2005.06.02

John Gibson (ed.), Wolfgang Huemer (ed.)

The Literary Wittgenstein

John Gibson and Wolfgang Huemer (eds.), The Literary Wittgenstein, Routledge, 2004, 368pp, $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415289734.

Reviewed by John Holbo, National University of Singapore


The Literary Wittgenstein is an anthology of twenty pieces by eighteen authors. Although the title may suggest otherwise, the approach taken is predominantly — though not exclusively — academic philosophical. All contributors are academics, no novelists or poets. Only three contributors are literature professors.

Wolfgang Huemer’s introduction promises “Wittgensteinian accounts of literature;” the use of “Wittgenstein’s philosophical results to solve problems pertinent to the theory of literature;’” and reflections on literature that “illuminate our understanding of Wittgenstein’s philosophy” (p. 3). In fact, I am inclined to say the two strongest pieces do none of the above. They are: Timothy Gould, "Restlessness and the Achievement of Peace, Writing and Method in Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations"; and Richard Eldridge, "Rotating the axis of our investigation: Wittgenstein’s Investigations and Hölderlin’s poetology".

Gould articulates what I take to be the soundest conception of a subject suited to the volume’s title. “It points toward Wittgenstein’s various affiliations with other forms of writing and culture, particularly the forms that surround and infiltrate his literary education and sensibility … And the title also points toward the literary side of Wittgenstein’s own writing, an aspect of his work that is almost inevitably referred to as its ‘style’.” There is patently a connection; yet “despite various writings on the cultural context of his work, not much has been said that would help us connect the culture that Wittgenstein possessed — and was possessed by — and the forms in which he wrote. What we do know — for instance, that he was for the most part alienated from the accomplishments of the last half of the nineteenth century — has so far tended to darken, rather than clarify, the philosophical significance of the literary affiliations of his work” (p. 76-7).

This seems to me correct. I think it is hardly an exaggeration to say there is a hole at the heart of Wittgenstein scholarship, and not just scholarship. Aesthetic (literary, poetic, artistic) receptions and appreciations of Wittgenstein — these come in an astonishing variety of shapes, sounds, sizes and colors — have tended to be aesthetically marred by philosophical weakness. Philosophical approaches have tended to go astray through insufficient attention to genuine aesthetic puzzles posed by Wittgenstein’s style and methods of composition.

These are tendentious claims. For good measure here are more: the reason it is crucial to bridge the literary-philosophical gap is that if we could understand why Wittgenstein hybridizes art and analytic philosophy as he does, we would understand him; and the riddle of Wittgenstein’s philosophy is inextricable from his singular personality. A Nietzschean thought: “Gradually it has become clear to me what every great philosophy so far has been — namely, the personal confession of its author and a kind of involuntary and unconscious memoir.”1

Many philosophers will scoff. ‘The personal is merely personal’ is how Gould thumbnails this doubt. Cora Diamond’s contribution to the volume quotes P.F. Strawson: only a “very specialized view of the nature of philosophical understanding” would see any difficulty in recasting the arguments of Philosophical Investigation in quite conventional forms (quoted, p. 130). Arguments are what matter. If they are good, it is in their nature not to stay tied to apron-strings of autobiography. This view may be correct, but it is not Wittgenstein’s. In his contribution to the volume, Stanley Cavell quotes Culture and Value:

Le style c’est l’homme," "Le style c’est l’homme meme." The first expression has cheap epigrammatic brevity. The second, correct version opens up quite a different perspective. It says that a man’s style is a picture of him" (quoted, p. 32). Nor is this picture a mere ornament to the serious stuff. “Working in philosophy … is really more a working on oneself. On one’s own interpretation. On one’s way of seeing things” (CV, 16).

Operating on the assumption that Wittgenstein’s views should guide us (a debatable assumption, yes), we riddle the man’s philosophy, his style, the man himself, together. And this angle, far from narrowing into a cul-de-sac of personal idiosyncrasy, may open chapters of the history of philosophy.

