Eleonore Stump

Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering

Eleonore Stump, Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering, Oxford University Press, 2010, 668pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199277421.

Reviewed by Paul Draper, Purdue University

Eleonore Stump's magnum opus, Wandering in Darkness, is an ambitious and impressive book on the intellectual problem of God and evil. It contains an abundance of wisdom on topics as diverse as the nature of love, the importance of narrative for philosophy, the epistemology of "second person" experience, and the relationship between human flourishing and the "desires of the heart." The goal of the book is to solve the evidential problem of suffering (or, to be more precise, the evidential problem of mentally fully functional adult human suffering). Whether it accomplishes that goal may depend, as I will explain later, on what one takes the evidential problem of suffering to be.

In Stump's opinion, all that is required for such a solution is a successful defense. A defense, as she understands it, is an attempt to describe an epistemically possible world exhibiting the same pattern of suffering that we find in the actual world in spite of the fact that an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good God exists. It includes an attempt to specify one or more morally sufficient reasons that explain how the God of that world, in spite of being both omnipotent and omniscient, is morally justified in allowing (at least some of) the suffering in that world. Remarkably, in the world of Stump's defense, God has only a single general reason for allowing all of the suffering experienced by adult humans who are mentally fully functional. (Her defense, as she readily admits, offers no explicit explanation for the suffering of animals, children, and mentally disabled adults.)

Stump, whose work on the thought of St. Thomas Aquinas is widely acclaimed, incorporates into the world of her defense both St. Thomas's general worldview (including most importantly his scale of value and his account of love and its impediments) and an expanded version of St. Thomas's theodicy -- his attempt to identify God's actual reason for allowing suffering. Stump infers that St. Thomas's theodicy needs expansion from the fact that, while it addresses suffering that undermines our flourishing, it neglects suffering resulting from the loss of our heart's desires. (Although this part of her defense is ingenious and highly original, I won't say any more about it in this review.)

In several places in the book, Stump states that four Biblical narratives about suffering -- the stories of Job, Samson, Abraham and Isaac, and Mary of Bethany -- are also part of the defense. These narratives are discussed in great detail in the third and longest of the book's four parts. In other places, however, she seems to take these stories to be, not part of the defense itself, but instead part of the defense of the defense. Mostly for philosophical reasons (but not without significant textual support), I interpret her considered view to be that these stories are in fact part of the defense itself, while her philosophically informed and motivated literary analyses of them are part of the defense of the defense. When she says that the stories are part of the defense, however, I doubt she means to be saying that in the world of the defense they are true. I suspect she only means to be saying that in that world the stories are divinely inspired (whether or not they are fictional).

The most important and most difficult interpretive puzzle for any reader of this book is the question of how, exactly, the four Biblical narratives and Stump's analyses of them are supposed to contribute to her alleged solution to the problem of evil. I have already encountered, both in the budding secondary literature on the book and in discussion with other readers, several conflicting attempts to solve this puzzle, only one of which has multiple proponents. That interpretation, however, which claims that through the narratives we can directly experience God's goodness, is utterly implausible both because there is no direct textual support for it and because it makes Stump's defense superfluous. I will include in this review my own attempt to solve this puzzle. This is risky, but unavoidable. As the book's subtitle strongly suggests, narrative is supposed to be an essential part of the book and thus its role demands serious attention rather than trite excuses about having "limited space."

First, however, I want to summarize Stump's defense. Then I will discuss her views on non-propositional knowledge of persons and the role of narrative in philosophy, which will set up my attempt to solve the interpretive puzzle just mentioned. Finally, I will make some critical remarks about the defense and challenge Stump's belief that a mere defense, if successful by her criteria, suffices to solve the evidential problem of suffering.

Summary of the defense

Stump's defense, like other defenses and all theodicies, inevitably makes a number of controversial axiological assumptions, including a commitment to a specific "scale of value." Because she believes that "the problem of suffering is an attack on the consistency of religious belief or the consistency of religious belief together with some uncontested empirical evidence" (p. 386), she also believes that it is inappropriate to challenge the scale of value employed by a defense if that scale is embraced by the religious system whose consistency is being challenged.

