2005.09.08

François Recanati

Literal Meaning

François Recanati, Literal Meaning, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 188pp, $22.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521537363.

Reviewed by Jason Stanley, Rutgers University


In philosophy, the Twentieth Century began with the thought that the context-dependence and vagueness of natural language undermined the possibility of providing a systematic account of the meaning of natural language sentences. Philosophical reflection on language continued through its middle period with an even more explicit emphasis on the unsystematic character of language. But then Paul Grice showed how to explain some of the unruly effects of context on linguistic communication by appeal to general conversational principles. From the other direction, Richard Montague and his students showed that much of what appeared to be unsystematic was in fact explicable. Indeed, Montague and his coterie approached this task using the tools developed by the descendants of the very philosophers who had despaired of the possibility of providing a rigorous semantics for natural language. As syntax and semantics became increasingly sophisticated, vagueness and context-dependence became objects of formal study, rather than phenomena whose existence demonstrated the impossibility of such work. From the perspective of those fluent with the tools of Chomsky, Grice, and Montague, conclusions from premises about the unsystematic nature of natural language began to look a bit like a previous era's skepticism about the possibility of a systematic physical theory of the universe.

It is somewhat surprising, then, that philosophy of language in the Twentieth Century, and the beginning of the Twenty-First, has been dominated by a wealth of papers and books seeking to return us to the pessimistic conclusions of the past. François Recanati is one of the major figures in this literature. In Recanati (1993, pp. 227-274), he argued that what is intuitively said by an utterance is affected by context in ways that could not be explained by any combination of Chomsky, Montague and Grice (that is, ordinary syntax and semantics, together with Gricean pragmatics). Since the publication of that work, he has been developing this thesis in detail. His arguments for the thesis he calls contextualism are brought together in characteristically clear and concise form in Literal Meaning. According to contextualism (p. 4), "… the contrast between what a speaker means and what she says is illusory, and the notion of 'what the sentence says' is incoherent." Literal Meaning is devoted to defending the thesis of contextualism against rival views, and exploring some of its consequences for particular linguistic phenomena.

For Grice, implicating a proposition was a species of conscious intentional action. A speaker uses a sentence, and thereby intentionally expresses one proposition in order to implicate another. For Grice, then, speakers are aware of the propositions they express when they utter sentences. But according to Recanati's Contextualism, virtually any proposition we are aware of asserting is one that is thoroughly affected by what he calls "primary pragmatic processes". So Recanati holds that Grice's notion of what is said by an utterance (the input to implicature) is a thoroughly non-semantic notion.

There are a number of other theorists who agree with Recanati that Grice's notion of what is said by an utterance cannot be what is delivered by a systematic semantic theory. First, there are other contextualists. Relevance Theorists, such as Robyn Carston, Dan Sperber, and Dierdre Wilson, agree with Recanati that any notion of what is said is thoroughly pragmatic in nature. Relevance theorists also believe that there is a systematic account of the sort of pragmatic inferences by means of which interpreters grasp what is said in context. Other contextualists, such as John Searle and Charles Travis, are grim pessimists who reject the possibility of any such systematic account. Then, there is an apparently non-contextualist position, which Recanati calls The Syncretic View. Adherents of the Syncretic View agree with contextualists that what speakers consciously intend to express by their utterances is not usually the semantic content of the sentences uttered (even relative to that context of use). But adherents of the Syncretic View nevertheless maintain that sentences, relative to a context of use, do have a semantic content, and that the fact that they do is in some sense important for the theory of meaning. Both contextualists and adherents of the Syncretic View agree, however, that what is consciously available to the speaker as what she primarily intended to express by her utterance is not in general what is delivered by the semantic interpretation of the sentence she uttered (even relative to that context of use).

The Syncretic View is a position particularly popular among philosophers of language, in part for sociological reasons. Philosophy of Language in the 1980s was dominated by disputes between Millians, who held that the semantic content of a name is exhausted by the object in the world to which it referred, and those who maintained that there is some other semantic content associated with a name, e.g. a mode of presentation of the object to which that name referred. Millians in the 1980s defended the thesis that the semantic content of the sentence "Hesperus is Phosphorus" (relative to a context of use) expresses the same proposition as the semantic content of the sentence "Hesperus is Hesperus", despite our inclination to believe otherwise. Similarly, Millians believed that "John believes that Hesperus is Phosphorus" expresses the same proposition, relative to a context of use, as "John believes that Hesperus is Hesperus", despite the fact that ordinary speakers who assertively utter the first generally believe that they are saying something different from what they would be saying if they had uttered the second. So Millians are antecedently committed to the Syncretic View, since they think that sentences do express semantic contents, and that the semantic content a sentence has relative to a context can be quite distinct from the content the speaker intends to assert (or thinks she asserts) by her utterance of that sentence in that context. Those who upheld the Millian line in the 1980s have spent some portion of the ensuing period defending their Syncretic commitments (see the work of Nathan Salmon and Scott Soames). But Millians and their descendants are not the only defenders of the Syncretic View among philosophers. Kent Bach has argued for years for a certain version of the Syncretic View, where the semantic content of many sentences, even relative to a context of use, is not a full proposition. Most recently, Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore have argued for a version of the Syncretic View, where semantic contents of sentences are always propositional.

