2005.09.13

Graham Priest, JC Beall, Bradley Armour-Garb (eds.)

The Law of Non-Contradiction: New Philosophical Essays

Graham Priest, JC Beall, and Bradley Armour-Garb (eds.), The Law of Non-Contradiction: New Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2004, 456pp, $85.00, ISBN 0199265178

Reviewed by Roy Cook, Villanova University


The Law of Non-Contradiction: New Philosophical Essays, edited by Graham Priest, JC Beall, and Bradley Armour-Garb, is dedicated to dialetheism -- the view that some contradictions are true (a state of affairs known as a dialetheia). Since dialetheism has, in recent years, scrounged its way from being a view easily defeated by the dreaded incredulous stare to being a major (but still sometimes ignored) contender in the contest for an adequate logical account of the semantic and set-theoretic paradoxes (or an adequate logical theory in general), the volume is to be commended merely for its existence. The fact that it contains, not just a number of good philosophers taking this view seriously, but also a lot of seriously good philosophy increases its worth.

Since the volume weighs in at over four hundred pages and contains twenty-three distinct, and very different, essays, it is impossible to do full justice to its contents here. Thus, I will merely outline the contents, pausing at appropriate points for a deeper discussion of a few of the more interesting issues.

The volume begins with an excellent introduction by JC Beall. In fewer than twenty pages Beall manages to: (1) introduce the reader to the idea that contradictions might be true and motivate this initially outlandish idea in terms of common paradoxes; (2) survey the problems with various definitions of "contradiction" and how they affect our formulation of the dialetheist thesis; (3) explain the distinction between a proposition being a (formal) contradiction (a syntactic notion, involving something like being, or being equivalent to, a proposition of the form P∧¬ P) and a proposition being 'explosive' (an inferential notion, involving the proposition entailing every other proposition); (4) explain the difference between merely paraconsistent logics (in which contradictions such as P∧¬ P are not explosive) and dialethic logics such as Priest's LP (which allow for the truth of propositions of the form P∧¬ P); (5) present a model theory for the most common dialethic logic, the aforementioned LP; and (6) discuss the various philosophical ramifications tied up with (1) through (5). As a survey of a difficult subject, Beall's introduction is a tour-de-force and should be required reading for anyone interested in true contradictions or the philosophy of logic more generally.

The first section of the volume, Setting Up the Debate, contains but one paper -- Graham Priest's "What's So Bad About Contradictions?" (The only reprint, this paper shows the subtle lie in the subtitle of the volume. Of course, perhaps the dialetheist can believe that Priest's paper both is and is not new.) This paper does not attempt to provide a positive defense of dialetheism (although the view's various theoretical virtues are mentioned along the way). Instead, Priest attempts to defuse the five most prevalent objections to dialetheism: (1) Contradictions Entail Everything (answer: not in an appropriate logic, such as LP); (2) Contradictions Cannot Be True (answer: logical arguments for this claim tend to be circular, and the inductive evidence suffices only to show that true contradictions are unlikely and uncommon -- a point Priest accepts); (3) Contradictions Cannot Be Rationally Believed (answer: the criteria governing what we should believe are constrained by more than mere consistency, and in some cases other criteria might outweigh the pull of consistency); (4) If Contradictions Were Acceptable, Then No One Could Be Rationally Criticized (answer: the acceptability of some contradictions in no way implies the acceptability of all, so some contradictions are not rationally acceptable, and their acceptance can therefore be criticized); and (5) If Contradictions Were Acceptable, Then No One Could Deny Anything (answer: If we abandon the Fregean equation of denial with assertion of negation, then we can deny Φ without asserting the negation of Φ). Priest's goal is to block the traditional refutation-by-stare response to dialetheism mentioned above and the quick two-line arguments inspired by the stare. As I hope this summary makes clear, Priest is successful -- dialetheism emerges as a serious position within the philosophy of language and logic -- no more absurd, on the face of it, than its competitors. With the possibility of quick apriori refutation eliminated, the view deserves to have its theoretical merits and drawbacks carefully examined -- a task begun in the remaining essays.

