2011.07.32

Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel

Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Basic Outline, Part I: Science of Logic

Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Basic Outline, Part I: Science of Logic, Klaus Brinkmann and Daniel O. Dahlstrom (eds., trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2010, 358pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521829144.

Reviewed by Christopher Yeomans, Purdue University


This new translation of what is commonly known as the Encyclopedia Logic is the third volume in the series of Cambridge Hegel Translations under the general editorship of Michael Bauer. It is a readable, accurate and sometimes surprisingly elegant translation with a minimum of editorial apparatus that presents the work as the "basic outline" that it is.

As the full title suggests, the Encyclopedia Logic is the first part of Hegel's systematic but condensed presentation of his mature philosophy, which is followed by two additional parts covering the philosophies of nature and spirit (Geist). Mostly the Encyclopedia Logic covers the same ground as his earlier (and much larger) Science of Logic, though in a much more schematic form and sometimes in a slightly different order. But it also includes an extensive section -- almost 90 pages in this edition -- entitled the "Preliminary Conception", in which Hegel provides a historical introduction to his philosophy beginning with ancient Greek philosophy and continuing on through empiricism and Kant. This is the best introduction to his thought that Hegel himself wrote, both because of its relative brevity and the clarity of the historical references as compared to his official introduction, the 1807 Phenomenology of Spirit. It also includes the best short discussion of Hegel's understanding of the dialectical nature of reason (§§80-2). The Encyclopedia is very much an outline, with condensed presentations of the crucial steps that were intended to provide a framework for Hegel's students on which they could weave the examples, allusions, and arguments of his lectures. As compared to the Science of Logic, the Encyclopedia Logic often appears to present what animators call the extremes without the in-between frames that show how they are connected. This volume includes selections from the notes of Hegel's students (the Additions or Zusätze) that provide very helpful examples and connections to other elements of Hegel's system. The Encyclopedia went through three different versions under Hegel's own revisions, and this translation is from the last edition of 1830.

The present volume may very naturally be compared with two other (relatively) recent translations, the translation of the Encyclopedia Logic by Geraets, Suchting and Harris (hereinafter "GSH")[1], and George di Giovanni's translation of the Science of Logic that precedes the present volume in the Cambridge series.[2] As compared to both, the Brinkmann and Dahlstrom translation has a much slimmer editorial apparatus. Both GSH and di Giovanni provide detailed and extensively argued commentaries on the proper translations for Hegelian terms, while there are only four pages in Brinkmann and Dahlstrom that briefly describe some of the translation choices. There are approximately 40 pages of explanatory notes in GSH, as opposed to only a few footnotes in the present volume. Di Giovanni includes a very extensive introduction (approximately 50 pages), whereas Brinkmann and Dahlstrom's introduction clocks in at eight pages. That said, there are many things to like about its editorial apparatus. The index is very extensive (almost 40 pages) and useful. The introduction is a model of brevity, with a concise presentation of the historical development of the text followed by a brief introduction of its context in the broader system and some of the issues that arise from that context. Given the different primary audiences of the Encyclopedia (students) and Science of Logic (scholars), the more limited editorial apparatus of the former strikes me as entirely appropriate. And given that Hegel provides his own historical introduction to the work in the first 83 sections, an extensive interpretive introduction is perhaps unnecessary.

As far as the translation itself is concerned, Brinkmann and Dahlstrom's text is slightly more flowing English than GSH. There are more familiar sentence structures, even when this involves adding words (particularly nouns) that are not present in the German original, though these are clearly marked by the translators by square brackets. This leads to some nice renderings, e.g., "a process of knowing by way of thinking" for "denkendes Erkennen" (§86 Addition) even if sometimes it struck me that a more literal rendering would make Hegel's point better, e.g., "nächsten Hausbedarf des Erkennens" as "everyday need of knowing" rather than "immediate housekeeping needs of cognition" (GSH) (§121 Addition).

Similarly, Brinkmann and Dahlstrom seem to be more willing to translate the same German word by different English words as dictated by context. Generally their sensitivity to context is quite good without lapsing into outright interpretation, but sometimes they are led to formulations that obscure Hegel's point or its connection to other arguments. For example, in the space of a few short pages "die bloße Meinung" is translated as "mere opinion," and "something merely meant," and "nur ein gemeinter" as "only intended" (§87 Remark, §88 Remark, and §87 Addition, respectively). Though it must be said in Brinkmann and Dahlstrom's defense that the German phrase is provided in brackets for the first two, the diversity of translations here is both puzzling in its own right and obscures the connection between the argument Hegel is making here and that of the Sense-Certainty chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit (cf. ¶110 of that work). But the danger of such inconsistency should not be overstated: a translation is a first introduction, and just as Hegel's Additions are pedagogically enormously helpful at the cost of sometimes suggesting concepts that go far beyond the specific point at issue, one should not discount the value of evocative English renderings for a first exposure to Hegel's most abstract thought.

Though a complete review of Brinkmann and Dahlstrom's translation choices is clearly beyond the bounds of a short review, I will comment here on three different issues.

