2005.05.04

Morton White

From a Philosophical Point of View: Selected Studies

Morton White, From a Philosophical Point of View: Selected Studies, Princeton University Press, 2004, 352pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0691119597.

Reviewed by Bruce Kuklick, University of Pennsylvania


Morton White has had a very distinguished career, mainly as a philosophical historian of ideas, at both Harvard and the Princeton Institute of Advanced Study. The Origins of Dewey's Instrumentalism, his dissertation published in 1943, was for sometime unrecognized as the key exposition it is of John Dewey's early ideas and their connection to instrumentalism. Social Thought in America (1948), a minor classic, remains an illuminating treatment of the writing of the "anti-formalist" intellectuals, Dewey, Oliver Wendell Holmes, Charles Beard, James Harvey Robinson, and Thorstein Veblen. White's edited Age of Analysis (1955), an anthology of Anglo-American philosophy; and The Intellectual versus the City (1962), co-authored with Lucia White, were for a long time required undergraduate reading in American history and philosophy courses.

White was also not without independent philosophical ambition. For a brief time he was identified with W.V.O. Quine and Nelson Goodman as a proponent of pragmatic analysis. He wrote the notable "The Analytic and the Synthetic: An Untenable Dualism" (1950), and much more formidably Toward Reunion in Philosophy (1956). This striking and still overlooked book was an early expression of the view that analytic philosophy could reach a navel-gazing dead end. White examined the split between Anglo-American and Continental philosophy and proposed that pragmatic analysis could provide a middle and fruitful path for American speculation to take. He saw, correctly I think, that Quine's early epistemological holism could be used to re-vivify ancillary branches of philosophy such as political theory and the philosophy of history; and could fortify certain normative studies of ethics, public policy, and even the social study of science. Although White very much imbibed the pragmatic style of Cambridge, Massachusetts, in the 1950s and 1960s, his roots were in Dewey's more socially engaged thinking and the more generous urban ambience of New York City. It was in some ways a real disaster that Harvard pragmatism did not take the turn White had planned for it.

From a Philosophical Point of View gathers together many occasional studies that White has written over the years and devotes some space to all of these distinctive concerns of the author. White intimates that they span his whole career from the late forties to the present, but over half were written in the period from 1948 to 1963, and several more are reprises of themes from this period, for example, a rejoinder (of 1996) to a reply by Dewey to one of White's early essays. Overall, the book has the flavor of how the philosophical world looked to a shrewd practitioner some fifty years ago. But the contents are not arranged to be helpful to the historian or the engaged philosopher. White has divided the essays into seven groupings, but they are all more or less arbitrary. For example, one is called: Analyticity, Morality, Causality, and Liberty. Even within his groupings, little attempt has been made to organize the essays in ways that might be coherent. For example, one of his sensible and sound categories is called History, and includes a selection of White's essays about the philosophy of history. He has written extensively about this subject, and has much to say that is cogent. His views have also developed over the years. Yet the four essays he has selected here are reprinted in a seemingly arbitrary order so that the plain evolution of this thought is obscured.

Moreover, White has spent little time in editing the collection with any care. He has revised some of the essays, but not all, and often leaves the reader a little insecure about an essay's provenance. For example, he reprints the "Introduction" to a revision of Social Thought in America, prominently dated as 1975. Then, in the body of the essay, we immediately read that Bertrand Russell's Philosophy of Leibniz of 1900 is a century old. If we look at the back of the book, where additional information is given about the essays, we learn that the "Introduction" has been "revised somewhat" -- obviously after 2000.

Finally, what is printed is of greatly varying significance, as if White himself has no sense that some of his efforts are more important than others. Everything has gone into the kitchen sink. There are a number of brief, conventional, throwaway book reviews, more or less puffery, that definitely are not worth reading --on some of Dewey's writings on the philosophy of education; on James Perkins's University in Transition (1966); on Hart and HonorĊ½'s Causation in the Law (1959); and on a collection of Santayana's letters. There are also several popular, almost casual essays, written up from lectures delivered in certain public venues, that don't bear reprinting.

Some of this material is historically significant or is still interesting in itself. In his connection to Goodman and Quine, White was also essential to the link that grew up between Oxford and Harvard in the middle of the century. Much more an ambassador than the first two, he first visited Oxford in the early 1950s, and established connections -- with G.E. Moore, Isaiah Berlin, and H. L. A. Hart -- that brought Oxford philosophers back to Cambridge, Massachusetts. There are several indications of this link in the volume, including a charming "Impressions" of English philosophy at mid-century. Several of the essays now stand out as failed attempts to attract some of the English and American philosophers of the period to employ analytic techniques to wider issues of culture. Ironically, White's desire to embolden Anglo-American thought by joining Harvard and Oxford may have led to what some would call the reinforcement of the stultification of each.

White's views on the study of the history of ideas are still well worth imbibing today. This field is again and again subject to the attempts of bewildered historians to come to grips with intellectual constructs they don't really know much about, and the work of philosophers who cannot figure out that a predecessor is not writing at the same time as the authors. White is more concerned with the failings of the historians, although Social Thought in America established both his credit and sensibilities as an historian. Several essays in this collection, including "Why Annalists of Ideas Should be Analysts of Ideas," make a clear and fair-minded plea for the appropriate strategy to use in doing the history of thought. White is here at his best, synthesizing philosophical argumentation and knowledge of what goes on in historical study. One hopes that this volume at least will introduce a new readership to his methodological claims.