Take Arthur Schopenhauer, praised by Thomas Mann as “pre-eminently creative,” an author’s philosopher; mildly but firmly denigrated by Russell: “His appeal has always been less to professional philosophers than to artistic and literary people in search of a philosophy that they could believe.” Mann’s and Russell’s judgments sit side-by-side as blurbs on the back of a book of selections on my shelf: Arthur Schopenhauer, The Art of Literature 2. Obviously it did not occur to the editors that Russell is insulting the ‘literary people’ as over-susceptible to influence. It did not occur to Russell his words might end up as advertising. (Parable of literature and philosophy misunderstanding each other.)

Schopenhauer’s most famous philosophical followers are Nietzsche and Wittgenstein. Both turn against their educator while young but, I would say, stay in the habit of standing him precisely on his head. Still, to be father to these fathers of analytic and continental philosophy (vague terms, yes) is an achievement. What I am working up to is the suggestion that to understand the literary Wittgenstein is to approximate to a point where the stream of post-Romanticism divides, in philosophy, with decisive effects for the topography of the whole field of 20th Century philosophy.

Is Schopenhauer personally some sort of key? Perhaps not, although one contributor, Garry Hagberg, hints astutely (but really only hints) at what I think is a promising line. In “Autobiographical Consciousness, Wittgenstein, private experience and the ‘inner picture’”, he notes that The World as Will and Representation is, formally, metaphysical autobiography: all and only about ‘I’. This might seem a frivolously strained point. (Are all philosophers who investigate the mind and/or self writing autobiography?) But if you read, say, Thomas Mann on Schopenhauer it is clear enough this is precisely what attracts him. Schopenhauer writes metaphysics novelistically, hence his solipsism has the character of autobiography: the world as it happened to me.

One crucial way Wittgenstein keeps in adverse philosophical contact with Schopenhauer, I think, is by establishing tension between philosophy as ‘metaphysical autobiography’ and philosophy as ‘ordinary’ self-observation and reportage. The ‘merely personal’ in Wittgenstein cannot be ignored, then, because it intrudes not as gossip but as deflationary challenge to more transcendental modes of memoir-writing.

At any rate, let Schopenhauer stand (not implausibly) for a cluster of Romantic intellectual lines and formations and impulses and temperaments. Getting back to Gould:

“Without some understanding of the ways in which Wittgenstein alternately seeks and dodges his fate as a late Romantic or early modernist, we will have little hope of characterizing the relation between the details of Wittgenstein’s practice as a writer and his various pronouncements about writing and character. My sense is that Wittgenstein’s self-characterizations of his philosophical practice within the Investigations are far more advanced than his ability to find words to characterize that practice that do not participate directly in that practice" (p. 79).

The core of Gould’s essay is a close reading of PI par. 112-138, elucidating an oft-quoted bit: “A picture held us captive. And we could not get outside it, for it lay in our language and language seemed to repeat it to us inexorably” (par. 115). Oversimplifying, Gould’s point is that the vatic, aphoristic quality of the line tempts readers into an ‘isolationist’ reading, when what is needed is an understanding of therapeutic function in context. That Wittgenstein is attempting ‘therapy’ is of course the least original of theses, but Gould is painstaking and plausible in his tracing of a narrative of restless oscillation — but it must be! but it can’t be! — leading to fixation on linguistic forms, which turn out to be delusive rudders, leading to attention to ordinary use. To get the details, read Gould. But the complex irony he is exploring can be appreciated in the abstract. A typical effect of par. 115 is almost a parody of its purpose. ‘A picture of pictures as things in language held us captive. And we could not get outside it, for it lay in Wittgenstein’s language and his language seemed to repeat it to us inexorably.’ Here we get some hint as to why Gould thinks Wittgenstein’s compulsion to show what he is saying is problematic — when it seems it ought to be helpfully reinforcing. At the very moment he wants to send us ‘back to the rough ground’, he gives us some artfully epigrammatic frame — which we then trace around and around until its contours seem necessarily isomorphic with wisdom. By exemplifying the target pathology too potently, Wittgenstein’s rhetoric infects rather than inoculates.

But I have not explained how Gould makes the connection between his close reading and Wittgenstein’s allegedly fraught post-Romanticism. Eldridge helps here. Let me first quote one bit without context, because the subject could be almost any page of The Literary Wittgenstein:

“But now the worry arises that such a working through and dramatic display could not be philosophically significant. No theses seem to be quite established. Arguments appear at best as moves within an ongoing self-interrogation, not as routes to definite results. It seems too ‘optional’ whether anyone responds to the protagonist’s worries and to the drama of the text. Is philosophy here, within this reading, being vaporized into bad literature, as some of my colleagues sometimes ask?" (p. 212).

