2005.08.18

Gail Fine

Plato on Knowledge and Forms: Selected Essays

Gail Fine, Plato on Knowledge and Forms: Selected Essays, Oxford University Press, 2003, 464pp, $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199245592.

Reviewed by Christopher Shields, University of Oxford


Plato introduces Forms as specially suited to be objects of knowledge: unlike the sense particulars named after them, Forms are stable, pure, and uncluttered by context. That is, unlike sense particulars, Forms never vary in their evaluative features from one context of appraisal to the next. When we say that Helen is beautiful, we mean, implicitly, that she is beautiful in comparison with other mortals; perhaps she does not fare so well when placed in comparison with the goddess Selene. Helen may be contrasted in this respect with the Form of Beauty, which Plato characterizes in an extravagant passage of the Symposium as "Beauty itself, taken by itself, within itself, one in Form, existing always" (auto kath' hauto meth' hautou monoeides aei on; 211b1). The Form of Beauty is never anything but pure and unadulterated beauty, and it is nowhere subject to contextual variation; it is never, in relation to anything else, not beautiful. Beauty Itself will never suffer the fate of beautiful sense particulars; it will be instead the unfailing essence of what it is to be beautiful. In view of their constancy and stability as abstract entities, Plato supposes, Forms alone can be known, or can alone provide the basis for what he calls epistêmê. Plato's primary approach to Forms is thus simultaneously metaphysical and epistemological: given what they are, Forms may serve as objects of knowledge; and given that our knowledge requires such objects, there are Forms.

Prof. Gail Fine has investigated these yoked epistemological and metaphysical dimensions of Forms with care, insight, and tenacity for over a quarter century -- with the result that she has forced us to rethink our basic understanding of Forms from the ground up. Indeed, she probes even some of the innocuous sounding templates retailed in the first paragraph of this review. Several of her papers have acquired classic status and many more are widely read and discussed in the professional literature on Plato. This welcome anthology collects together fifteen of her published papers, some of them lightly touched up for clarity and scholarly accuracy, but mainly as they appeared originally. Although almost all of the papers in the volume have been readily accessible in research libraries, two benefit especially by their inclusion because of their relative inaccessibility ('Forms as Causes: Plato and Aristotle' and 'Plato and Aristotle on Form and Substance'). Also welcome is a full, clear, and mildly polemical Introduction, in which Fine traces the main themes of her work and responds selectively to her critics. The Introduction is a model of its kind: Fine addresses her critics with the same care and intensity she displays in analyzing Platonic texts, with the result that those not already versed in the intricacies of Platonic exegesis may be brought swiftly up to speed, at least as regards the topics of special concern to Fine. Because these topics include most of those central to Platonic metaphysics and epistemology, the Introduction will prove of special value to advanced students first immersing themselves in the contemporary scholarly literature on Plato.

Fine's dominant areas of concern embrace a series of overlapping topics, including but not limited to: (i) Meno's paradox of inquiry and its relation to knowledge, understanding, and definition; (ii) the so-called Two-Worlds Theory, according to which, in its simplest formulation, Plato regards knowledge and belief as ranging over two discrete and necessarily disjoint sets of objects, namely abstract Forms and sensible particulars; (iii) Plato's thoughts about justification and explanation, where Fine has a recurring concern regarding whether Plato's epistemology should be thought more closely akin to contemporary coherentism, or, as has traditionally been assumed, it is better conceived as a version of foundationalism; (iv) ante rem and in rebus realism in Plato and Aristotle; (v) the ways in which Forms are and are not usefully conceived as causes; and (vi) the nature and separation of substances in both Plato and Aristotle. Fine advances clear and distinctive theses with respect to each of these topics, in many cases heterodox, sometimes markedly so, always philosophically alert, and consistently engaging. She proceeds with an eye cast on the ultimate defensibility of Plato's philosophy, and does not shy from offering spirited criticisms or defenses of Plato where she thinks they are warranted. In this last regard, Fine appropriately attaches special significance to Aristotle's presentation of Platonic claims and arguments, where very often she discovers something of value in his representation of Plato, even while, with equal frequency, she supposes that Plato has the resources to rebuff or neutralize Aristotle's criticisms.