Recanati devotes the third chapter of his book to comparing and contrasting his view with relevance theory, and the fourth chapter to criticizing the Syncretic View; I shall discuss only the latter chapter here. Advocates of the Syncretic View hold that the proposition intuitively expressed by an utterance is only rarely the semantic content of the sentence relative to the context of utterance (King and Stanley (2005) call the Syncretic View semantic modesty). The central problem for the Syncretic View is that the notion of semantic content appealed to in the theory threatens to be an idle wheel in an explanation of linguistic practice. King and Stanley (2005) argue, as against those who think that complex expressions have characters in the sense of David Kaplan (roughly standing linguistic meanings), that the characters of complex expressions play no explanatory role in an account of meaning that cannot be played simply be appealing to the characters of lexical items and the syntactic structure of sentences. Borrowing this line of thought, Recanati argues (p. 64) that what work is done by postulating the minimal proposition expressed by a sentence in a context can be done simply by appeal to the contents of individual words relative to that context, and the syntactic structure of the sentence.

I am no fan of the Syncretic View. Furthermore, as will become clear below, I suspect that Syncretism is not so different from Recanati's favored version of the thesis he calls "contextualism". Nevertheless, I suspect that Recanati cannot straightforwardly borrow King and Stanley's criticism of the view that complex expressions have characters as an objection to all forms of the Syncretic view. For King and Stanley's point is that (e.g.) sentence-level characters play no role in a semantic theory. In particular, King and Stanley assert that there are no operators that take sentence-level characters as objects. In contrast, some advocates of the Syncretic View presumably do think that there are operators that take minimal propositions as objects. I suspect that Nathan Salmon and Scott Soames (or at least relevant time-slices of them) think that modal operators such as "it is necessary that" and "it is possible that" take minimal propositions as objects. This suggests that the minimal proposition does some semantic work on some versions of the Syncretic View. [1]

There are two versions of the Syncretic View. According to the first version, which I will call propositional Syncretism, semantic contents of sentences in contexts are always propositions, but not usually the propositions the users of those sentences intend primarily to assert. Rather, semantic contents are generally "minimal propositions" (as in the work of Cappelen and Lepore (2005)). According to the second version, which I shall call non-propositional syncretism, semantic contents of sentences in context are occasionally non-propositional (as in Bach's work). Recanati provides some persuasive criticisms of propositional syncretism. For example, according to what Recanati calls the "common denominator" approach to the minimal proposition, the semantic content of a sentence S in context c is what would be asserted and conveyed in every normal context c' in which the reference of all indexicals in s is the same as their reference in c (see Soames (2002, p. 106)). [2] The common denominator approach is behind all recent presentations of propositional syncretism (see Soames (2002, pp. 56-63), Cappelen and Lepore (2005, p. 57, p. 143)). The idea behind the common denominator approach is that the semantic content of a sentence relative to a context is the minimal propositional information that is asserted by an utterance of that sentence, relative to those particular semantically relevant contextual features. Recanati argues that this characterization of semantic content will not help the propositional syncretist identify a "minimal" proposition consistently with maintaining some of the positions characteristic of the Syncretic View.

Here is an example not discussed by Recanati, but which serves to make some of the same points he does. Many advocates of (either version of) the Syncretic View hold that quantifier domain restriction does not affect the proposition semantically expressed by a sentence relative to a context (though Soames is silent on this matter). If so, then the proposition semantically expressed by "Every bottle is in the fridge", relative to any context, is the false proposition that every bottle in the entire universe is in the fridge. But this false proposition is never asserted or conveyed by an utterance of "Every bottle is in the fridge". Thus, this characterization of semantic content is inconsistent with the view, advocated by so many adherents of the Syncretic View, that domain restriction is semantically inert. The problem with using this version of the common denominator characterization of the minimal proposition is that it threatens to deliver the desired minimalist result only when "the asserted content is richer than the alleged semantic content" (Recanati (2004, p. 60)). But there are many cases (such as many cases of domain restriction) in which the semantic content, according to the advocate of the Syncretic View, is never itself asserted.