A drop of philosophy vaporized into a cloud of grammar. Indeed, all the contributions to The Literary Wittgenstein risk accumulating into a nebulous reversal of Wittgenstein’s therapeutic intentions; especially when half orbit around an inevitable few — tantalizing, ambiguous, vague — drops from Culture and Value, e.g. “I think I summed up my position on philosophy when I said: philosophy ought really to be written only as a form of poetry” (CV 24). This sentence appears as a blurb on the back of the book.

More about risk after talk of Romanticism. Eldridge compares Hölderlin and Wittgenstein — specifically, he sets the poet’s philosophy of poetry beside the philosopher’s poetizing technique.

“The central idea of Hölderlin’s poetology is that the successful poem will embody transitions or modulations among experiences and moods that can be coherently integrated with one another within a life. Against this background Wittgenstein can be seen to offer in his own itinerary similar transitions or modulations between independence and attunement and so likewise to offer us, through identification with his voices, the possibility for us to acknowledge fundamental conditions of human life" (p. 213).

Eldridge emphasizes Hölderlin’s status as a post-Kantian thinker, grappling with the thesis that, not only is idealism true but human beings are, as it were, one part phenomenon, one part thing-in-itself, due to our unique status as inhabitants of the world who are also free moral agents and capable of apperceptively unified judgment. As Eldridge observes: “the argument for these further conclusions has, to put it mildly, occasioned considerable discussion” (p. 215).

Hölderin is a thinker who takes Kant’s ‘making room for faith’ less in the tidy spirit of the original, and more as an occasion for scattering seeds of veneration for the unknowable mysteries of Being even throughout the garden of reason. Eldridge on Hölderlin: “There is no possibility of knowing absolute Being and one’s route of emergence from it, in such a way that one could be guided by this knowledge securely toward the achievement of both love and selfhood.” Hölderlin: “The path of life … does not lead back into the origin” (p. 219). Eldridge connects the pathos of this path to Wittgenstein’s image of ‘criss-crossing paths’ in Philosophical Investigations. A sense of the impossibility of a direct encounter with essence — with Being — leads Hölderlin to offer, through his poetology, what he hopes is a more rigorous characterization of experienced life as humanly knowable. It is plausible to coordinate the spirit of Wittgenstein with the poetic, post-Kantian, Romantic spirit of Hölderlin — with one proviso.

Eldridge suggests that Wittgenstein, like Hölderlin, assuages broadly Kantian concerns about the very possibility of conceptual thought specifically by retrenching to descriptions of moods and their modulations — to descriptions of transitions between experiences. Hölderlin’s essay is “On the Operations of the Poetic Spirit”. Wittgenstion might substitute “Philosophic”: what is it like to think philosophy?


Gould’s essay — attentive to mood — can reinforce this line. At any rate, the Hölderlin comparison holds up. It enables a plausibly correct answer to the question: what do all the scholarly translations of Wittgenstein’s strange remarks into more or less standard arguments tend to lose in the translation? They lose voice and drama. Wittgenstein thinks and argues while self-reflexively noting and commenting on — and dramatically exhibiting — what is it like to think and argue. At any rate, what it is like for him. Why is that important, as opposed to personally interesting, entertaining, whatever? For broadly post-Kantian and post-Romantic reasons (cf. Hölderlin, Schopenhauer, et. al.)


My only complaint about Eldridge’s paper is that the final section, which should do the actual work of coordinating Wittgenstein with Hölderlin, is brief and cuts off abruptly. As with Hagburg’s hint at Schopenhauer as metaphysical autobiographer, Eldridge points us at the door, then does not go through.


Another contribution to the volume does the same: Stanley Cavell’s “The Investigations Everyday Aesthetics of Itself”. Cavell makes Gould’s (and Eldridge’s and my) point that there are "ostentatiously “literary” gestures of the Investigations, outstanding in the sense of that work as cultivating its literary grounds" (p. 24), that are also outstanding as so many fly-bottles awaiting the wrong reader. Cavell mentions that he has heard phenomenological fantasies, which Wittgenstein holds up in a cautionary spirit, seized upon as deep insights, e.g. “uttering a word is like striking a note on the keyboard of the imagination.” Following Gould, we might say lines like this exemplify the temptation of ‘isolationism’.


