2005.10.10

Iris Marion Young

On Female Body Experience: "Throwing Like a Girl" and Other Essays

Iris Marion Young, On Female Body Experience: "Throwing Like a Girl" and Other Essays, Oxford University Press, 2005, ix+177pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-19-516193-9.

Reviewed by Alia Al-Saji, McGill University


On Female Body Experience collects eight essays by Iris Marion Young that span twenty-seven years of feminist theorizing of embodiment. All but the introduction and one of the essays, “Menstrual Meditations,” have been published elsewhere. This worthwhile collection includes some now famous works, in particular the essay mentioned in the subtitle of the book, “Throwing Like a Girl.” Many of the essays in this collection have stood the test of time. They have been read, criticized and applauded, commented on and taught in multiple venues and to different audiences over the years. Some—including “Throwing Like a Girl,” “Pregnant Embodiment,” “Women Recovering Our Clothes,” and “Breasted Experience”—were sometimes difficult to obtain since the book in which they were initially collected was out-of-print for some time.[1] Both teachers and students of feminist philosophy and phenomenology will be happy to see them in this new collection. Accessibility, however, is not the only merit of this new book, for this collection holds a great deal of interest in its own right. Not only does it group together essays representative of Young’s on-going thinking about female embodiment and her engagement with phenomenological and feminist philosophers over the span of her career—thus of interest to scholars—this collection also provides a thematically cohesive work that can be read as an introduction to questions of lived bodily experience from a feminist perspective, hence representing a valuable resource for teaching.

The essays in the collection are ordered thematically rather than chronologically, so highlighting interconnections between essays. The collection begins with the most theoretical of the essays, “Lived Body vs. Gender,” which is also one of the most recent. The themes discussed in this essay serve to frame the more concrete analyses of female bodily experience that Young presents in the rest of the book. In this essay, Young situates herself with respect to current debates surrounding the use of the concept of gender. She agrees with the feminist appropriation of the phenomenological concept of lived body, a concept that is elaborated on in many of Young’s essays here. But she also argues for a reconfigured concept of gender for feminist social criticism. Both concepts, Young argues, are necessary to feminist theory. Significantly, these concepts reflect the dual aspects of Young’s own approach to female bodily experience—to which I will return below—as both expressive and critical. The other essays in the volume (except for the last on old-age residences) instantiate this dual approach to different degrees. They explore various aspects of female embodiment that—though clearly variable and multiple in their empirical manifestations (so that not all can be applied to all women universally)—are also clearly implicated in different women’s everyday experiences and senses of self. The essays on feminine bodily movement and spatiality (“Throwing Like a Girl), pregnancy (“Pregnant Embodiment”), clothing (“Women Recovering Our Clothes”), being breasted (“Breasted Experience”), and menstruation (“Menstrual Meditations”), all speak to different elements of women’s experience that can be loosely said to be held in common and that, though they often seem merely material and contingent, come to define in restrictive and/or expressive ways one’s bodily being. The final two essays, “House and Home” and “A Room of One’s Own”, on old-age residences are slightly different and serve to expand the notion of body at play in the rest of the collection. In particular, these essays present an attempt to think subjectivity not only as individually embodied, but as spatialized and materialized through its habitual surroundings, its home. With the last essay, the collection ends on a concrete note, presenting suggestions for public policy.

Young’s style is both philosophically rigorous in its argumentation and its dialogue with other thinkers, and engaging in its examples and descriptions of lived bodily experiences. The philosophical conversations enacted in Young’s essays show generous and attentive readings of other authors, whether Beauvoir, Merleau-Ponty, Irigaray or Bartky, to name but a few. But what makes these essays highly readable and teachable (to which I can speak from my own experience and that of colleagues) is the careful detail, the vivid and concrete images of Young’s descriptions. These descriptions should not be read as glorifications, or condemnations, of women’s experience (though some seem to tend in this direction, as I will discuss below). Rather, Young’s descriptions of female bodily experience serve at least two purposes. In the first place, they give expression to experiences that have been invisible and unspoken in the Western philosophical tradition and culture (because devalued, stigmatized, relegated to the “private sphere,” considered as unrepresentative of the norm, etc.). But in bringing female experiences and modes of embodiment to light, a critical function is also performed. Young’s work hence points to the ways in which female embodiment has been restricted and codified through social norms. For example, how feminine motility and spatiality are constructed in inhibited and truncated ways (“Throwing Like a Girl), how medical institutions and practices constitute the experience of pregnancy as one of alienation (“Pregnant Embodiment”), or how breasted being is made to fit self-contradictory patriarchal norms (reiterated by medical technologies) that construct breasts as objects (“Breasted Experience”).

Here, I think a third project, which Young adopts on occasion, should be mentioned. Young’s descriptions often aim beyond the critical, to a revaluation of female subjectivity and embodiment. In this, her expressions of female lived experience become more than empirical cases and take on the status of generalizations; they come to represent sketches of experiences we hold in common that can serve as the basis for “alternate ideals.” (p. 11) This method, which Young derives from Irigaray, is not without its risks, as Young herself realizes. In another context she notes that “[l]ooking to either the female or the feminine for conceptual alternatives … risks reinscribing the very structures we aim to transform.” (p. 6) Where this Irigarayan methodology is at work, I find that Young’s essays navigate the risks with differing degrees of success. In what remains of this review, I wish to explore Young’s possible motivation for adopting such a methodology and to discuss one problematic and one promising instantiation of it.