It is important to emphasize that Stump does not use this point as an excuse to employ implausible axiological assumptions that make the job of defense easier. On the contrary and to her credit, she places two extremely rigorous moral constraints on what can count as a morally sufficient reason for God to cause or allow suffering, making her already difficult task of constructing a successful defense much more difficult. First, she requires that the good for the sake of which God causes or allows some instance of suffering be a benefit for the sufferer. Let's call this the "beneficiary constraint." Second, in the case of suffering to which the victim does not in any respect consent (i.e., suffering that is involuntary simpliciter), she requires that the justifying benefit be, not some positive outweighing benefit, but instead the "negative benefit" of preventing a positive harm to the sufferer that is greater than the positive harm done by the suffering. Let's call this the "consent constraint."

According to St. Thomas's scale of value, the best thing for a human person is to have union (i.e., a personal relationship of love) with God and the worst thing is the absence of such union. Further, those two options are, ultimately, exhaustive: when one dies, one will either have permanent union with God (i.e., be in a state of "heaven") or be permanently separated from God (i.e., be in a state of "hell"). Thus, by merely warding off the worst thing for oneself, one is guaranteed the best thing. (A pessimist would no doubt spin this differently.) The best thing, however, itself comes in degrees. Not everyone in heaven will be equally close to God. Some human persons in heaven, by virtue of their own free choices, will be closer to God (and thus greater or more glorious) than other human persons in heaven, depending in part on how much they grow spiritually in this life and the next.

With this as background, we can now turn to the question of why God allows mentally fully functional adults to suffer in the world of Stump's defense. For simplicity's sake, I will focus on my own suffering. So why does God cause or allow me to suffer in the world of the defense? Stump's answer can be boiled down to the following four (increasingly large) explanatory steps. (1) God loves me and so desires to be united in love with me. (2) Such union is impossible even for God in my current psychically fragmented condition. To make union possible, I need to be internally integrated around the good and (3) to achieve such integration, I need to undergo a process of justification and sanctification. Unfortunately, (4) the best means available to God to promote that process is to cause or allow me to suffer. So ironically, God's love for me ultimately leads to God's desiring (in his consequent will) that I suffer. Stump has much to say about each of these steps. Here is a brief summary.

Concerning the first and smallest step, Stump appeals to Aquinas's scale of value and to his account of love in order to tighten the intuitive connection between God's love for me and God's desiring union with me. Love always includes two desires, one for the good of the beloved and one for union with the beloved. In the case of God's love for me, not only do these two desires not conflict, but the first implies the second. Since the best thing for me is to be eternally united to God in love and the worst thing (which is not just the worst but also very bad) is to lack union with God for all eternity, and since, ultimately, these are the only two options, it follows that tradeoffs are not an option for God when it comes to pursuing my good. God can pursue my good only by pursuing what is best for me. Thus, God simply could not have a desire for my good and so could not love me without also having an all things considered desire for union with me.

According to the second step in the explanation, if God desires union with me, then God will also desire that my will be integrated around the good. Stump takes the following rather ingenious path from the antecedent of this conditional to its consequent. Union -- a personal relationship of love -- requires significant personal presence and (thus) mutual closeness. But such closeness in its fullest sense is incompatible with psychic fragmentation. I can't be close to God (which involves revealing myself to God) if I am alienated from myself -- if, for example, some parts of me or my will are in conflict with or are hidden from other parts. What is needed for closeness with others is internal psychic integration -- my desires and volitions (including my desires and volitions about my desires and volitions) must all be in harmony. Furthermore, like all mentally fully functional adult humans, I grasp on some level the objective difference between right and wrong. Thus, since my intellect affects my will, I inevitably have a desire not to perform the actions that I know to be wrong. But this means that I can never be "whole-heartedly" evil. Since God would never eliminate my moral knowledge or sever the connection between my intellect and will, harmony among all of my desires and volitions is possible only if my will is integrated around the good. Thus, if God desires union with me, then God will also desire that my will be integrated around the good.