A natural response to these sorts of worries with the common denominator approach to the minimal proposition is to give up the view that the speaker must assert or intend to convey the minimal proposition, and seek some other relationship between the semantic content of a sentence relative to a context, and the information asserted by an utterance of that sentence. Indeed, Scott Soames, the target of much of Chapter 4 of Literal Meaning, has recently done just this, abandoning his earlier conception of the relation between the two levels for reasons somewhat similar to the ones given above (Soames (2005)). In its place, Soames adopts a conception of the relation between the semantic content of a sentence in context and its asserted content that permits the semantic content of a sentence in context to be less than fully propositional (in which case, it is not a suitable candidate for a content to be asserted at all).

On Soames's new view (Soames (2005)), the semantic content of a sentence in context may be a "propositional matrix". The relation between the asserted content and the semantic content of a sentence in context is that the former must be "an acceptable completion" of the latter (Ibid., p. 365). This is an instance of non-propositional syncretism. Non-propositional syncretism, which allows semantic contents of sentences in contexts to be at least sometimes non-propositional entities, is close to Recanati's own position (2004, p. 56) that "semantic interpretation, characterized by its deductive character, does not deliver complete propositions; it delivers only semantic schemata -- propositional functions, to use Russell's phrase." Non-propositional syncretism and contextualism agree both in the thesis that semantic contents of sentences relative to contexts are often too underspecified to be propositional, and in the thesis that whatever is consciously available to the speaker as what she primarily intends to assert is not usually the semantic interpretation of the sentence uttered in that context. The two positions therefore have a great deal of similarity.

It is true that Recanati describes his position as one in which "the notion of 'what a sentence says' is incoherent", suggesting that he thinks there is something wrong in principle with taking his non-propositional semantic schemata to be "what a sentence says", whereas a non-propositional syncretist such as Kent Bach seems happy with taking propositional radicals to be what is said by a sentence. But this distinction is merely terminological. Another difference, I suspect, is that Recanati believes that very few if any sentences, relative to contexts, have propositions as semantic contents (e.g. Recanati (2004, p. 90)), whereas advocates of non-propositional syncretism such as Kent Bach and Scott Soames think that quite a number of sentences have propositional semantic contents in context. However these positions lie upon the same continuum, and not (when one considers the degree of apparent contextual underspecification in language) very distant ones at that. The similarities between non-propositional syncretism and contextualism far outweigh their differences.

I have suggested that there is not a great deal of space between non-propositional syncretism and Recanati's favored version of contextualism. What, then, of propositional syncretism? Recanati's discussion of Soames, as well as Soames's subsequent advocacy of non-propositional syncretism, suggests that propositional syncretism is a difficult position to maintain. It is a matter of extreme difficulty to isolate the minimal proposition that is supposed to be the semantic content of a sentence in context. Cappelen and Lepore (2005) have provided an influential recent defense of propositional syncretism. Unfortunately, they do not say enough about the crucial question of how to isolate the minimal proposition. One suggestion they develop involves "[identifying] tests that help the theorist focus on the speech act content that a wide range of utterances of S have in common." (p. 57) However, as Recanati and Soames (2005) emphasize, it is unlikely that the minimal proposition expressed will be something the speaker ever intends to assert, and so it is unlikely that the minimal proposition will be a part of speech act content. In another passage, Cappelen and Lepore suggest (p. 143):

The semantic content of a sentence S is the content that all utterances of S

share. It is the content that all utterances of S express no matter how different their contexts of utterance are. It is also the content that can be grasped and reported by someone who is ignorant about the relevant characteristics of the context in which an utterance of S took place.

This passage is rather unclear. Is it the content that all assertions of S express, no matter how different their contexts of utterance? If so, "every bottle is in the fridge" has no semantic content relative to any context, since there is no one proposition that is asserted by every utterance of the sentence (and certainly not, as we have seen, the proposition that every bottle in the universe is in the fridge, since this is never asserted). If the common content of all utterances of a certain sentence is not the content of any genuine speech act, what is the motivation for thinking that common contents are always genuine propositions, rather than just Recanati's "semantic schemata"? After all, the main reason to think that the common contents are propositional is that they can be "claimed, asserted, questioned, investigated" (Cappelen and Lepore, p. 152). Once one sees that the common minimal contents are not the things claimed, asserted, questioned, or investigated, there is little motivation for believing them always to be propositions.

I share Recanati's skepticism that one can always isolate a common propositional content that can serve as the minimal content, consistently with other syncretic commitments. Furthermore, even if the propositional syncretist were to assign common minimal propositional contents to each sentence in context via some artificial method, they would play no more a role in an account of communication than non-propositional entities such as semantic schemata. For such contents, though propositional, would no more plausibly be objects of intentional actions such as assertions, questions, or commands than schemata. So there is no important difference for the theory of meaning between propositional syncretism and non-propositional syncretism. I have already mentioned my suspicion that there is no great difference between non-propositional syncretism and Recanati's contextualism. My suspicion is therefore that the most important disputes in the theory of meaning are not between contextualism and syncretism, or even between advocates of these doctrines and semantic skeptics, such as Charles Travis. Rather, the genuinely important disputes in the theory of meaning are between those who maintain that the contents primarily asserted by speakers are not generally the semantic contents of the sentences they use (even relative to those contexts), and those who maintain that the contents primarily asserted by speakers are generally (not always, but typically) the semantic contents of the sentences used (relative to those contexts).