The second section of the book (What Is The LNC?) examines the status of the Law of Non-Contradiction and the claim that dialetheism amounts to a denial of the same. The Law of Non-Contradiction (hereafter, "the Law"), intuitively understood as a prohibition on the truth of a contradiction, is often expressed propositionally as ¬ (P∧¬ P). The immediate (but not only) problem is that ¬ (P∧¬ P) is a theorem of LP (while some instances might also be false). In this section Ross T. Brady, Patrick Grim, Greg Restall, R. M. Sainsbury, and Achille C. Varzi examine various means by which to formulate a definition of "contradiction" and the corresponding Law, various types of negation that might be used in these endeavors, and whether any of these do justice to the thought that dialetheism entails denying the Law. While the arguments provided here are interesting, I postpone deeper consideration of these issues until the discussion of Stewart Shapiro's paper, below.

The third section (Metholodological Issues In The Debate) contains papers examining whether dialetheism amounts to diagnosis (in the traditional sense) of the Liar paradox ("Diagnosing Dialetheism", Bradley Armour-Garb); whether logic, understood, not as a codification of the preservation of truth, but instead as a codification of the preservation of 'correct assertion', requires a dialethic logic instead of a merely paraconsistent one ("Knowledge and Non-contradiction", Bryson Brown); and how dialetheism fares within various accounts of the mechanics of logical revision ("Logical Non-apriorism And The 'Law' of Non-contradiction", Otavio Bueno and Mark Colyvan, and "Revising Logic", Michael D. Resnik).

The most interesting entry in this section, however, is the inclusion of extracts from two letters by David Lewis. The two missives, jointly titled "Letters to Beall and Priest" (Armour-Garb joined the project later) and sent in response to an invitation to contribute to the volume, explain (ironically enough) why Lewis chose to turn down the invitation, claiming that "there's really nothing much to say about [dialetheism] " (p. 176. The letters were included posthumously by permission of his widow). In the first letter Lewis argues that "To conduct a debate, one needs common ground; and in this case, the principles not in dispute are so very much less certain than non-contradiction itself that it matters little whether or not a successful defense of non-contradiction could be based on them" (p. 176). While the second letter, examining the fact that we do seem to reason about inconsistent situations, is interesting, this first letter is worth a bit more scrutiny.

At first glance one might be forgiven for assuming that Lewis's claim that there is not much to say amounts to something little better than the dreaded refutation-by-incredulous-stare, but this is not Lewis's point (nor should it be, since the term 'incredulous stare' has its origin in descriptions of standard reactions to Lewis's modal realism). Rather, Lewis is claiming that if we level the playing field, only allowing principles that classical and dialethic logicians agree on, then there is no chance for a successful defense of the Law, since any principle which might be used in such a defense is "less certain" than the Law itself. In effect, Lewis is admitting that if the question is whether the Law of Non-contradiction can be defended without mobilizing some principle or principles equivalent to (or stronger than) it, then the answer is 'no' (and presumably the dialetheist wins, although Lewis did not take the point this far). Thus, Lewis seems to have rather interesting, and controversial, views on dialetheism, especially for someone who claimed to have nothing to say on the topic.