Why write so as to encourage bad habits in readers? It seems perverse. Obviously part of Wittgenstein is tempted by un-Wittgensteinian attitudes. There is something he wants, but feels is unattainable. Speaking of which, the most impressive thing Cavell does is deftly juxtapose ten remarks by Wittgenstein with nine by one or the other Schlegel brother (with an Emersonian ringer thrown in to round out the total, lest we forget this is Cavell.) The family resemblance is, indeed, striking. Just the first five pairs:


I. a) One age misunderstands another; and a petty age misunderstands all the others in its own nasty way.


b) The age isn’t ready for it, they always say. Is that a reason why it shouldn’t happen?


II. a) A mediocre writer must beware of too quickly replacing a crude, incorrect expression with a correct one. By doing so he kills his original idea, which was at least still a living seedling.


b) How many authors are there among writers? Author means creator.


III. a) Each of the sentences I write is trying to say the whole thing.


b) In poetry too every whole can be a part and every part really a whole.


IV. a) There is a pathos peculiar to the man who is happily in love as well as to the one who is unhappily in love.


b) A so-called happy marriage is to love as a correct poem is to an improvised song.


V. a) The idea is worn out by now and no longer usable … Like silver paper, which can never quite be smoothed out again once it has been crumpled.


b) Isn’t everything that is capable of becoming shopworn already twisted or trite to begin with? (p. 30

Cavell’s point is that Wittgenstein reads surprisingly like an early 19th Century German Romantic thinker. (All the a’s are Wittgenstein from Culture and Value.) Cavell connects his ten pairs with another remark from that book:

“I often wonder whether my cultural ideal is new, i.e. contemporary, or whether it comes from the time of Schumann. At least it strikes me as being a continuation of that idea, though of course not the continuation that actually happened. Thereby the second half of the nineteenth century is excluded.” (quoted, p. 30)

We may connect all this as well to Wittgenstein’s remark, quoted above, that philosophy ought to be written only poetically. The continuation complicates the assumption that, therefore, Wittgenstein writes poetry: “It must, it seems to me, be possible to gather from this how far my thinking belongs to the present, future or past. For I was thereby revealing myself as someone who cannot quite do what he would like to be able to do” (CV, 24). If there were philosophy, it would be poetry. (This reminds me of Wittgenstein’s remark, in his “Lecture on Ethics” that if someone could really write a book about Ethics, it would explode.)

Cavell does not really develop this strong hint that Wittgenstein, who seems a sleek modernist, is really a Romantic throw-back who can’t quite bring himself to throw himself back.

To push a point, suppose on Schönberg’s death it were discovered the great modernist — this composer of ‘musical prose’ — had secretly been scribbling quantities of uncompleted stuff, apparently in the style of Schumann, or some other early 19th Century composer. (I have little knowledge of Schönberg’s biography; this is, so far as I know, a thought-experiment.) You could make sense of the discovery as mild nostalgic compulsion, in light of Schönberg’s sense of the exhaustion of classicism in the face of romanticism, and of romanticism in the face of itself, in the second half of the 19th Century. Wagner and Brahms battle all previous music into submission but the former declines into pyrotechnic kitsch; regarding the latter, one cannot just write more Brahms. (I am trying to think like Schönberg.) Hence the necessity of ‘prose’, although music ought to be poetry. This is consistent with nostalgic yearning for earlier, now unavailable forms. (So much sadly crumpled silver paper.) The very worst, most implausible thing you could do would be to conclude that somehow, secretly, these unearthed Schumannesque fragments were blueprints to Schönberg’s modernist symphonies, which now are to be understood, musicologically, in terms of nostalgic snippets. You strain your ears until you aurally hallucinate Schumannesque tonal deep-structure in the apparent atonality.