One worry with the position that speakers do not usually mean what their sentences express is that the intuitive distinction between literal meaning and non-literal meaning threatens to break down; the position seems to imply that we usually speak non-literally. In the fifth chapter, Recanati addresses this concern by arguing that there are two distinct literal/non-literal distinctions that are conflated by this worry. One can allow that speakers usually mean something different from the semantic content of the sentences they use, without endorsing the thesis that speakers usually mean something different from what speakers in those situations would normally mean by the use of those sentences. By rejecting the "tacit assumption" that the semantic content of a sentence in context is what that sentence is usually used to say (p. 81), the contextualist (or advocate of the syncretic view) frees herself from the problematic consequence that we usually speak non-literally.

The sixth chapter of Literal Meaning is devoted to setting up Recanati's arguments against the thesis he calls indexicalism. The semantic content of a sentence relative to a context is the result of combining the referential contents of the parts of that sentence, relative to that context, in accord with the composition rules determined by the syntactic structure of the sentence. Literalism is the implausible view that the intuitive truth-conditions of sentences relative to contexts are both the semantic contents of those sentences in the above sense, and determined entirely by rules of the language, independently of speaker's intentions. So for the literalist, the model for context-sensitivity is indexicals such as "I" and "today", whose denotation in context is fixed independently of speaker intentions. The indexicalist also holds that the contents primarily asserted by speakers are generally the semantic contents of the sentences they use. The indexicalist hypothesis, like that of the literalist, is that the only way context affects the intuitive truth-conditions of an utterance is by helping to determine the interpretation of an element in the sentence used. In the vocabulary of King and Stanley (2005), the indexicalist makes the empirical claim that there are no "strong pragmatic effects" on intuitive truth-conditions; in Recanati's terminology, there are no "top down influences". Also like the literalist, the indexicalist rejects the existence of a substantial gap between the content a speaker primarily asserts when she utters a sentence, and the semantic content of that sentence, relative to that context of use. Unlike the literalist, however, the indexicalist recognizes that many context-sensitive expressions have their semantic contents fixed in part by reference to speaker intentions. Indexicalism is the plausible surviving descendant of literalism.

Why believe the indexicalist hypothesis? Recanati finds excluding "top-down" or "strong" pragmatic effects on intuitive truth-conditions "as dogmatic and stipulative as the literalist restriction of context-sensitivity to a short list of familiar indexical expressions" (p. 160). But the indexicalist claim is an empirical hypothesis, not a stipulation about content. Furthermore, it is an empirical hypothesis that has a reasonable basis. There are special concerns with appeal to strong pragmatic effects. Linguistic communication is rule-governed and convention-bound in a way that would be mysterious, if there were strong pragmatic effects on intuitive truth-conditions.

There is both a very specific way to make this point, and a more general way. The specific way to make this point is via the problem of over-generation (Stanley (2002b)). An utterance of (1) can be used to express what an utterance of (2) would have expressed. But an utterance of (1) cannot be used to express what an utterance of (3) expresses:

(1) Every Frenchman is seated.

(2) Every Frenchman in the classroom is seated.

(3) Every Frenchman or Dutchman is seated.

The fact that (1) cannot be used to express (3) suggests that there is a conventional mechanism underlying the phenomenon of domain restriction. It is because of the conventional mechanism underlying domain restriction that certain sentences cannot be used to express certain propositions. In contrast, if interpreters had recourse to free pragmatic enrichment as a way of interpreting others, and speakers were aware that interpreters had recourse to this, then one should be able to use (1) to express (3). The fact that one cannot suggests that there are conventional linguistic mechanisms that govern permissible interpretations of the domain of quantified noun phrases.

If the literalist conception of language were correct, speaking would be an extremely effective means of communicating a particular message, but also rather unwieldy and impractical. It would take too long to find all the right words. But if the contextualist conception were correct, one might worry that speaking would be thoroughly unnecessary for efficient communication. The indexicalist's position is a plausible starting hypothesis for how language is able to be sufficiently elastic as to be usable, and sufficiently rule-governed as to be useful. It is a reasonable empirical hypothesis, in advance of detailed inquiry.

Recanati (2004, pp. 89-90) believes that the indexicalist starts off in a considerably weaker dialectical position than the contextualist:

Without going into the details, it is fair to say that the indexicalist starts with a significant disadvantage; for he makes a universal claim while his opponent only makes an existential claim. For his opponent to win, it is sufficient to produce one convincing example of a strong pragmatic effect. But the indexicalist is condemned to deal with all putative cases, and to show that they are not what they seem to be.