The fourth section (Part IV: Against the LNC) contains various defenses of dialetheism. JC Beall ("True and False -- As If") argues that if we accept constructive methodological deflationism, a version of deflationism based on the idea that truth is a constructed notion, then we ought to accept the possibility of true contradictions and a dialethic logic (this has the advantage of accepting dialetheiae while suggesting that, since they result from our own constructions, they are somehow our fault, not the world's). Edwin D. Mares ("Semantic Dialetheism") defends a similar view: semantic dialetheism, where true contradictions arise as a result of a mismatch between our language and the world, and he contrasts this view with (according to him, the much less plausible) metaphysical dialetheism, where things in the world are actually inconsistent. Jay Garfield's amusing "'To Pee And Not To Pee?' Could That Be The Question? (Further Reflections Of The Dog)" outlines a position where, if we view logic as a normative account of rational inference, then our present epistemically hostile environment forces a dialethic logic upon us (it is unclear, on this picture, whether this entails the existence of true contradictions. The Dog officially "takes no position on the question of the actual consistency of the world." p. 243.) Frederick Kroon ("Realism And Dialetheism") suggests that philosophers who view dialethic discourses realistically have no reason to deny the possibility of trivialism (the view that all sentences are both true and false, more on this below), since extant arguments show, at best, that we cannot rationally believe in trivialism, not that it fails. Given the patent absurdity of trivialism, however, Kroon suggests that we adopt a fictionalist perspective towards any discourse that allows for true contradictions. Vann McGee, tracing the history of non-classical semantics from Ramsey through Van Fraasen to Kripke and Fine, demonstrates that the differences between a theorist who accepts truth-value gaps and one who allows truth-value gluts (the dialetheist) are "surprisingly inconsequential. What the gap theorist calls 'true', the gluttist calls 'non-false', and what the gapper calls 'false', the glut theorist calls 'untrue'. That's all there is to it" (p. 290).

The most novel essay here, however, is Jon Cogburn's "The Philosophical Basis Of What? The Anti-Realist Route to Dialetheism". Cogburn examines the Dummettian argument from the Recognition Thesis (the thought that understanding is intimately tied up with recognition of potential verifiers or falsifiers) to the Knowability Requirement (the thought that a claim is true if, and only if, it is verifiable). Cogburn argues that the only notion of verifiability which allows us to infer the Knowability Requirement from the Recognition Thesis (even inductively!) involves a weak notion of defeasible warrant. Since many claims will have warrants both for and against them in this weak sense, Cogburn claims that the anti-realist should be open to the existence of sentences that are both true and false.

The title of Cogburn's paper immediately suggests that these dialethic considerations will require revisions to classical logic -- revisions different from accepting standard, non-paraconsistent intuitionistic logic (the Dummettian anti-realist's usual course of action). Dummettian considerations motivate two claims -- constructivism (or intuitionism) regarding one's logic, and dialetheism regarding truth. The obvious next question, not addressed by Cogburn, is whether these two views can live together.

One problem with combining intuitionism (or constructivism) with dialetheism concerns negation. Intuitionism does not just amount merely to an abandonment of excluded middle, but instead proposes such revisions within a framework imposing very specific meanings on the connectives (in particular, negation and the conditional). The standard Henkin clause for negation is:

A verification (or warrant) for ¬Φ is a construction which, if applied to any (potential) verification of Φ, produces a verification of ⊥.

Thus, when Cogburn considers a case where we have warrants both for and against a claim C (so C is both true and false), he is too quick to conclude that this amounts to having warrants for both C and ¬C (and thus for C¬ C). In order to have a warrant for ¬ C, it is not enough that there be sufficient evidence against C, what we need is positive evidence for the claim that any warrant for C can be turned into a warrant for ⊥. It is not clear that Cogburn's examples satisfy this stronger criterion, nor it is clear how any example could, since having both a warrant for Φ and a warrant for ¬Φ would entail having a warrant for the primitive absurdity ⊥.

This is not meant to be a serious criticism of Cogburn's paper, but merely an indication that more work needs to be done. In particular, if the anti-realist wishes to accept dialetheism while holding onto (something like) an intuitionistic understanding of the connectives, then he will need to draw a distinction between claims that are merely false and those whose negations are true (presumably the latter would imply the former, but not vice versa). Such an account promises to shed more light onto the connections between warrant, dialethic truth, and anti-realism, but I leave the task of working out the details for another time.