The moral of the story: Wittgenstein may be an aesthetic modernist, comparable to Schönberg in terms of his acute sensitivity to the formal exhaustion of the potentialities of earlier modes of philosophical composition — romantic (Schopenhauer) and classical (Frege and Russell). Therefore, there is reason to suspect that reading his modernist masterpieces — Tractatus, Philosophical Investigations — in light of the likes of Culture and Value risks fostering a misleading sense of the latter’s place and function. It is no accident that explicit expressions of thoughts one finds in Culture and Value are excluded from Philosophical Investigations. Whole topics — literary ones, notably — are kept out in favor of painstaking discussions of what look more like standard philosophical topics, although not always standardly cast. Not that this exclusion is necessarily successfully rigorous; and not that one should refuse to treat the likes of Culture and Value as containing invaluable evidence. Still, when I read an essay on ‘the literary Wittgenstein’ that contains more quotes from Culture and Value than the Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations (this review, for example) I worry that the romantic tail wags the modernist dog, pardon the silly metaphor.

Let me now offer semi-comprehensive notes about the rest of the volume’s contents before coming to a kind of conclusion. First, five broadly comparative studies.

Marjorie Perloff’s essay, "But isn’t the same at least the same", is an exercise in comparative stylistics: Wittgenstein’s sentences are perhaps like the French Oulipo poets’, perhaps like Beckett’s. She opens with two pages of argument by example that ‘poetic translation is never perfect’. Argument by example will, of course, never prove this never, but the thesis is uncontroversial (heresy of paraphrase and all that); let it pass; then she vaults without argument to ‘translation entails meaning slippage’ which is tendentious. If I devise two technical languages expressly to be notational variants of each other, I cannot ‘perfectly’ translate from one to the other? To borrow a sentence from Martin Stone’s contribution to the volume (adapted by him from PI par. 3): “You seem to be thinking of literary texts, but there are others. You can make your statement correct by expressly restricting it to those texts.” When Perloff gets to Wittgenstein, there is literally (explicitly) no attempt to address — even at a superficial level — the philosophical substance that presumably has some internal connection to the formal style.

David Schalkwyk, “Wittgenstein’s ‘Imperfect Garden’,” invokes Freud on the uncanny, aligns Wittgenstein with Derrida against Searle (I think this is exactly backwards); then, via the vaguely deconstructive notion that literature is inherently a kind of grammatical investigation, we move to consider speeches from Hamlet in which notions of interiority, appearance and the hidden self are invoked: "Seems, madam? Nay, it is. I know not ‘seems’.“

”MsoBodyText">James Guetti contributes "Monologic and Dialogic: Wittgenstein, Heart of Darkness, and Linguistic Skepticism" and Rupert Read offers “Wittgenstein and Faulker’s Benjy, Reflections on and of derangement”.

So we have Wittgenstein, Beckett (Oulipo poetry, etc.), Shakespeare, Conrad, Faulkner. These pieces are all serious essays — in the etymological sense of ‘serious attempts’ — and I am loath to dismiss them out of hand. But I must confess I found little of interest, due to considerations well expressed by Gould:

“There is little to be gained in beginning with an investigation of Wittgenstein’s literary affinities with other writers (or for that matter with musicians or architects) and in trying to use such perspectives to understand his writing. Looking for similarities between a parable of Wittgenstein’s (e.g. about the pictured pot with the pictured steam coming out) and a parable of Kafka’s (e.g. about the Chinese Wall) is not likely to be helpful in the absence of a better understanding of the uses to which Wittgenstein and Kafka put their parables. What we need is a precise understanding of his writings that shows what Wittgenstein is up to philosophically, in using these words this way” (p. 77).

Two more comparative pieces do a bit better. In “Imagined Worlds and the Real One”, Bernard Harrison moves from a Wittgensteinian-sounding passage in Woolf’s To the Lighthouse to Plato’s Cratylus and back again, weaving through the Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations. Harrison makes workmanlike — I mean that in a good way — comparisons and contrasts between Plato’s philosophy of language and the early Wittgenstein’s; but I think the Woolf connection, tantalizing, fails to take root. The essay falls in two pieces, ending up light on literary Wittgenstein.

Joachim Schulte, “The Life of the Sign”, opens and closes with a discussion of how Michael Dummett misreads a passage from the Blue Book. Indeed he seems to. This bookends discussion of a number of well-chosen passages about ‘the life of the sign’. Schulte is an elegant, clear writer, but I recommend his piece most for the collection of remarks itself, which I found illuminating.