(1) Following a long tradition in English and di Giovanni's practice in translating the Science of Logic, Brinkmann and Dahlstrom translate Aufheben as 'sublation.' Since almost everyone agrees that this is an unhappy choice -- a translation of an ordinary German word with an English word resuscitated only for the purpose of standing in for Aufheben -- it may seem a bit unfair to complain about this. And yet I cannot resist because Brinkmann and Dahlstrom identify what, to my mind, is the most promising English equivalent: "The alternative 'supersede' would have had the advantage of conveying much of [aufheben's] central significance as a process of cancellation, preservation, and elevation at once" (xvii). They reject this on the basis of consistency within the Cambridge series, and on the grounds that sublation is, like aufheben, a technical term of art. But aufheben is not so technical as all that; Hegel explicitly remarks that its multiple significance is to be found in ordinary German as well (§96 Addition). As a teacher concerned to put Hegel's thought across to students, I think that di Giovanni, Brinkmann and Dahlstrom have done Hegel's thought a modern service by following GSH in translating Begriff as 'concept' rather than Miller's esoteric 'the Notion,' and I would like to see 'sublate' go the way of 'the Notion' as an unnecessarily foreign presentation of an unsettlingly ordinary idea.

(2) In rendering Hegel's mathematical terms, Brinkmann and Dahlstrom depart from GSH in translating Anzahl as 'amount' rather than 'annumeration,' Einheit as 'unity [of a mathematical unit]' rather than 'unit,' and Verhältnis as 'proportion' rather than 'ratio.' In the first case, they seem to follow di Giovanni (though he has "amount or the how many times" at places for Anzahl), but in the latter two they depart from di Giovanni. All three of these choices strike me as suboptimal. Anzahl for Hegel contrasts with Einheit as one of the two aspects of number, and he uses different relations between the two to explain different kinds of calculation (§102). In multiplication, for example, a unit (Einheit) is scaled by a multiplier or annumerator (Anzahl). But though the two factors are in principle interchangeable, Hegel holds that they point to slightly different aspects of the concept of number: Einheit to its continuity and Anzahl to its discreteness. Though 'unity' perhaps speaks to the continuity of Einheit, it obscures its role in calculation and thus in articulating the relations between numbers (where Brinkmann and Dahlstrom add "i.e. a mathematical unit" in square brackets to clarify). But 'amount' strikes me as tracking neither function of Anzahl, i.e., its role in calculation and the discreteness of number. Now, I may be accused of inconsistency here since in my previous comment I made a plea for ordinary English, but here I want to replace 'amount' with the perhaps archaic 'annumeration' or 'annumerator.' I think the technical context of mathematics shifts the balance here to 'annumerator,' but perhaps di Giovanni's 'amount or the how many times' is a proper middle ground for Anzahl. In any event, in the mathematical context, Einheit seems best rendered as 'unit.' Similarly, though Verhältnis can sometimes be rendered by 'proportion,' its placement in the context of a discussion of basic mathematic operations, its quantification by an exponent, and its placement before the discussion of measure that internalizes a qualitative standard of measurement all suggest that 'ratio' is a better translation.

(3) Brinkmann and Dahlstrom translate Schein and scheinen sometimes as 'shine,' other times as 'semblance' and 'seem.' In this they largely follow GSH and di Giovanni. On the one hand, I applaud the replacement of A.V. Miller's rendering of Schein as 'illusory being'[3] for just the reasons di Giovanni gives.[4] And I quite agree that scheinen has the physical analogy of light as an important element, as does the larger concept of reflection. But I must disagree with Brinkmann and Dahlstrom's claim that Hegel uses scheinen in a non-technical way to mean 'seem' but also in a technical way that invokes both "'shining' and '(projecting or presenting a) semblance'" (xix). As far as I can tell, Hegel always uses the term in a technical way that includes the non-technical meaning as the second element of the technical: a semblance is a projecting of itself in the way that light shines out from its source. This seems precisely Hegel's point in the Addition to §112, where Brinkmann and Dahlstrom appear to see the non-technical usage and thus translate bloßen Schein as 'mere semblance.' This may seem a small point, but it is similar to the issue with the translation of Aufheben. 'Shining' has no history or specific meaning in philosophical English, and so, like 'sublate,' it operates as an unfortunate neologism that I worry does more to repel Hegel from new readers as foreign than to provide insight into his thought. Furthermore, one of the crucial arguments of the Doctrine of Essence involves the connection between Schein and Erscheinung, i.e., between semblance and appearance. Rendering the former term as 'shine' obscures this important connection, even though 'semblance' and 'appearance' do not have the etymological tie that Schein and Erscheinung do. Admittedly, this means we will have to have Hegel say in English odd things like, "Because each is for itself insofar as it is not the other, each seems (or projects its semblance) in the other and is only insofar as the other is" (§119, translation modified). But if this is slightly more awkward grammatically, it strikes me as less awkward philosophically.

In the larger scheme of things these complaints are largely quibbles. I do not pretend that my suggestions for Aufheben or Schein do not come with their own disadvantages, only that the balance of advantages and disadvantages lies in a different place than Brinkmann and Dahlstrom think it does. This translation is certainly worthy of being used on its own for courses, and for scholars it will be a useful complement to GSH. Only time will tell if the sheer gravity of the combined Cambridge Hegel Translations will make this the standard translation in the secondary literature, but after the success of the Cambridge Kant series, I would not want to bet against it.


[1] The Encyclopaedia Logic: Part I of the Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences with the Zusätze, T.F. Geraets, W.A. Suchting, and H.S. Harris (trs.), Hackett Publishing, 1991.

[2] Cambridge, 2010.

[3] Hegel's Science of Logic, Humanities Press, 1969.

[4] Op. cit., lxxii.