Recanati misstates the dialectical situation. The contextualist's method for arguing against indexicalism is to produce a reading R of an utterance of a sentence S, and argue that R is not the result of the semantic interpretation of S, relative to the context of utterance. In each such case, there are three different responses available to the indexicalist:

(a) The first option is to establish that the alleged reading is not part of the intuitive truth-conditions of an utterance of that sentence, but is instead due to the pragmatics.

(b) The second option is to argue that the claim that reading R is not due to the semantics is due to an overly simplistic conception of the semantic content of some elements of S. When the correct semantics for the relevant expression is given, the reading does emerge from the semantics.

(c) The third option is to argue that the claim that reading R is not to the semantics is due to an overly simplistic conception of the syntactic structure of

S.

The advocate of strong pragmatic effects on intuitive truth-conditions must produce a case, and show that none of these options are available for that case. For each putative case in which it can be persuasively argued that (a) is not an option, the contextualist (or advocate of the syncretic view) must establish that there is no way of accounting for the problematic reading within the semantics. From this perspective, it is the contextualist who makes a universal claim. As Stephen Levinson (2000, p. 214) writes, "There will always be doubts about whether a better semantic analysis of the relevant construction might not accommodate the apparent pragmatic intrusions in some other way."

Establishing the existence of strong pragmatic effects on intuitive truth-conditions by appeal to particular examples is therefore no easy task. But Recanati does not rest his entire case on arguing that particular examples cannot be handled within the semantics. In the beginning of Chapter 7, he also provides a more theoretical argument for the existence of strong pragmatic effects, by appeal to his Optionality Criterion (2004, p. 101):

Optionality Criterion

Whenever a contextual ingredient of content is provided through a pragmatic process of the optional variety, we can imagine another possible context of utterance in which no such ingredient is provided yet the utterance expresses a complete proposition.

Recanati claims that the Optionality Criterion "… gives us a criterion for telling apart cases in which a contextual ingredient results from saturation and cases in which it does not" (p. 100). As an example, Recanati argues that the provision of a location to an utterance of "It's raining" is a strong pragmatic effect. Recanati envisages a case (pp. 9-10) in which "rain has become extremely rare and important, and rain detectors have been disposed all over the territory (whatever the territory -- possibly the whole Earth)." When the rain detector goes off, and someone shouts "It's raining!" what she expresses is that it is raining somewhere or other. According to Recanati, this is a case in which no location has been contextually provided. As Recanati comments (p. 101)

Using the Optionality Criterion, however, I have established that the location of rain is not provided through saturation; for there are contexts in which the sentence 'It is raining' expresses a complete proposition, even though no location is contextually provided as that which the utterance concerns" (p. 101).

Unfortunately, Recanati's reasoning here is fallacious. The Optionality Criterion is a universally quantified conditional. It tells us that when we have a contextual ingredient of content that is provided though a pragmatic process of the optional variety, then Q is true, Q being that the utterance can be used to express a complete proposition even when no such ingredient is provided. But one cannot conclude from the fact that Q is true (that "it is raining" can be used to express a complete proposition, even though no location is contextually provided) that the antecedent is true, that the location is not provided through saturation. To do so would be to commit the fallacy of affirming the consequent. Yet that it is just what Recanati infers from the Optionality Criterion, together with the premise that "It is raining" can be used to express a complete proposition, when no location is provided.

What Recanati requires for his argument, instead of the Optionality Criterion, is the following principle:

The Optionality Criterion*

Whenever a contextual ingredient of content is provided, and we can imagine another possible context of utterance in which no such ingredient is provided yet the utterance expresses a complete proposition, then the contextual ingredient of content is provided by a pragmatic process of the optional variety.

The Optionality Criterion does not seem particularly objectionable; if an element has been provided by a pragmatic process of the optional variety, then it shouldn't be necessary to provide it for the utterance to express a complete proposition. This principle is, however, utterly useless in helping to distinguish between cases in which a contextual ingredient is provided through saturation (a non-optional process) and when it is provided through an optional pragmatic process. What Recanati requires is the considerably stronger Optionality Criterion*. But unlike the Optionality Criterion, there is no compelling reason to believe the Optionality Criterion*.

