2011.07.10

Fred Evans

The Multivoiced Body: Society and Communication in the Age of Diversity

Fred Evans, The Multivoiced Body: Society and Communication in the Age of Diversity, Columbia University Press, 2009, 352pp., $26.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231145015.

Reviewed by Noëlle McAfee, Emory University


Fred Evans' The Multivoiced Body: Society and Communication in the Age of Diversity is a poetic yet carefully worked out response to the dilemma of diversity, that is, the dilemma of appreciating difference without losing community or focusing so much on unity that we risk eradicating difference. To address this ancient problem of the one and the many, which in modern times has taken horrific detours into genocide and ethnic cleansing, this book offers an account of society as a unity composed of difference. It shows how the most important participants in society are not individuals, or governments, or the State, or even civil society, but the voices that resound throughout it. To make his case that society is a multivoiced body and to bring this idea to bear on matters from workplace democracy to new social media, Evans uses examples from the arts, including poetry, video opera, and literature, and draws on a vast range of work in philosophy, including works by both analytic and continental philosophers, major figures in the history of philosophy, as well as others doing work in cultural theory, cognitive science, and social theory.

The first of the three parts of the book takes up the dilemma of diversity, namely that diversity seems to render impossible the idea of community, and ideals of community tend to try to homogenize differences. While some postmodernists might be happy to forgo community for a free play of difference, and some modernists might be willing to impose a unified story in order to create community, Evans seeks a way to think of society as a body with a plurality of voices. At any given moment, some voices in society might have the lead, but they nonetheless will become inflected by a need to appeal to other voices, transforming themselves and society in the process. If the leading voices become too dominant -- become what Evans terms oracular -- they may try to wipe out competing voices, through silencing or "ethnic cleansing" or any number of atrocities. The ideal of the multivoiced body is to let the various voices have their say, for them to inflect and transform each other. Here we have a social body in process, to borrow a phrase from Julia Kristeva, not fixed or frozen but open to difference without dissolving into chaos. This is what Evans calls chaosmos. His account is post-structuralist in the best sense, showing the dynamic process by which societies form and change.

In the second part of the book, Evans argues that neither modernism's focus on the subject nor postmodernism's focus on language explains the kind of selves that we are. Postmodern conceptions of language tend to become abstracted and disconnected from living beings. Evans converts this postmodern notion of discourse into the concept of society as a multivoiced body. We members of this body are not simply subjected to discourse, as in some postmodern thought, nor are we masters of it as the moderns dreamed. We have freedom and agency to take various voices, but we never own any one and often others will make claims on us. We can't simply voice "our own" concerns, for any voice is going to resound with others. As Evans writes, "It is … as true to say that being a certain voice, or becoming another one, happens to us as it is to say that we do it" (156).

Hence within the dynamic multivoiced body, we share what Evans calls an elliptical identity with voices (145). "As participants in the interplay among voices," he writes, "we are already thrown 'ahead of ourselves' and thus find that we always have more to say or see than our immediate utterances and perceptions suggest" (145). At any moment our identity "is as a particular voice, and not as a subject beneath or beyond voice" (156). Moreover, the hybridization of voices allows for change and resistance to dominant discourses.

The concept of a multivoiced body provides a bridge between the bodies we inhabit in particular places and anonymous discourses that circulate in no particular place. Our bodies tether voices to places, but, Evans insists, voice has a priority over place. "All 'voicings' occur somewhere, then, but that somewhere is nowhere for us unless it is positioned within the interplay of voices," he writes. "The multivoiced body is an event -- the interplay of voices -- that helps establish the place in which it occurs" (149). Part two closes with a chapter on communication, which argues against various notions of language as means for transferring information, or reaching understanding, or hermeneutic interpretation, etc., and for seeing communication as "the reproduction and metamorphosis of society" (192). Along with this concept comes an ethics of communication, a "virtue ethics" of "fecund hearing" or Nietzschean generosity. Simply put, for the multivoiced body to change for the better, we all need to hear and attend to the multitude of voices resounding in it.

The third and final part of the book addresses the political dimensions of the multivoiced body. In chapter eight Evans develops his own psychoanalytic theory of the social unconscious and how it both produces oracles and helps to counter them. In chapter nine he develops Manuel Castell's idea of networks to provide a way to work out what is promising in Michael Hardt and Antonio Negri's work on empire and the multitude. Empire, like oracles or any totalitarian identities, needs to be countered by public power, but the multitude in Hardt and Negri's work is too anonymous to have any such power. But if we translate multitude into a language of a network society or solidarity, we can notice how in a decentered society or even world, counter-hegemonic solidarity can organize from below. Castell's work, in Evans's hands, helps explain the phenomena of global networks of environmental, labor, and other progressive groups and how their voices eat away at the oracular voices of global capital networks and forces.