What is most interesting about this fourth section as a whole is not the fact that so many respected philosophers are defending a view once thought unworthy of serious consideration or detailed refutation. Rather, the interesting thing is that these philosophers are defending different versions of dialetheism. We have, at a rough count, dialethic deflationism, dialethic intuitionism (or, at least, anti-realism), dialethic fictionalism, and an argument that dialetheism is equivalent to more well received 'gappy' logics. While there might be no principled reasons why one cannot adopt, say, intuitionism regarding one discourse and deflationism about another, we cannot adopt both positions with regard to a single discourse (unless we wish to be dialetheists regarding talk about what logical view is correct, which does seem self-defeating!). Thus, as this section makes clear, dialetheism is a family of views whose common element is the assumption that at least some contradictions are true/rationally believable/assertible/verifiable/true-in-a-fiction/etc.

The final section, For the LNC, contains papers by Laurence Goldstein, Greg Littmann and Keith Simmons, Stewart Shapiro, Neil Tennant, Alan Weir, and Edward N. Zalta. The papers by Goldstein, Littmann and Simmons, Tennant, and Zalta present more refined versions of the types of objection to dialetheism which Priest defuses in his own contribution. Whether Priest will be able to develop more refined responses in answer to these objections is a topic better left to Priest and others. What is clear, however, is that each of these philosophers takes dialetheism to be a viable contender for the title of undisputed correct logic, one worthy of principled opposition.

In "There are No True Contradictions", Weir, in addition to propounding the standard sort of objections involving belief, assertion, the meaning of negation, etc., argues that dialetheists have failed to deliver on the main selling point of their position -- a solution to the paradoxes. Although dialetheism provide a uniform, and theoretically rich, account of semantic paradoxes such as the Liar, prospects for similar success with the set theoretic paradoxes seem bleak. The problem, in a nutshell, is that naïve comprehension:

(∃x)(∀y)(y∈x ↔ F(y))

fails, within LP, to entail the existence of more than one object. Thus, although naïve set theory is non-trivial within the dialethic framework, it falls short of providing a set theory powerful enough to support mathematics. If dialetheism requires us to abandon traditional set theory in order to obtain a solution to the paradoxes, Weir asks "why take it seriously?" (p. 403) (Weir's discussion of dialethic set theory covers much more than this, and is recommended to anyone interested in the topic).

Shapiro's "Simple Truth, Contradiction, and Consistency", however, is the perhaps the most troubling of the bunch for the dialetheist. One of Shapiro's many objections is that, although the dialetheist can indicate when a sentence Φ is both true and false (an assertion of Φ∧¬Φ will do), she has no way of saying that a sentence is either true of false but not both. Since the dialetheist is committed to the claim that trivialism is false, she is caught in a dilemma: the coherence of dialetheism depends on distinguishing it from the view that not just some but all sentences are both true and false, yet her language is incapable of expressing this claim (Shapiro makes the point in a different, yet essentially equivalent, manner, pointing out that the dialetheist has no means by which to express the content of the claim that dialetheism is correct).

Shapiro canvasses, and rejects, a number of possible ways the dialetheist might attempt to express the claim that Φ is (or is not) a dialetheia. A general argument can be given, however, for the claim that the dialetheist cannot, on pain of trivialism, express such claims (Shapiro does not provide the general argument). What we require is a sentence such that assertion of the sentence entails that Φ is not a dialetheia. Since a sentence is assertible if, and only if, it is true, the sentence in question must be true if, and only if, Φ itself is not both true and false. Thus, we need a predicate which corresponds to one of the following truth tables (I assume familiarity with the semantics for LP):

Φ

*1(<φ>)

*2(<φ>)

*3(<φ>)

*4(<φ>)

T

T

B

T

B

B

F

F

F

F

F

T

T

B

B

Assume that the dialetheist's language contains the resources to express at least one of these predicates (call it *), and in addition assume that the language also contains Peano Arithmetic and the standard truth predicate:

Φ

T(<φ>)

T

T

B

B

F

F

Then, by diagonalization, we can obtain a Y such that:

Ψ

and:

(∀P)((*(<Ψ>)∧T(<ψ>))→T<P>)

have the same truth value(s). (AB =df ( ¬ A) B). We can now prove that every sentence in the language is (at least) true. (The proof sketch is carried out in a classical metatheory, but this is not essential.)