The third step in the explanation involves connecting the goal of internal integration around the good to the process of justification and sanctification. Here it is taken for granted that I am not already integrated around the good. Like all human beings (or at least all post-Fall human beings), I suffer from psychic fragmentation. I have strong dispositions to prefer pleasure and power over greater goods and thus to engage in morally wrong behavior, often rationalizing such behavior and repressing both the part of my intellect that recognizes that this behavior is wrong and the part of my will that desires not to do it. The process of justification and sanctification is God's solution to this problem; it is God's cure for my moral and psychological sickness. Of course, one might ask why God caused or allowed me to be internally fragmented in the first place. Stump offers no answer to this question. To offer an answer (e.g., by appealing to the doctrine of the Fall) would be, to Stump's mind, unnecessarily specific, since suffering from a lack of internal integration does not, in her opinion (which she defends at the beginning of Chapter 8), provide the resources for a successful argument from evil anyway. One might also ask why God doesn't just directly cause my will to be integrated around the good. Stump answers that God's goal is a union of two wills. If God just eliminated my psychic fragmentation by fiat, then only one will would be left, namely, God's.

Assuming this is right, there remains the question of how the process of justification and sanctification is supposed to solve the problem of my psychic fragmentation (while simultaneously respecting my free will). Stump answers as follows. To have internal integration around the good, I need first and foremost a second-order global desire for a will that wills the good. Given my current state of moral corruption, however, I am unable to form such a desire on my own. I need God to intervene. Further, God cannot unilaterally intervene without destroying my will and thus making union with me impossible. Fortunately, if I can just manage, in a moment of surrender, to cease refusing God's grace, cease cleaving to my past wrongdoing, the result will be a state of quiescence in my will. Once I am, of my own free will, in this state and even though I still lack any positive acceptance of God's grace, God will infuse grace in my will, which is to say that God will cause me to have a global second-order desire for a will that wills the good. So long as I never lose this desire, I am guaranteed union with God in the afterlife. Of course, there is still work to be done, because I still have bad desires and so am still alienated from myself. The process of gradually, with God's help, harmonizing my global desire for a will that wills the good with other desires is the process of sanctification (or to be more precise, the second part of the single process of justification and sanctification). It includes (but is not limited to) both eliminating fragmentation by gradually eliminating first-order desires to engage in moral wrong-doing and adding new first-order desires for various goods that I come to care about as I grow morally and spiritually. In this way, I grow closer and closer to God, increasing my greatness, limited only by my own free choices. This process will continue in the afterlife, and it may never cease completely.

The final step in Stump's explanation is the most difficult to defend. Let's grant that, motivated by love, God wants union with me and so wants me to be internally integrated around the good. Let's even grant that the best or only route to my achieving such integration is for me to undergo a process of justification and sanctification. Still, why on earth (but apparently not in heaven) does that process have to involve so much suffering? Stump answers that, in spite of God's omnipotence and omniscience, my suffering, whenever it occurs, is the best means available to God to promote the process of my justification and sanctification. This is not to say that it always or inevitably leads to justification or to increased sanctification. Libertarian free will is involved here; so there are no guarantees; but God uses suffering to give me the power to allow God to be close or closer to me. Then it is up to me whether or not to freely exercise that power.

Later I will explain why I have doubts about the cogency of this answer. Right now, I will complete my summary of the defense by addressing the question of whether it satisfies the two moral constraints mentioned above. The beneficiary constraint is obviously satisfied since in the world of the defense I am the primary beneficiary of my suffering. The "consent constraint" is a bit dicier. Suppose, on the one hand, that I am either at risk for losing justification or, more likely, not yet justified. Then the consent constraint is satisfied because, although my suffering is involuntary simpliciter, God causes or allows it for the sake of warding off an even greater harm, indeed the worst possible harm that can come to me, namely, eternal separation from God. Suppose, on the other hand, that I am not only justified but far enough along in the process of sanctification that losing my faith is no longer a real possibility. Then I still suffer; indeed, Stump suggests paradoxically that my spiritual strength is reason to expect greater suffering (generating the new problem of why good things happen to good people!). In this case, though, my suffering is obviously not for the sake of warding off a greater harm. Rather, the God-justifying benefit that I receive is a positive one: a closer relationship with God. According to Stump, however, this does not violate the consent constraint because my suffering in this case is not involuntary simpliciter; it is only involuntary secundum quid -- involuntary in some respect. Like the soldier who does not want to suffer and who hopes to avoid it but has tacitly agreed to suffer or to risk suffering for the sake of some perceived good like winning a war, Christians have tacitly agreed to suffer for the sake of the positive benefit of spiritual growth, even though they still prefer to grow closer to God without such suffering if at all possible.

