2005.07.03

Robert Audi

The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value

Robert Audi, The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value, Princeton University Press, 2004, 256 pp, $ 22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0691123888.

Reviewed by Bart Streumer, Fitzwilliam College, Cambridge University


Like many good books, Robert Audi's book The Good in the Right is based on a simple idea. The idea is that the following two things can both be true of a proposition p:

(1) p is self-evident.

(2) p can be inferred from other propositions.

Like many good ideas, this idea is not new. For example, Russell already noted that, if arithmetic can be deduced from logic, (1) and (2) are both true of the simple propositions of arithmetic.[1] What is new, however, is Audi's application of the idea to ethics. This enables him to defend an ethical theory that is a surprising combination of intuitionism and Kantianism.

Audi begins the book by discussing the historical development of intuitionism, and by formulating what he takes to be the most plausible version of this view. In chapter 1, he discusses the views of Sidgwick, Moore, Prichard, Broad and Ross. What makes all of these philosophers intuitionists, Audi claims, is that they all thought that (1) is true of at least some moral propositions p, and that the following claim is therefore also true of these propositions:

(3) We can come to know that p without inferring it from other propositions.

Audi argues that Ross's view is the most plausible version of intuitionism. Ross claimed that (1) and (3) are true of principles of prima facie duty, by which he meant general propositions about considerations that tend to make it the case that an action is our duty. And he thought that there are five principles of prima facie duty: one each about a duty of fidelity, a duty of reparation, a duty of gratitude, a duty of non-maleficence, and a duty to promote intrinsic value.

In chapter 2, Audi presents his own version of Ross's intuitionism. His main departure from Ross is his stress on the fact that (3) is compatible with the claim that

(2) p can be inferred from other propositions.

Ross sometimes suggested that his principles of prima facie duty cannot be inferred from other propositions. For example, in The Right and the Good, he wrote that these principles "cannot be proved, but … just as certainly need no proof".[2] What may have led Ross to make such claims, Audi thinks, is an overly simple conception of self-evidence. Audi puts forward a subtler conception of self-evidence, according to which a proposition is self-evident if "an adequate understanding of it is sufficient both for being justified in believing it and for knowing it if one believes it on the basis of that understanding" (p. 49). If we accept this conception of self-evidence, Audi claims, we can make a distinction between two types of self-evidence. The first is what he calls 'hard' self-evidence, which belongs to self-evident propositions that are (a) strongly axiomatic, in the sense that nothing is better justified than them; (b) immediate, in the sense that no reflection is needed to understand them; (c) indefeasibly justified; and (d) compelling, in the sense that those who understand them cannot resist believing them. The second is what he calls 'soft' self-evidence, which belongs to self-evident propositions that have none of these characteristics (p. 53).

Ross's comparisons of his principles of prima facie duty with mathematical axioms and rules of inference, Audi claims, suggest that he thought that the kind of self-evidence these principles have is hard self-evidence. And if that is the kind of self-evidence they had, it would be plausible to claim, as Ross does, that these principles "cannot be proved". But in fact, Audi thinks, it is much more plausible to claim that these principles have a softer kind of self-evidence. And if these principles have a softer kind of self-evidence, it is much more plausible to claim that they can be inferred from other propositions, and that (2) and (3) can therefore both be true of these principles.

In chapter 3, Audi makes use of this idea by arguing that something like Ross's principles of prima facie duty can be inferred from the intrinsic-end formulation of Kant's categorical imperative, which reads:

Act in such a way that you always treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end (p. 90).

Audi calls the resulting view 'Kantian intuitionism', and he claims that, by showing that the principles of prima facie duty can be inferred from the categorical imperative, Kantian intuitionism systematizes these principles. More exactly, Audi claims that Kantian intuitionism does the following three things: (a) it makes it plausible that the principles of prima facie duty hold; (b) it shows what the common ground of these principles is, namely, the status of persons as ends in themselves; and (c) it partly explains why these principles hold, namely, in virtue of their common ground (p. 110). In addition to this, Audi thinks, Kantian intuitionism is able to deal with certain problems that Ross's view has. For example, Kantian intuitionism is able to say more than Ross's view about the resolution of conflicts between different principles of prima facie duty, and is able to show more convincingly than Ross's view why the duty of beneficence (which is one form of the duty to promote intrinsic value) does not always outweigh all other prima facie duties. For these reasons, Audi claims, Kantian intuitionism is preferable to Ross's version of intuitionism.

In chapter 4, Audi shows how his Kantian intuitionism can be grounded in considerations about value, by arguing that acting on Kantian intuitionism contributes to human flourishing, and thereby to the realization of value. And in chapter 5, Audi gives a more detailed account of the principles of prima facie duty that he takes the intrinsic-end formulation of the categorical imperative to support. He takes there to be ten such principles instead of Ross's five: a prohibition of injury and harm, a duty of veracity, a duty to keep our promises, a duty of justice, a duty of reparation, a duty of beneficence, a duty of gratitude, a duty of self-improvement, a duty to enhance and preserve freedom, and a duty of respectfulness (pp. 188-95).

The Good in the Right is an extremely interesting and stimulating book that develops intuitionism in a new and unexpected way. Audi's central idea, that self-evident moral propositions can be inferable from other propositions, is surely one that any sensible intuitionist will want to accept. Moreover, many of Audi's discussions, such as those of Ross's views and of different kinds of self-evidence, are very insightful and useful.