In the final chapter of the book, Evans distinguishes his concept of the political from Carl Schmitt's and then looks at the promise and limitations of Rawls's and Habermas's liberal theories in order to develop his own conceptions of democracy and justice. In short, Evans develops the idea of democracy as a "creative interplay of voices" (242). Justice is "the orientation of the multivoiced body -- the creative interplay among voices -- when it is not dominated by an oracle" (259). But even when society is dominated by an oracle,

the creative interplay of equally audible voices still remains as its latent demand. Moreover, the multivoiced body is another name for the most basic sense of democracy. Therefore, the principle of justice is no more and no less than the performance of democracy (258, emphasis added).

When society tries to tune out some voices, to deny them audibility, for example when it tries to ignore rights claims from marginalized or threatening groups in society, it is being unjust because it is denying the free interplay of voices. At the same time, when some groups demand that their voice be the supreme one and that others be silenced, then those groups' demands violate the principle of justice for a multivoiced body. Hence, justice allows us to "exclude the excluders." In short, the principle of justice for a multivoiced body does have a way to differentiate democratically between beseeching and reactionary voices.

For this reader, an interesting but underdeveloped idea in the book is that of performativity. Recall these passages as cited above:

"The multivoiced body is an event -- the interplay of voices -- that helps establish the place in which it occurs" (149).

Justice is "the orientation of the multivoiced body -- the creative interplay among voices -- when it is not dominated by an oracle" (259). But even when society is dominated by an oracle, "the creative interplay of equally audible voices still remains as its latent demand. Moreover, the multivoiced body is another name for the most basic sense of democracy. Therefore, the principle of justice is no more and no less than the performance of democracy" (258, emphasis added).

    Implicit here is the important idea that political phenomena, identity, and bodies are processes rather than things, with political identities being provisional achievements. Likewise, rights claims are not assertions of the truth of our nature but claims that we make on other people.

    Evans's book could be seen as an approach to the Kantian and Rousseauean problematic of how we can be both determined and free. Modern philosophers focused on our freedom, poststructuralists on our subjugation. Some like Judith Butler focus on performative ways that we can extricate ourselves from subjection. Evans shows how a multivoiced body performatively makes and remakes itself. Recall the theme of reproduction and metamorphosis. By speaking in, at varying times, voices we've been handed and those we take up, we can performatively make things other than they are.

    Finally, a related set of questions: What is the genre of this text? Is this an account of how Evans thinks society functions or is it is an ideal of how it ought to function? Is the identification of society as a multivoiced body a name of a fact, an empirical observation or claim? An alternative to what Rawls called the fact of pluralism or others call multicultural, diverse societies? Or is it an ideal, something we should aspire to think, hear, identify with, and use to think about how we should act? In other words, is this social theory or a normative injunction?

    I am thinking that it is both, but if so how would Evans make sense of this? To the extent that it is both an empirical claim and a normative injunction, then the idea must be that the ways things are, while often unsatisfactory, has within it a dynamic that allows for things to be otherwise than they are. This seems to be contradictory, or at least difficult to think. Yet it seems to be the logic of the phenomenon of the multivoiced body, both the text -- and the world.

    How can a book or a theory be an account of what is -- ontology -- and also an account of what is not -- ethics? Does the phenomenon of the multivoiced body have a trajectory toward justice and democracy? Was the holocaust an aberration from this trajectory? Evans's theory does account for both possibilities and the oscillations that occur from one to the other. It explains both the killing fields of Cambodia and the struggles for freedom and justice, and how one kind of phenomenon will give rise to the other.

    The book itself might be read as a normative injunction. We the readers of this text are not just supposed to read it and understand and walk away; we're supposed to do something. The chapter on communication ends with an ethics: we are to listen fecundly to voices not yet audible. The closing chapter calls for justice, which Evans sees ultimately as a demand, though an impossible one, to hear all voices equally; but this would be "a condition that amounts to Babel and under which we would not be able to hear any of them" (271). So we try to approximate this. But from where does this ethical demand issue? If the voices that animate me are the dominant ones, if my voices are in power to the detriment of others, why should I listen to anyone else? Evans's discussion of the social unconscious explains the phenomenon of voices becoming oracular and totalitarian, of how they find other voices threatening, but not why they would ever decide to heed the voices of others. This book is not written for them; it is not that kind of ethics. But it is written for those who want change but might despair at the possibility of finding commonality without endangering heterogeneity.