Whether or not this attempt to reconcile the defense with the second moral constraint succeeds depends in part on what Stump would say about so-called anonymous Christians and any other Christians who are justified by the same act of surrender to God's grace, the same act of faith that justifies other Christians, but who don't have all of the "beliefs of faith" that most Christians have, and for that reason lack any understanding that their faith requires them to undergo suffering for the sake of spiritual growth. Perhaps Stump would say that when these Christians suffer in the world of the defense, it is always for the sake of preventing them from losing the faith that justifies them.

The two hemispheres of the defense

To appreciate the role narrative plays in the book, one must understand Stump's views about the philosophical significance of what she calls "Franciscan knowledge of persons." Franciscan knowledge is a kind of knowledge that is not propositional and that is not reducible to propositional knowledge or even to propositional knowledge combined with some sort of causal interaction with the thing known. It includes but is not limited to acquaintance knowledge as typically understood. Stump is critical of analytic epistemologists for ignoring or denying the variety, extent, importance, or sometimes even the existence of Franciscan knowledge. She also believes that analytic philosophy is impoverished because it almost completely ignores one particular sort of Franciscan knowledge, the Franciscan knowledge of persons, which is typically obtained when we are directly aware of the mental states of other persons in a "second-person experience." Such knowledge is crucial for properly addressing philosophical issues like the problem of suffering, which at their heart concern persons and personal relations. Part of the problem is that, while analytic philosophers typically have an abundance of "left-brain" pattern processing skills, they are often significantly less well-endowed when it comes to "right-brain" interpersonal skills. While this creates no (philosophical) problems for logicians and philosophers of math, it can cause the work of analytic philosophers who specialize in areas like ethics, political philosophy, and philosophy of religion (not to mention epistemology) to be, at its worst, "plodding, pedestrian, sterile, and inadequate to its task" (p. 24).

Stump, an analytic philosopher herself, does not deny that analytic philosophy displays important virtues like clarity, precision, and logical rigor. Thus, she proposes to preserve its excellences while addressing its flaws by wedding it to the philosophical examination of literary texts. Philosophy, especially analytic philosophy, is better, she thinks, with the help of stories, and the primary reason for this is that Franciscan knowledge of persons can be obtained, not just through second-person experience, but also through narrative, and in particular through the reading and interpretation of accounts, whether fictional or not, of the second-person experiences of others. This book can be thought of as an attempt to demonstrate by example that the marriage of analytic philosophy to narrative is a happy one.

This raises the obvious question of how Stump's analyses of the four Biblical narratives are supposed to contribute to her alleged solution to the problem of evil. Stump makes only a few vague remarks about this (pp. 61, 373-374, and 453). I suppose silence on details is not surprising since, if the role of the narratives is to give us relevant Franciscan knowledge, then this knowledge is non-propositional and so Stump cannot just tell us what it is. Still, Franciscan knowledge can provide support for the truth of propositions and presumably those propositions could be identified. Stump, however, explicitly denies that the main role of the narratives is to provide support for some premise of a philosophical argument. Even so, she emphasizes that her intent is to base her defense on the narratives "in the loose sort of way in which very many of our views ultimately rest on our experiences" (p. 374). She suggests further that the sort of experience we obtain from the narratives is the experience of "being immersed in a worldview" (p. 374). To use one of Stump's analogies, if you really want to know what China is like, you can't just learn a bunch of facts about China. You need to travel there and experience the country first hand, or at least read a really good account of another traveler's experiences.

Of course, none of this answers our question. The interpretive puzzle remains in the form of a new question. How does immersion in the worldview of the defense by means of the narratives contribute to showing that Stump's defense is successful? In the last chapter of the book, she states only two criteria for evaluating a defense: internal consistency and consistency with uncontested empirical data (henceforth "external consistency"). She hints (p. 453) that there might be a third criterion of palatability to which the narratives are relevant, but it is clear that she thinks this is merely a sideshow and not the main attraction. Are we to suppose, then, that the Franciscan knowledge we obtain from the narratives helps to show that the world of the defense is internally or externally consistent? Perhaps, but the emphasis on being immersed in a worldview suggests otherwise. Moreover, reading Stump's brilliant exegeses of the narratives did have an impact on me. They made the defense feel somewhat less alien to me. I could almost imagine myself in a relationship with a God who makes use of my suffering for the purposes suggested by Stump's defense.