There is no reason in principle to accept the Optionality Criterion*. Suppose that there were unpronounced elements in the syntactic structure of a sentence that, like the overt English pronouns "he", "she", and "it", could be used to refer to different contents on different occasions of use. Suppose that these elements, again like the overt English pronouns "he", "she", and "it", could also be bound by unpronounced existential quantifiers, as the overt English pronouns "he", "she", and "it" can be bound by the overt quantifiers "someone" or "something". In other words, suppose that in addition to overt pronouns and quantifiers, natural languages had a system of unpronounced pronouns and quantifiers. Presumably, it would be a language-specific matter which pronouns were pronounced; for example, in certain Romance languages (so called "pro-drop" languages), the pronominal subjects of verbs do not need to be pronounced, though they are still syntactically active. This does not seem to be a particularly surprising or radical hypothesis. Indeed, it is the most conservative hypothesis governing the postulation of covert structure; that covert structure behaves like overt structure. Nevertheless, it is inconsistent with the Optionality Criterion*. For in such a language, we would see contextual ingredients of content provided through a pragmatic process of the non-optional variety (saturation), yet utterances of the relevant overt sentences could be used to express complete propositions, even when no such ingredient is provided. In the latter kind of situation, the unpronounced pronoun would be existentially closed by an unpronounced existential operator. [3]

There is no a priori reason to accept the Optionality Criterion*; there are easily conceivable accounts that are inconsistent with it. More worrisomely, there are widely accepted accounts of various phenomena that are inconsistent with it. For example, a consensus has developed in much of recent linguistics that tenses are not operators, but are rather predicates of times. In a sentence such as "John closed the door", the past tense morpheme is best understood as a predicate of a contextually provided time, rather than as an operator. One piece of evidence for this conclusion is that tenses do not automatically iterate. For example, "Yesterday, John closed the door" does not mean that in the past of yesterday, John closed the door. "Yesterday" and the past tense morpheme behave like predicates of a uniform, contextually provided time (see King (2003) for a nice summary of the arguments for this conclusion).

The worry for the Optionality Criterion* is that the position for the contextually provided time can also be bound. For example, the sentence "I shot a lion" can either be understood to express a proposition about a particular time (say, this morning), or be understood to express the existentially quantified proposition that at some time t in the past, I shot a lion at t. So, if the current consensus about tense is correct, then there is a pronominal element in the syntax of sentences that is assigned a time, relative to a context of use. But this pronominal element can also be existentially closed. So, when "I shot a lion" is used to express a proposition about a particular time, it is an instance of saturation. But "I shot a lion" can be used to express a complete proposition, even when no time is contextually provided. In such a case, the temporal variable is existentially closed. But, contra the Optionality Criterion*, when a specific time is provided, it is still an instance of saturation. [4]

Furthermore, even if the Optionality Criterion* were true, it wouldn't help us in practice to distinguish contextual ingredients of content that were provided through saturation, and contextual ingredients of content that were provided through optional processes. As Recanati himself points out in the case of domain restriction (pp. 101-2), it is not clear whether we should take an unrestricted reading of an utterance of a quantified sentence to be a case in which the quantified expression lacks a contextually provided domain altogether, or rather take it to have a contextually provided domain, albeit one that is maximally large. For this reason, Recanati concludes that the Optionality Criterion (actually the Optionality Criterion*) is of no use in deciding whether domains for quantifiers are provided via saturation or through a pragmatic process of the optional variety. It is curious that Recanati does not see that the very same point he makes about quantifier domain restriction also undermines his use of the Optionality Criterion* to argue that the location for utterances of "It's raining" is provided through a pragmatic process of the optional variety. For in Recanati's envisaged example, it does seem like a location is provided. The location that is provided is the whole earth (not even the whole universe). So in order to make sense of his example, there does need to be a contextually provided location. Furthermore, even if rain detectors were set up everywhere in the universe, it is not clear whether the relevant utterance of "It's raining" would have the whole universe supplied as the value of a contextual variable, or express a complete proposition in the absence of a contextually supplied location. In short, Recanati's correct argument that the Optionality Criterion* is useless in deciding in practice whether the provision of domains for quantified expressions is the result of saturation or not applies mutatis mutandis to any argument using the Optionality Criterion* that the location for an utterance of "It's raining" is provided through a pragmatic process of the optional variety.

Indeed, I suspect that the conclusions of the last paragraph can be generalized. That is, I am concerned that for every case in which there is a possible dispute between the indexicalist and the contextualist about whether a contextual ingredient is supplied through supplementation or a pragmatic process of the optional variety, similar reasoning will render the Optionality Criterion* dialectically useless in deciding the matter. If so, then not only does the Optionality Criterion* lack persuasive theoretical support, but even if we were to accept it, it would be useless in helping to adjudicate between the contextualist and the indexicalist.

In the rest of Chapter 7, Recanati turns to a criterion advocated by indexicalists for detecting the existence of covert structure, which he calls the Binding Criterion:

The Binding Criterion

A contextual ingredient in the interpretation of a sentence S results from saturation if it can be 'bound', that is, if it can be made to vary with the values introduced by some operator prefixed to S.

Using the Binding Criterion, indexicalists such as myself have argued that a variety of cases that contextualists have argued involve free pragmatic enrichment in fact involve saturation. Recanati sets out to undermine the Binding Criterion. First, he argues that the Binding Criterion would lead to an implausible multiplication of covert elements. Then, he provides a distinct semantic account of the relevant readings of the sentences in question.