However, I also have some doubts about Audi's arguments. The first is that, though a lot hangs on the distinction that Audi makes between inferential and non-inferential justification and reasoning, it does not become entirely clear what he takes this distinction to be. He comes closest to explaining this when he distinguishes what he calls 'conclusions of inference' from 'conclusions of reflection'. He claims that conclusions of inference are "premised on propositions noted as evidence" (p. 45), and that reasoning that results in such conclusions is "premise-based" (p. 198). And he writes that conclusions of reflection "emerge from thinking about [something] as a whole, but not from one or more evidential premises", that drawing such a conclusion is "a kind of wrapping up of the question, akin to concluding a practical matter with a decision", that when one has drawn such a conclusion "one has obtained a view of the whole and thereby broadly characterized it" (pp. 45-6), and that reasoning that leads to such conclusions is "non-linear and in a certain way global" (p. 198).

Audi's central idea is clearly that inferential reasoning is based on premises and that non-inferential reasoning is not based on premises, but it does not become very clear what non-inferential reasoning is based on. Audi suggests that it is a distortion of Ross's view to say that he thought that we 'just see' moral truths, but Audi's own explanation of how we reach conclusions of reflection does not seem very far removed from the claim that we 'just see' that such conclusions are true. Moreover, though Audi claims that inferential reasoning is based on premises, he does not explain what it is for something to be a premise. We may suppose that something is a premise if it entails or probabilifies a conclusion, but it seems that Audi cannot say that, since he claims that the principles of prima facie duty can be inferred from the categorical imperative, and since the categorical imperative does not seem to entail or probabilify these principles. Alternatively, we may suppose that something can be a premise if a conclusion is the best explanation for it (as it is in an inference to the best explanation), but it seems that Audi would not want to say that either, since he does not argue that the principles of prima facie duty are the best explanation for the categorical imperative.

Instead, Audi suggests in various places that something is a premise if it is evidence for a conclusion (see, for example, p. 45) or if it makes a conclusion 'plausible' (see, for example, p. 110). But if that is all it takes for something to be a premise, then why does the 'view of the whole' that non-inferential reasoning is based on not count as a premise? After all, it certainly seems that this 'view of the whole' must be evidence for the conclusion of this process of non-inferential reasoning, or must make this conclusion plausible. And if that is so, the difference between inferential and non-inferential reasoning seems to disappear.

These doubts about Audi's distinction between inferential and non-inferential justification and reasoning lead to a second doubt I have about his arguments. Given that Audi's distinction between inferential and non-inferential justification and reasoning is not entirely clear, it is also not entirely clear how much support the claim that the principles of prima facie duty can be inferred from the categorical imperative really gives to the principles. After all, on Audi's use of the term 'inference', all this claim seems to come down to is that the categorical imperative is evidence for the truth of these principles, or makes these principles plausible.

I find it rather hard to assess whether that is true. Perhaps this is because I have no clear idea of what I am being told when the categorical imperative tells me that I should "always treat humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end". I suppose I have a vague sense of what this means, but I have a much clearer idea of what I am being told when Audi tells me what he thinks can be inferred from the categorical imperative: that I should not injure or harm other people, that I should not lie, that I should keep my promises, and so on. Since what is claimed to be inferable from the categorical imperative is much clearer to me than the categorical imperative itself, the categorical imperative almost seems to be an empty shell, a rhetorical claim that is only given a definite content when further claims are made about what can supposedly be inferred from it.

In a brief discussion of something like this objection, Audi claims that we do have a sense of what the categorical imperative means independently of claims about what can be inferred from it. He writes that

from our understanding of instrumental relations among both animate and inanimate things, we have a sense of what it is to treat someone merely as a means. We regularly use tools, and far too often some people similarly use others. Here, getting the job done is all that matters: what happens to the tool is of no concern -- unless we may need it for another job or happen to like it for its own sake. We also have a sense of what it is to treat someone as an end. To be sure, the notion of a person as an end is somewhat technical, since ends in the ordinary sense are realizable; but from Kant's -- and Ross's -- writings we can acquire a sense of what it is to treat someone as an end. It is also fruitful to consider love as a source of such understanding. We do things for those we love with no further end than some aspect of their good (pp. 107-8).

Audi is right, of course, that I have some sense of what the categorical imperative means independently of my understanding of the principles of prima facie duty that the thinks can be inferred from it, if only because of my understanding of more familiar uses of the terms 'means' and 'end'. But that does not seem enough to claim, as Audi does, that the categorical imperative systematizes these principles of prima facie duty, by making it plausible that these principles are true, by explaining why they are true and by showing what these principles have in common, especially since many intuitionists would want to deny that the categorical imperative can do this.

Despite these two doubts about Audi's arguments, I do think that The Right in the Good is an extremely interesting and rewarding book. Audi has reminded intuitionists once and for all that the fact that a moral proposition is self-evident does not bar it from being inferred from other propositions. In doing so, he has not only defended a significant view of his own, but he has also made room for developing intuitionism in other new directions.[3]


[1] See Bertrand Russell, The Problems of Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1980 [1912]), p. 65. [Chapter 11].

[2] W. D. Ross, The Right and the Good (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002 [1930]), p. 30. As Philip Stratton-Lake points out in his introduction to the 2002 edition of Ross's book, however, this may not have been Ross's considered view (pp. xlviii-xlix). Audi also notes that Ross at least once contradicted his suggestion that his general propositions about prima facie duties cannot be proved (p. 83).

[3] I would like to thank Philip Stratton-Lake for helpful comments.