In an effort to display something of the character of these essays, which are remarkably consistent in tone and method, I will focus on just one theme central to Fine's work: Meno's paradox of inquiry.

Given her interwoven interests, it is unsurprising that Fine has returned again and again to Meno's paradox of inquiry. If we accede to a widely accepted though nonetheless controversial way of viewing the chronology of Plato's dialogues, according to which they divide roughly into four phases, the Socratic, transitional or early Platonic, middle Platonic, and late Platonic (endorsed by Fine on 1 n. 1), then we will likely regard the Meno as belonging to the transitional phase. Indeed, whatever our scholarly predilections, it is easy to read the Meno as transitional in a thematic sense, in that it begins, in keeping with a series of other short, aporetic dialogues, by presenting Socrates as inquiring together with an interlocutor into the nature of virtue (aretê), but then shifts abruptly to a broadly methodological question about the success conditions of any such inquiry. That is, after posing what we may call his 'What is F-ness?' question regarding the nature of virtue, the dialogue gives way to a broadly epistemic inquiry into the demands of knowledge acquisition. How, demands Meno, after being schooled by the sting of Socratic elenctic refutation, can we possibly succeed in providing the answer sought (Meno, 80d)? After all, if we know the answer, we will have no need to inquire. On the other hand, if we do not know the answer, then we will hardly be in a position to recognize it as such should we happen to stumble upon it. So, the Socratic impulse for analysis is doomed from the outset: it is either unnecessary or bound to fail.

Meno's paradox of inquiry serves as a crux for Fine's Platonic investigations for at least two reasons. First, it raises a deep and perplexing question about the hopes and aspirations of philosophical analysis, of the sort practiced by Socrates and Plato, as indeed it has been practiced, in one guise or another, by most of the rest of the tradition they inaugurated, down even to the present day. What is it, precisely, that Socrates hopes to achieve in posing his 'What is F-ness?' question? Second, and more importantly, however we answer the first question, it is plain that Socrates is here as elsewhere in the early dialogues holding out for an answer which demonstrably crosses some specifiable epistemic threshold. That is, if I intend to satisfy Socrates, I cannot say that being virtuous simply means trying to be a decent sort of a person, always doing what I can to identify the right course of action and then proceeding accordingly. He will surely want to know what being decent requires, or what it is that makes something right in this or that context; and he will want to learn my reasons or justifications for believing the things I do, or, more generally, he will want me to offer an explanation which shows my beliefs about what is right are moored to the truth by some satisfactory linkage. He will want, in short, to ascertain whether I have knowledge (or, as some would prefer, understanding, epistêmê)[1] instead of mere belief (doxa), where my having knowledge will minimally implicate me in having a capacity beyond my being able merely to report clearly and accurately what I happen to think.

Thus Meno's paradox of inquiry involves inter alia a demand from Plato for a characterization of the standard presumed by any poser of the 'What is F-ness?' question. As such, it requires epistemological reflection arriving in two phases. First, what standard must be achieved if we are to move from mere true belief to knowledge (epistêmê), or, indeed, if we are to follow Meno's attitude towards Socrates' protestations of ignorance, from total ignorance to knowledge? Second, and we should appreciate that this is a distinct if intimately related question, when we apply the 'what is F-ness?' question to epistêmê itself, what can we offer by way of analysis? That is, we have already been assuming, perhaps justifiably, that epistêmê is not the same as true belief. How was it, in the first instance, that we came to know any such thing? Looked at this way, Plato is simultaneously engaged in two, overlapping questions, one primarily analytical, fully in keeping with the Socratic tendency to ask the 'What is F-ness?' question, and another not directly analytical but instead probing the standards of epistemic normativity.

This second question is important for assessing Fine's approach to Meno's paradox of inquiry, insofar as she understands Plato's solution to turn crucially on the applicability of this sort of norm: 'Indeed, one of his main projects is to distinguish knowledge from both belief as such (whether true or false) and from true belief in particular, and to explain why knowledge is both more valuable and more difficult to achieve' (4-5), where knowledge, unlike belief, is thus conceived as a 'high-level cognitive condition' (3).