Let us proceed to contributions that attempt, one way or another, applications of Wittgensteinian philosophy.

In “Reading For Life”, editor John Gibson takes up a question raised, briefly, by Huemer in his introduction. Huemer quotes Russell on Hamlet: “the propositions in the play are false because there was no such man.” Huemer remarks: “the problems of this position seem obvious: if statements in literary texts are false, literature cannot be of cognitive value. This position seems to marginalize the value of literature in our society; it becomes mysterious why people are interested in spending their time with writing or reading literary texts in the first place” (p. 3). Wittgenstein, by contrast, is praised for rejecting this narrow referentialism. This seems to me to seize the point wrong way round. For what could be more Wittgensteinian than the following opening gambit? “We can imagine people, not unlike ourselves, who take no interest in plays or novels because they regard the sentences these works contain as expressing obvious, hence dull falsehoods. In all other respects these people talk and feel and respond as we do — to events in life, and to talk about life.”

This carries us to Gibson’s puzzle: understanding how literature can be ‘about life’ in the face of rather simple — not therefore mistaken — considerations that suggest otherwise. What he argues, using Wittgenstein’s example of the Paris meter stick as an analogy, is that literature may play a constitutive role. Crudely, this is a ‘life imitates art’ rather than ‘art imitates life’ line on the life-art relation — only non-mimetically cast. The argument seems to me an interestingly laid-out variant on a familiar view. The main problem, which is not really an objection, is that it seems to me patently a partial answer to the question: how can literature be about life? Relatively few works plausibly provide us with ‘paradigms’ in the hypothesized sense. (We cannot carry many works around in our heads as literary Paris meter sticks, I should think.) So, in a sense, the general mystery Gibson sets out to diminish remains undiminished even if his account is accepted. Which does not necessarily diminish the correctness of the account in certain cases.

Cora Diamond contributes two pieces: “Having a Rough Story About What Moral Philosophy Is”, and a new introduction to it, containing a rough story about its Wittgensteinian inspiration. Her thesis, broadly, is that literature may be better at doing moral philosophy than moral philosophy is, since various sorts of unduly narrow conceptualizations of the subject may be defeated by healthier, novelistic openness to ‘the whole texture of being’. I find the thesis agreeable; certainly it is not trivial. But Diamond’s exposition seems to me not superior to other essays that have praised the novel on approximately these grounds. (There are many ways of saying, give or take, ‘the whole texture of being’.) Likewise, the Wittgenstein connection, while authentic, is not surprising or new.

Two pieces are about how Stanley Fish is the opposite of Wittgenstein, in approximately the sense that one man’s modus ponens is another man’s modus tollens. Fish is ponens, Wittgenstein tollens regarding the necessity of interpretation. That is, Wittgenstein sees the wrongness of the conclusion that ‘every reading is an interpretation’ as warranting rejection of premises. Martin Stone, “On the Old Saw, ‘Every Reading of a Text is an Interpretation’” gives the clearer exposition. But if you read two papers from this volume about how Fish isn’t a Wittgensteinian, Sonia Sedivy, “Wittgenstein Against Interpretation”, is also sound.

Two contributions assess the capacity of a Tractarian framework to generate an adequate theory of fictional discourse: Alex Burri, "Facts and Fiction, Reflections on the Tractatus" and Dale Jacquette, "The Tractatus and the Logic of Fiction". Jacquette’s piece has an odd aspect. He argues that the Tractarian system cannot handle propositional attitude ascriptions. Ergo the system will not be able to handle fictional discourse, which naturally tends to involve representations of psychology. This is rather like arguing that Wittgenstein cannot have an adequate theory of architecture because his account of time and space implies these dimensions cannot exist. The critical point is not necessarily wrong — the argument is cogent — but the framing is off-center. It is not a point about literature but about mind and language, with dramatic consequences for literature (but also for just about everything else).