Advocates of indexicalism have used the Binding Criterion in the following manner. Consider an utterance of the sentence (4), in New York City:

(4) It's raining.

Intuitively, this utterance expresses the proposition that it is raining in New York City. One might think that this is an instance in which the location of raining is provided by means of an 'optional' pragmatic process, rather than via saturation. But consider:

(5) Whenever John lights a cigarette, it rains. (Stanley (2000))

Intuitively, (5) expresses the proposition that whenever John lights a cigarette, it rains at the location at which John lights a cigarette. By the Binding Criterion, then, the location is the result of the saturation of a covert pronominal element in the structure of (4).

Recanati's argument that the binding criterion leads to an implausible multiplication of covert elements centrally involves the example:

(6) Whenever John's father cooks mushrooms, John eats.

According to Recanati, "On a natural interpretation [of an utterance of this sentence], we understand that John eats the mushrooms his father has cooked." But in this example, "eats" is used intransitively. All participants in the debate agree that there is no argument place that can be bound by "whenever John's father cooks mushrooms" in the object position of "eats". So, the Binding Criterion predicts implausible covert structure.

However, as unpublished work by Luisa Marti has recently shown, Recanati's assumption that the intuitive interpretation of (6) involves binding is incorrect. (5) and (6) are not, despite appearances, analogous. Consider the discourse:

(7) A: Whenever John's father cooks mushrooms, John eats.

B: No he doesn't; curiously, he eats something else.

There is something decidedly odd about B's utterance; it certainly seems false. However, the discourse in (8) seems fine:

(8) A: Whenever John lights a cigarette, it rains.

B: No it doesn't; curiously, it rains somewhere else.

In other words, closer reflection on the content of (6) reveals that its natural interpretation is that whenever John's father cooks mushrooms, John eats something. So Recanati has not demonstrated that the Binding Criterion results in implausible multiplication of covert structure.

Recanati also provides a distinct account of the intuitive interpretation of sentences such as (5), one that does not involve postulating a variable for locations in sentences such as (4). Space considerations prevent me from providing a critique of Recanati's alternative account (which is in any case given in much greater detail in Recanati (2002)). Other contextualists and advocates of the syncretic view have appealed to the pragmatic provision of variables to explain the relevant readings of sentences such as (5). But they have not bothered to explain how the process of pragmatically providing variables to sentences is to be constrained, leading to over-generation objections far more dire than any facing the indexicalist (Stanley (2002b)). Recanati is unique among advocates of contextualism or the syncretic view in attempting to provide an alternative positive account of the data that goes beyond such pragmatic magic tricks, and so this aspect of his work is to be particularly praised. If we are to move forward on our understanding of context-sensitivity in natural language, those who criticize the indexicalist position must follow Recanati's lead in assuming the obligation of providing and defending alternative explanations of readings that are available, and those that are not.

Chapter 8 is devoted to the topic of circumstances of evaluation, in Kaplan's sense of circumstances with respect to which contents of sentences are evaluated. Recanati takes a special interest in this topic, because he sees a way of justifying his contextualist thesis that the semantic content of a sentence is something less than fully propositional. As Recanati (p. 122) writes:

Once it is admitted that we need a circumstance over and above the content to be evaluated, we can part with Frege and, following Prior, tolerate contents that are not 'semantically complete' in Frege's sense, that is, endowed with absolute truth-conditions. We can, because the circumstance is there which enables the content to be suitably completed. Thus the content of tensed sentences is semantically incomplete, yet the circumstance (the time) relative to which such a sentence is evaluated is sufficient to complete it.

The problem with Recanati's appeal to circumstances of evaluation to justify incomplete semantic contents is that it is in tension with much of current linguistic research. Most philosophers of language, and even many linguists, still accept that modals are operators of some kind (and so worlds are features of circumstances of evaluation). But, as I have indicated above, most linguists hold, contra Recanati, that tenses are not operators, and times are part of semantic content, rather than being features of circumstances of evaluation. Indeed, as King (2003) argues, the direction of research suggests that the only features of circumstances of evaluation are possible worlds. [5] Recanati must show this entire line of research to be incorrect. In particular, he must demonstrate the viability of (say) an operator account of phenomena, such as sequence of tense, which have led researchers to treat tenses as predicates of times or events. This is a substantial obstacle to Recanati's program. [6] Indeed, one way of seeing the debate between indexicalism and contextualism is that the indexicalist position is the natural descendant of the trend in linguistic theory (starting with Partee (1973)) away from operator approaches of tense, and relativity of content generally, and towards explicit syntactic representation of elements that were once thought of as features of circumstances of evaluation. If that is correct, a thoroughgoing defense of the contextualist position must establish that this trend is misguided. This is a task Recanati has yet to carry out.