Looked at from Fine's perspective, then, we should not be surprised by Plato's response to Meno's paradox of inquiry: he merely distinguishes knowledge from true belief and then shows how one may begin in belief but end in the more exalted position. This paradox is in fact first posed rather discursively by Meno (80d5-8), but then regimented by Socrates into a crisp dilemma (80e1-6): (1) For all x, either S knows x or not; (2) If S knows x, S cannot inquire into x; (3) If S does not know x, then S cannot inquire into x; hence, (4) For all x, S cannot inquire into x. If S is any arbitrary inquirer, then for any x unknown by S, S should not waste her time with x.

Plato's response to this dilemma has occasioned perplexity. To begin, he derides it as a bit of eristic (80e1), implying that it relies on a slippery trick or some sort of equivocation. [2] As Fine is aware (52-3), about that much he is surely correct: if (2) has any chance of being true then 'know' must mean something like 'knows all about x', whereas if (3) has a prayer, 'does not know' must mean not 'does not know all about x' but rather 'does not know anything about x' with the result that either (2) is true and (3) is false, or (3) is true and (2) is false, or, if we give both (2) and (3) true readings, then (1) is false and not the instance of the excluded middle it may have first seemed to be. So much is fair enough. One puzzle about Plato's response, though, is precisely that he does not -- after indicating that he regards the eristic version of Meno's paradox as guilty of some such fallacy -- provide this sort of diagnosis. Instead, he launches into a report of a story handed down to us by some unnamed priests and priestesses to the effect that the soul is immortal and has already learnt everything, so that it can recollect what it does not have present to mind when asked (Meno 85c-d). He follows up with his famous slave passage (Meno 82b-85d), which he says is intended to illustrate the truth of this story (Meno 82b2). His doing so is both surprising in its own terms, and, it would seem, unnecessary in the context. To begin, Plato's story about the priests and priestesses deploys excessively heavy artillery, namely the immortality of the soul and the doctrine of learning as recollection, to turn back an already disarmed threat. If the slave passage shows these stories to be correct, then it too presupposes both the doctrine of recollection and the pre-natal existence of the soul, just as Plato claims it does (85d9-86b4). If we add to this already heavy arsenal a claim made only later, in the Phaedo, that the doctrine of recollection stands or falls together with the theory of Forms (76c7-d7), then we may well be left wondering why Plato did not simply unmask the equivocation and rejoin his inquiry into virtue. In any event, if the argument is fallacious, and Plato knows that this is so, then it is unclear why he should regard it as an impediment to an inquiry into virtue or any other topic of analysis.

The puzzles do not, however, end there. On the contrary, when we are confronted with Plato's response to Meno's paradox of inquiry, we are presented with a series of interlocking perplexities. The first we have already seen: why does he not simply dispatch the dilemma, as he indicates he is entitled to do, by putting its fallacy on display? Second, why does Plato need, or think he needs, the doctrine of recollection in order to turn back the dilemma? Does he think he needs it? If he does need it, or think that he needs it, which premise is it intended to overturn? Finally, what is the relation between the doctrine of recollection and the elenctic response provided in the slave passage? Plato concludes that passage by once again adverting to the doctrine of recollection (Meno 85d9-86b4), but it is not clear that he has any need to do so.

More to the point, if Fine is correct about Plato's response to Meno's paradox, then it is not at first transparent why Plato should proceed as he does. Many scholars understand Plato to be rejecting the second premise (2), that if S knows x, S cannot inquire into x. Fine disagrees, in part because she envisages messy consequences for this strategy, including most prominently that it seems to saddle those wishing to inquire with the significant epistemic burden of having to know some things before their inquiry becomes possible. As Fine presents the matter, Plato's response is simple and direct: he rejects premise (3), the claim that if S does not know x, then S cannot inquire into x. His rejection turns crucially, and correctly, on the observation that knowledge is not true belief. Surely, she suggests, the slave passage amply illustrates that we can grope our way forward when we have true opinion in the absence of knowledge. This is, moreover, how knowledge progresses across a host of domains. So much, maintains Fine, is the ultimate purport of the slave passage: the slave boy moves from doxa to epistêmê through the progression of an orderly elenchus.[3]

It is, however, a testament to the abiding appeal of Fine's hermeneutical methodology that her unblinking and direct presentation of the issues betrays a thoroughness and measured appreciation of the complexity of her texts which may not be immediately apparent. To see this, we may consider her seemingly deflationary response to Meno's paradox in light of the problems of interpretation we have identified.