All of this suggests the following approach to the central interpretive puzzle of the book. Stump is acutely aware of just how alien (or medieval) the world of the defense will seem to her readers, given contemporary secular and even religious sensibilities. She recognizes that her views are at risk of being dismissed out of hand. To prevent that from happening, she must make an appeal to both hemispheres of our brains, not just to the left hemisphere. Thus, the defense itself must have two hemispheres, a left one consisting of a description of St. Thomas's worldview and theodicy, and a right one consisting of the Biblical narratives. In addition, both hemispheres of the defense need defense. In the case of the left hemisphere, what is needed is philosophical argument designed to demonstrate internal and external consistency. In the case of the right hemisphere of the defense, what is needed is philosophically motivated literary analysis designed to make the defense come alive in a psychologically or interpersonally realistic way in the Biblical narratives. In addition, a successful defense must be constrained, not just by our propositional knowledge, but also by our Franciscan knowledge of persons and interpersonal relationships. Unless the stories can show the "Franciscan possibility" of a world in which God and human beings grow closer through suffering, all the philosophical argument in the world is unlikely to make Stump's audience take the defense seriously.

Evaluation of the defense

Having exhausted what limited right-brain skills I have in the previous section, I will devote this section to raising some objections to the left hemisphere of Stump's defense. There are two central issues here. First, is her defense epistemically possible? Stump, as we have seen, equates this question with the question of whether the defense is internally consistent and consistent with uncontested empirical evidence. Second, if the world of the defense is epistemically possible and so successful by Stump's criteria, does it follow as she thinks it does that her defense solves the evidential problem of evil?

Concerning the first issue, there is reason to doubt that the defense is internally consistent. The problem is that the connection between suffering and the process of justification and sanctification seems to be a merely causal one. Of course, it is not Stump's view that suffering is causally sufficient for justification or increased sanctification. That process depends, not just on the suffering, but also on the sufferer making the right free choices in response to the suffering. The contribution of the suffering, however, is causal. It is supposed to cause the sufferer to have the power to allow God to be close or closer. There's no reason, however, why an omnipotent being would need to use suffering as a causal means of giving us that power. Such a being could simply directly cause us to have it or set up the world in such a way that something more benign than suffering works just as well as suffering in producing the crucial power.

Of course, a Molinist could come to Stump's aid here, claiming that God, being omniscient, might know that, if anything besides suffering caused us to have the power to be close or closer to God, then we would never or less frequently freely exercise that power. There are, however, two problems with this attempt to defend Stump. First, it would fail to explain why some people suffer and yet never respond to that suffering in the right way, ultimately dying without the justification they need to save them from hell. If God knew that my suffering would ultimately do me no good, then why still allow me to suffer? Indeed, why create me in the first place? Second, Stump rejects Molinism (and in my opinion rightly so). If Molinism is false, however, then God can't have providentially useful knowledge about what free choices human beings will make in various circumstances. Of course, God might still know that suffering is more likely than other means to have the desired effect; but its being more likely would depend on contingent facts about the world and human psychology -- facts that, in the world of the defense, obtain only if an omnipotent God wants them to.

Suppose, however, that the above argument is unsound and that the world of the defense is metaphysically possible. Is it also epistemically possible? Given what we know or given uncontested empirical evidence, could the defense actually be true? There are numerous reasons to believe that the defense is false. I will mention just a few, but first I want to mention two important points that Stump makes in her efforts to show that the world of the defense is an epistemically possible one. First, she claims that the benefits of suffering are often opaque to the sufferer. People can and often do either grow in some way as a result of suffering or at least have the opportunity for such growth without knowing that this is the case. Second, she claims that studies by psychologists have shown that the phenomenon of "post traumatic growth" is real. Granting all this, at least five difficulties remain.