Burri: “I shall simply presuppose Wittgenstein’s early ontology and philosophy of language (or a particular interpretation thereof) and then try to find out what conclusions relevant to the theory of fiction may be drawn from these presuppositions” (p. 291). As a devotee of doctrinal intricacies of the Tractatus, I find what follows engaging. (It turns out a Tractarian theory of fictional discourse is problematic.) Yet I am reminded of an entry from Wittgenstein’s notebooks from 1929, the time of his abandonment of the Tractarian framework. He reports a dream presumably occasioned by frustration with himself, or Frank Ramsey, or a great many people, or all the above.

“This morning I dreamt: I had a long time ago commissioned someone to make me a water-wheel and now I no longer wanted it but he was still working on it. The wheel lay there and it was bad; it was notched all around, perhaps in order to put the blades in (as in the motor of a steam turbine). He explained to me what a tiresome task it was, and I thought: I had ordered a straightforward paddle-wheel, which would have been simple to make. The thought tormented me that the man was too stupid to explain to him or to make a better wheel, and that I could do nothing but leave him to it. I thought: I have to live with people to whom I cannot make myself understood. That is a thought that I actually do have often. At the same time with the feeling that it is my own fault.”3

I like the thought that the stupid man is Wittgenstein himself (and we should all be so lucky as to be as idiotic as the brilliant Frank Ramsey.) Readers should sample Jacquette and Burri to suit their taste in conceptual paddle-wheel style Tractarian philosophy.

Finally, Joseph Margolis contributes "Unlikely Prospects For Applying Wittgenstein’s “Method” to Aesthetics and the Philosophy of Art", a survey of fraught and dueling Wittgensteinianisms. Here is something I think is important, and really is Margolis’ main point: “We do certainly see how brilliantly he worked; but, for all that, I confess I have never seen a convincing statement of Wittgenstein’s general ‘method’” (p. 328). It is, Margolis notes, hazardous to be imitable without it being clear how the imitation (so potent in the original) is supposed to function. Let me amplify the irony by setting it beside the words with which Wittgenstein opens a lecture series, in 1930:

“The nimbus of philosophy has been lost. For we now have a method of doing philosophy, and can speak of skilful philosophers. Compare the difference between alchemy and chemistry: chemistry has a method and we can speak of skilful chemists. But once a method has been found the opportunities for the expression of personality are correspondingly restricted.”4

Set that beside the one about how philosophy ought only to be written only as poetic confession of your own personality.

The moral of the story, quite simply, is that writing well on ‘the literary Wittgenstein’ needs sensitivity and attention to highly particular and quite idiosyncratic rifts and tensions in one man’s philosophical personality. It seems to me this tends to determine which pieces in this volume succeed.

Let me conclude by noting how even coming to regard it as natural to regard Wittgenstein as a literary figure risks going against the Wittgensteinian grain. Consider F. R. Leavis’ “Memories of Wittgenstein.” Leavis is in no doubt as to Wittgenstein’s admirable character, philosophical brilliance, ethical seriousness, deep spirit and high culture. Yet, “cultivated as he was, his interest in literature had remained rudimentary … It may of course be that in German the range and quality of his literary culture were more impressive, but I can’t give any great weight to that possibility.”5 Leavis is badly mistaken, we can all agree. But Leavis isn’t a blind idiot. The fact that this eminent literary acquaintance of Wittgenstein makes this mistake says something about the surface that we should not forget, just because we think we can see through it. Wittgenstein is an analytic philosopher. The sheer stupefaction with which Leavis would have received a book of scholarly essays on The Literary Wittgenstein should be a caution to us, as much as an occasion for self-congratulation as to our more advanced understanding.



1 Friedrich Nietzsche, Beyond Good and Evil, trans. W. Kaufmann (New York: Vintage, 1966), ¤6

2 Arthur Schopenhauer, The Art of Literature, trans. T. Bailey Saunders (Ann Arbor: U of Michigan Press, 1960). It is still in print. I wonder whether recent editions retain the Russell blurb.

3 Quoted in Ray Monk, Ludwig Wittgenstein, The Duty of Genius (New York: Free Press, 1990), p. 276.

4 Ludwig Wittgenstein, Wittgenstein’s Lectures, Cambridge, 1930-1932, ed. Desmond Lee (Oxford: Blackwell, 1980), p.21.

5 F. R. Leavis, ""Memories of Wittgenstein"," in Recollections of Wittgenstein, ed. R. Rhees (Oxford: Oxford UP, 1981), p. 66.