Working backwards, if Plato simply wants to reject (3) by showing how it is possible to move from true belief to knowledge, why does he need (or think he needs) to deploy the theory of recollection? Is this not overkill? 'I suggest that the theory of recollection is introduced, not as a direct reply to the paradox (the elenctic reply plays that role), but to explain certain facts assumed in the elenctic reply' (62). The doctrine of recollection helps to explain an otherwise inexplicable fact about any elenctic-induced transition from doxa to epistêmê, namely that we somehow seem able to navigate our way by relying primarily on those beliefs which happen to be true -- primarily but not exclusively since, as the slave passage itself makes clear, false beliefs play a significant heuristic role in any journey towards epistêmê. Looked at that way, Plato's rejection of (3) is an adequate sort of response to Meno's paradox in broad outline, but is at the same time a shell of a response, plainly in need of further specification and development. As Fine reads him, one part of Plato's response augments and helps to secure the other. Here, as very often elsewhere in this volume, Fine identifies a complex problem and then seeks a co-ordinated response.

Still, allowing that much, we are left with our first puzzle, as to why Meno's paradox of inquiry occasions more than a curt dismissal. Fine does not address this concern directly (though cf. 52 n. 22). One is left wondering, then, whether the paradox is introduced as a mere pretext, as a springboard for epistemological and methodological theses which Plato is otherwise keen to advance. In any event, it is hard to credit the suggestion that the lameness of the argument simply escaped Plato's notice. If that is so, then the thought that the doctrine of recollection provides needed augmentation for the elenctic slave passage, even if correct, begins to seem unduly selective. Perhaps, though, to ask for this much co-ordination is to ask too much: no interpretation ties up every loose end. In this sense, Fine's presentation of these issues has the happy effect of leaving her reader wanting more.

Fine's treatment of Meno's paradox of inquiry merits discussion in the current context not only because of its intrinsic interest but because it so clearly typifies the distinctive form of philosophical scholarship she practices throughout these papers. They are without exception characterized by an enviable clarity, a transparent seriousness of purpose, and an animating love for Platonic philosophy which cannot but prove contagious. To be sure, in surveying the many responses to Fine's work, it grows quickly clear that the contagion has often manifested itself in the form of scholarly dissent, at times rather pronounced. This is, however, in the end a continuing tribute to the force and vivacity evinced in these papers. People respond to Fine because she has something to say; and what she has to say she says forthrightly, with never a hint of the cagey opacity characteristic of so much Platonic scholarship. Fine offers her texts, her critics, and her readers alike the courtesy of a welcome and uncommon intellectual candor.[4]


[1] The choice in diction reflects more than a minor matter of translation. It has to some extent come to encode a larger question concerning the degree to which we should or should not treat Plato's concerns in such dialogues as the Meno or Theaetetus as continuous with the varied enterprises of contemporary epistemology. Fine sees strong forms of continuity (hence, "knowledge"), where some other scholars have wanted to distance Plato from what they regard as the distorting lens of contemporary preoccupation. See, for example, A. Nehamas, 'Meno's Paradox and Socrates as a Teacher,' Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy III (1985), 1-30. The issue is taken up by Fine in another paper on the Meno, published after the appearance of the collection under review, 'Knowledge and True Belief in the Meno,' Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy XXVII (2004), 41-81.

[2] It is sometimes suggested that this worry is not legitimate, since Socrates does not mean to assail the argument as fallacious. After all, his calling it 'eristic' might merely be a remark about its provenance and not about its structural features: those in the Megarian School associated with Euclides were known, somewhat derisively, as 'the Eristics' (D.L. 2 106). This is unpersuasive, however, inasmuch as it mainly postpones the question, since the Megarian School was called eristic precisely because of the fondness of some of its members, evidently including Euboulides, for propounding equivocal arguments. On Plato's use of 'eristic', see Lysis 211b6-c2.

[3] For some doubts about the degree to which we should regard the slave passage as an instance of the elenchus, see G. Vlastos, Socrates: Ironist and Moral Philosopher (Cornell: 1991), 119-120.

[4] I thank Lesley Brown for her characteristically astute comments on a draft of this review.