually to explain why the senses are generally reliable. In one way this is a routine scientific process, and in another it is worryingly circular. What are we to make of the results? We want to commend these results -- we have extended our knowledge of how and when particular senses give accurate information -- but we also want to point out that they have no force as a refutation of some drastic possibilities. Sosa hints that such knowledge is animal but not reflective, but this does not distinguish the different -- contrastive? -- force of two differently bootstrapped beliefs. There must be more to say here, and on the other related topics of this impressive book.