First, in the case of some sorts of suffering and/or some sorts of people, suffering predictably diminishes the sufferer, leading to worse psychological health and a decreased capacity for personal relationships. Now Stump recognizes that suffering does not always lead to growth. But she claims that this is compatible with her defense because of the role of free will -- suffering only provides the opportunity for growth. Not everyone takes advantage of that opportunity. The problem here, though, is not just that suffering does not always lead to growth. The problem is that quite often it leads to shrinkage and further, this is predictable (even by mere humans) in some cases.

Second, in the case of major natural disasters, suffering appears to be widespread and indiscriminate instead of targeted to specific persons based on their individual psychological characteristics. If Stump's defense were true, then the correct conclusion to draw from cases like this would be that such suffering is good for people regardless of their individual differences. But if that is so, then one would expect everyone to suffer in this way and so the great disparity between people with respect to how much they suffer would be utterly inexplicable.

A third difficulty is that much suffering is relatively trivial and so appears to have no significant psychological impact on the sufferer. I bump my shin on the edge of my coffee table. This robs me of this-worldly flourishing for a short time, and then I go about my business and forget the incident ever happened. The psychological literature may support post traumatic growth, but it is, not surprisingly, silent on growth resulting from non-traumatic suffering. Of course, repeatedly experiencing minor suffering might have a positive cumulative effect for some sufferers, but for all of them? Including sufferers who are far along in the process of sanctification? This seems extremely unlikely.

A fourth difficulty arises because animals and humans often suffer for predictably similar (natural) reasons, at predictably similar times and places, in predictably similar ways, and with predictably similar consequences. (Consider, for example, the effect of some famines on vulnerable human and animal populations in the affected area.) Animals, however, are incapable of undergoing a process of justification and sanctification. Thus, God would have to have a completely different reason or reasons for allowing them to suffer. Stump says that, even if her defense cannot account for animal suffering, this is not a problem because there is no reason to believe that God would have only one reason for allowing all suffering. That is no doubt true, but there is good reason to expect that two dissimilar God-justifying reasons will rarely if ever result in two very similar complex patterns of suffering. Yet what we actually observe is that predictably similar patterns of human and animal suffering are commonplace.

Finally, like so many theodicies and defenses, Stump's defense explains some facts about suffering only by mystifying others. Here are three examples. First, there is the fact that we suffer from psychic fragmentation in the first place. The greater the amount of suffering, especially horrific suffering, that is, according to Stump's defense, needed to give humans the power to overcome this condition, the less likely it is that God would allow it in the first place. Second, even allowing for the need to begin with psychic fragmentation, our world hardly seems designed to promote moral and spiritual growth. For example, ignorance of various moral and spiritual truths makes spiritual stagnation for many virtually inevitable. Third, there is the undeniable fact that not only the good (or the saved) die young. If Stump's defense were true and if God lacked middle knowledge, then we would expect with great confidence that the lives of people who lack God's justifying grace would never be cut short. Indeed, we would expect that many human beings would live much longer than they do, perhaps for centuries -- whatever it takes. We might even expect that the lives of many Christians would be shortened in order to prevent them from losing their faith -- why risk eternal hell, the worst thing that can happen to a person, for the sake of a few more years on earth? At one point, Stump suggests that her defense does not need a traditional doctrine of hell. All it needs is an extrinsic lower bound to the scale of human flourishing (p. 377). Of course, it also needs the threat that human beings will end up floundering at the bottom, but maybe death doesn't need to be the absolute cut off point after which our fates are sealed. Stump is reticent to depart in the least from the Catholic tradition, but it's hard to see how, short of becoming (God forbid) a Molinist, Stump can avoid such a departure and still solve these problems about life span, which threaten to devastate her defense.