Ψ is either simply true, simply false, or both. If Ψ is simply false then T() is simply false, so *(<ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>) is simply false, and (∀P)((*(<Ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>))→T<P>) is therefore (at least) true. So Ψ cannot be simply false. If Ψ is both true and false, then (∀P)((*(<Ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>))→T<P>) must be both true and false, and thus (at least) false. So, there must be some Q such that (*(<Ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>))→T<Q> is (at least) false. So *(<Ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>) is (at least) true, so both of *(<ψ>), T(<ψ>) must be (at least) true. But this implies that Ψ is (simply) true. Contradiction, so Ψ cannot be both true and false. Thus, Ψ must be simply true, so (∀P)((*(<Ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>))→T<P>) is simply true, and therefore (*(<Ψ>) ∧ T(<ψ>))→ T<Q> is simply true for any sentence Q. Since *(<Ψ>)∧T(<ψ>) is (at least) true, by hypothesis and definitions, it follows that Q is (simply) true. Since Q was arbitrary, this completes the proof.

Shapiro is, thus, absolutely correct, and if the dialetheist claims that one can, within his framework, express everything that is (coherently) expressible, then operations such as * (and Boolean negation) must be incoherent (this is the standard dialethic response to such objections). While this observation is significant (and Littman and Simmons touch on similar points), there is a much more general, and perhaps more important, observation lurking in the vicinity.

Consider the Liar sentence:

L ↔ T< ¬ L>

within classical logic. The problem in this context is that we can derive a contradiction:

L∧¬ L

from the Liar and, given explosion, obtain trivialism. A two-centuries-old response to this is to reject the Liar as well-formed, somehow barring the expression of such self-refuting sentences.

Dialetheism (along with other, more mainstream views) can be seen as a (partial) rejection of this time-honored strategy. What the dialetheist does is to provide a logic where neither the Liar nor sentences of the form Φ∧¬Φ are explosive. Thus, by restricting the logic (i.e. barring particular inferences such as disjunctive syllogism), we can allow more expressive resources into the language. We can never, however, accept the coherence of every conceivable semantic notion (unless we adopt a logic so weak that no interesting inferences are possible). For any logic, there will be some concept which, if we allow it into the language, will cause triviality. An example in the present context is the * predicate(s) discussed above.

Thus, the common claim that LP is 'non-explosive' is misleading -- rather, particular logics are explosive relative to particular (classes of) expressions, and thus the coherence of certain (usually semantic) expressions must be judged relative to particular logics. Classical logic is explosive with respect to both expressions of the form Φ∧¬Φ and certain expressions which can be formulated in terms of the * operator, while LP is only explosive with regard to the latter. As a result, the Liar is incoherent (and presumably not expressible) on the classical approach, while it is not for the dialetheist. Presumably, a clever logician could formulate a logic even more restrictive than LP in which expressions involving the * operator were coherent. The point is this: The choice between dialethic logic and one or another non-dialethic logic is a familiar tradeoff between (among other things, of course) being permissive in terms of allowable inferences and being permissive in terms of what we can coherently express. LP merely allows us more expressive power at the cost of some familiar patterns of inference.

Thus, dialetheism is not a radically new idea (or even a radical old idea), but is just another node on the continuum of possible ways to balance the expressive power/inferential power trade-off. Unfortunately, all of the essays in this volume (like other writings on dialetheism, including the writings of its proponents) tend to concentrate on the ways in which dialetheism is bizarre or seems to differ from its competitors and less on how the view fills a natural pre-existing space in the dialectic. This is not to say that dialetheism is not important, or that it does not deserve the sort of attention that it receives in this excellent volume, or that the papers included do not constitute significant progress on a number of fronts. On the contrary, once one views dialetheism as a natural companion to other, supposedly more 'traditional' views such as classicism, intuitionism, and gappy logics, one wonders why it has taken so long for such an excellent volume to appear.