In the last five years, a large amount of work has been devoted to assessing the success of giving a systematic semantic account of our intuitions about utterance content in the face of what James Higginbotham has called "the haze of use". Most philosophers have coalesced around the position that our intuitions about utterance content float free of what is linguistically determined (with the natural result that there has been a great deal of internal bickering about terminology between those who occupy essentially the same position). In this book, Recanati does an extremely impressive job of laying out the interlocking commitments of his favored version of this position. Furthermore, he faces up to these commitments more honestly than almost any other member of the debate. Instead of merely objecting to other accounts, he gives his own analyses of various constructions, which then can be judged on their own merits. I have given some reasons to be pessimistic about the position he occupies, as well as some reasons to doubt the arguments he provides for it. Nevertheless, his book is essential reading for those interested in the debate.

REFERENCES

Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie (2005): Insensitive Semantics (Oxford: Blackwell).

Cresswell, Max (1996): Semantic Indexicality (Kluwer).

Heim, Irene (1982): The Semantics of Definite and Indefinite Noun Phrases. (Amherst: University of Massachusetts dissertation).

King, Jeffrey (2003): "Tense, Modality, and Semantic Value", Language and Philosophical Linguistics, edited by J. Hawthorne and D. Zimmerman, Philosophical Perspectives 17 (Oxford: Blackwell).

King, Jeffrey and Stanley, Jason (2005): "Semantics, Pragmatics, and the Role of Semantic Content", in Z. Szabo (ed.), Semantics Versus Pragmatics (Oxford: Oxford University Press): 111-164.

Levinson, Stephen (2000): Presumptive Meanings: The Theory of Generalized Conversational Implicatures (Cambridge: MIT Press).

Partee, Barbara (1973): "Some Structural Analogies between Tenses and Pronouns in English", Journal of Philosophy 70: 601-9.

Recanati, Francois (1993): Direct Reference: From Language to Thought (Oxford: Blackwell).

Recanati, Francois (2002): "Unarticulated Constituents", Linguistics and Philosophy 25: 299-345.

Schlenker, Philippe (2003): "A Plea for Monsters". Linguistics & Philosophy 26: 29-120.

Soames, Scott (2002): Beyond Rigidity (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Soames, Scott (2005): "Naming and Asserting", in Z. Szabo (ed.), Semantics Versus Pragmatics (Oxford: Oxford University Press): 356-82.

Stanley, Jason (2000): "Context and Logical Form", Linguistics and Philosophy 23.4: 391-434.

Stanley, Jason (2002a) "Modality and What is Said", in Philosophical Perspectives 16: Language and Mind J. Tomberlin, ed. (Blackwell Press, 2002): 321-44.

Stanley, Jason (2002b) "Making it Articulated", Mind and Language 17 1&2, 2002: 149-68.

Stanley, Jason (forthcoming): Knowledge and Practical Interests (Oxford: Oxford University Press).


[1] Similarly, King and Stanley's argument against sentence-level characters would be undermined if, as Schlenker (2003) has argued, there are operators that take sentence-level characters as objects.

[2] Recanati notes correctly that I have also provided a similar characterization of the semantic content of a sentence in context, in Stanley (2002a). It never occurred to me that this kind of characterization of what is said could be used to defend the Syncretic View -- it occurs in Stanley (2002a) as a premise in a defense of a position antithetical to a number of the conclusions drawn in Soames (2002).

[3] In forthcoming work, Recanati raises the concern, presumably against a proposal of this sort, that overt pronouns are never bound by covert quantifiers. Well, this depends upon which analyses one regards as correct. On the analysis of Quantificational Variability Effects in Heim (1982), a sentence such as "A man walked in. He was wearing a hat" involves a covert existential quantifier binding both the open variable position in the indefinite "a man" and "he". Similarly, some accounts of donkey anaphora treat the "it" in "Every man who owns a donkey beats it" as bound by a covert existential quantifier associated with the verb phrase.

[4] In forthcoming work, Recanati acknowledges the threat that the standard account of tense described here has for some of his views.

[5] See Stanley (forthcoming, Chapter 7), where this point is used against relativism about content generally.

[6] I am not claiming that it is impossible to provide an operator account of sequence of tense, in the sense of an account which, by clever manipulation of various covert indexed operators, generates the right truth-conditions. Rather, my claim is that such an account would be unwieldy and ad hoc (as King (2003, pp. 219-221) points out). In particular, what results from such a framework is a proliferation of covert operators in the syntax that is considerably more cumbersome than the covert syntactic complexity which is anathema to Recanati and fellow contextualists and syncretists (see e.g. Creswell (1996) for an example of the covert structure required to support an operator account of tense). So it is hard to see how someone with a general prejudice against postulating covert structure could prefer an operator account of tense to an account involving temporal variables.