Suppose Stump were to respond that, while these five "difficulties" or some subset of them show that her defense is very unlikely to be true, they don't prove that it is false and so her claim that the defense is epistemically possible stands. Suppose also, for the sake of argument, that her standards of knowledge are sufficiently high (and so her standards of epistemic possibility sufficiently low) to justify this response. Surely what follows is not that her defense solves the evidential problem of suffering, but rather that a defense can be successful by Stump's criteria and yet fail to solve the evidential problem of suffering. Stump would disagree with this, but only because she has a very narrow conception of what counts as an evidential argument from evil. She says at least three times in the book that the problem of evil is a problem of alleged inconsistency between theism and what we know. At first, I was tempted to think that she intended her book to be addressing only the logical problem of suffering. But that's a mistake. She takes logical arguments from suffering to be attempts to show that theism is inconsistent with what we know (or with what theists believe) about suffering. She takes evidential arguments from suffering to be attempts to show that theism, together with uncontested empirical evidence, is inconsistent with what we know about suffering. This is why she believes that a successful (i.e., epistemically possible) defense suffices to solve the evidential problem of suffering. Reinforcing this belief, no doubt, is the fact that a successful defense (if it included an explanation of the suffering of animals and children) would undermine William Rowe's famous evidential arguments from evil, since the central premise of those arguments depends for its justification on our being unable even to conceive of a good that would justify God's allowing certain sorts of suffering.

Stump overlooks the fact that evidential arguments from suffering vary widely. Contrary to what she says or implies several times in the book, not all such arguments include the premise that there is no morally sufficient reason for an omniscient, omnipotent, perfectly good God to allow suffering in the world. Further, arguments from suffering need not attempt to establish that what we know about suffering is inconsistent with theism or with theism conjoined with uncontested empirical evidence. There are many negative evidential relations besides inconsistency. Indeed, when we say that some fact is evidence against some theory or claim, typically we don't mean to be asserting that the fact (either by itself or when conjoined with other things we know) is inconsistent with that theory or claim. For example, the known facts leading to the Casey Anthony trial are strong evidence that she killed her child, but they are certainly not inconsistent with the claim that she did not. Incorporating those facts into an internally and externally consistent but very improbable story according to which her child accidentally drowned in her parents’ swimming pool obviously does not suffice to show that her defenders face no (unsolved) evidential problem. Similarly, even if Stump's defense is epistemically possible and hence successful by her criteria, we have very good reasons to believe that it is false. Thus, even if it is internally and externally consistent, it fails to solve what in my opinion are the most challenging evidential problems of suffering.

Stump might respond that theism is not a "theory" or "claim" that can be tested by evidence in the way that a scientific theory or a claim about innocence or guilt can be tested. Instead, when it is embedded in a religion like Christianity, it is best understood as a narrative, indeed a grand narrative about human persons and ultimate reality and the world to come. She might add that, so long as such a narrative is internally and externally consistent, its credibility does not depend, like a scientific theory's, on the degree to which it is confirmed or disconfirmed by evidence. How, then, should we decide whether or not to believe it? One possible suggestion is this. As Stump says about the world of her defense, but would no doubt want to say about Christianity as well: "the larger story is lovely … and beauty is also a road to truth" (p. 22).


While I am not persuaded by some of the book's main arguments, I nevertheless believe that Wandering in Darkness is a must-read for philosophers of religion and a very beneficial read for other philosophers and for other scholars of religion. It is without question a highly nuanced and philosophically deep book. I have benefited both personally and philosophically from reflecting on what Stump says in the book about love, and Stump's insights on Franciscan knowledge of persons have led me to a deeper appreciation of the prospects for a religiously rich form of "skeptical faith," one that allows, paradoxically, for knowing God even if one lacks the knowledge or even the belief that God exists. More generally, the potential for applying some of the central ideas in the book to other problems in philosophy is enormous. If, however, one is searching for a solution to the evidential problems of evil that most interest me, then I can't say that one will find it here. When it comes to that search, I suspect that beauty is an unreliable guide and that in reality we are all just wandering in darkness.[1]

[1] For helpful discussion of some of the arguments in this review, I am grateful to Eleonore Stump and to the participants in the 2011 St. Thomas Summer Seminar in Philosophy of Religion and Philosophical Theology. I am also grateful to Michael Rota and Dean Zimmerman for organizing this seminar (and for inviting Stump and me to speak at it) and to the John Templeton Foundation for funding it. In addition, I would like to thank William Abraham, Erik Baldwin, and Chad Meister for participating in a reading group on Wandering in Darkness at Notre Dame's Center for Philosophy of Religion last spring. Finally, thanks to David Anderson, John Houston, and especially Josh Watson for helpful feedback on some of my objections to Stump's defense.