A closer look at the earliest essay in the collection, “Throwing Like a Girl” (first published 1980), can reveal the motivation for adopting this Irigarayan methodology of revaluing female experience. In “Throwing Like a Girl,” female modes of movement and of living in space are presented in exclusively negative terms—as “ambiguous” and “inhibited” (p. 36), “discontinuous” (p. 38), “looked at and acted upon” (p. 39), and “enclosed or confining” (p. 39). Such descriptions are at once expressive of the spatial being-in-the-world of many women and critical of the patriarchal social structures that cause women to be so positioned. But the privative way in which women’s experience is presented in the essay calls for another approach. For women are not only victims of patriarchal objectification but also resist this oppression, so that the same experiences may sometimes be the site for multiple lived meanings and need to be read through different lenses. Comparing women’s experiences to an ideal structure of subjectivity will continue to highlight only their privative dimension, since this ideal is generally based on a masculinist conception of the subject (as unified, teleological, unconstrained action and transcendence). Alternative conceptual frameworks and analytic categories are needed in order to make visible creative and resistant aspects of women’s experience on their own terms. In revisiting “Throwing Like a Girl” almost twenty years after its publication, Young offers such a criticism of her own work.[2] Essays written after “Throwing Like a Girl” hence attempt to present more than a critical perspective on women’s experience; they also try to revalue aspects of this experience that can serve as the basis for alternative, female imaginaries and ontologies. How successful is this approach?

“Women Recovering Our Clothes” is one essay where Young applies this Irigarayan approach (cf. pp. 10-11). There, Young seeks to speak female desires and pleasures that find expression in the context of clothing and that escape subsumption to a masculinist imaginary. Young hence locates the pleasure she describes beyond the feminist critique of women’s pleasure in clothing as the product of an internalized, voyeuristic and fetishizing, gaze of masculinist culture. Although I am generally sympathetic to this project of attempting to speak women’s desires and cultures in positive terms, I find its formulation in this essay problematic. Young is careful to note that she “can claim to speak only for the experience of women like [herself]”, that is, white, Western, middle-class, heterosexual, professional women in late capitalist society (p. 69). Yet the account of clothing presented seems to idealize (even romanticize) the experience of clothing of these women, to the point of forgetting its divergent and privileged status with respect to the experiences of other women. To say that “I do not possess my clothes; I live with them.” (p. 71) is to forget the material conditions that allow me to possess them. And to take the fantasy opened up by clothing in consumer culture to be enabling of an active subjectivity and freedom (p.73) is to forget that we have this freedom to play with clothes only because it is in the interests of this culture to allow a defined space of imaginary freedom in lieu of real freedoms that it bars us from imagining.[3]

To Young’s credit, she is clearly aware of the ways in which the “aesthetic freedom” that Western middle-class women take in their clothing is embedded in patriarchal consumer capitalism and in exploitative and imperialist projects with respect to other cultures (p. 74). But if part of the motivation for expressing women’s experience and desires is to generate political solidarity between women, then more attention needs to be paid to how certain experiences are idealized to the exclusion of others.[4] This becomes important when the idealized (Western, middle-class, etc.) experience is identified as providing a certain freedom for women (albeit aesthetic or imaginative). The danger is, then, that this modality of freedom becomes presented as normative for all women. This is clearly not Young’s project; rather it represents a way in which feminist projects can, and often are, co-opted by patriarchal, imperialist forces. One can imagine the slogan: to be free, other women need to be able to express themselves in their clothes, as Western women are allowed to do. What is forgotten is how much Western female clothing—as with all clothing—is about disciplining bodies, quantifying and measuring them, and habituating them to the norms of the culture (in this case, capitalist consumer culture).

In contrast to the idealizing account of “Women Recovering Our Clothes,” I would locate Young’s most recent essay “Menstrual Meditations.” Young is cautious in this essay to note that her project is not one of recuperating a pure female core experience. Indeed, she finds, underneath the social oppression of women as menstruators, “not a glorious experience, but rather a personal bodily process that causes many women some discomfort or annoyance some of the time … [that] nevertheless carries emotional meaning for many women.” (p. 98) The essay is then, for the most part, critical—pointing to the social structures that force women to keep menstruation hidden, even while claiming to treat them as equals. What becomes clear is that women are considered equal and full subjects only if they discipline themselves to be like the “normal,” masculine, seemingly solid and in-control self, i.e., to hide any reference to menstruation. Menstruation, Young concludes, is negatively overdetermined—hence the difficulty of locating a common experience to be revalued. Yet Young’s account is not exclusively negative. In the final pages of the essay, she gestures not to generalizations or idealizations about menstruation, but rather towards possibilities that “the experience offers that some of us take up some of the time.” (p. 119) Through a reflection on mood and temporality, Young teases out some of the meaningful, affective possibilities of menstruation as a recurring bodily experience that is marginalized by one’s culture (p. 121). This is not a romantic account of our freedom in what she calls “the menstrual closet.” It is from its devalued location in our culture that menstruation becomes the possible source for meaning, affection and self-reflection. In listing the essays where she employs her Irigarayan strategy of revaluing female experience, Young does not include this essay (cf. Introduction, pp. 10-11). Yet the ontology of menstrual moods presented here reminds this reader of Irigaray. For in opening up possibilities that were unthinkable within dominant culture, this essay, I believe, performs in exemplary fashion the positive function Young seeks. In this sense, menstruation does not appear as a site for celebration or glorification of female identity, but is redefined as a possible site for resistance and the creation of alternative meanings. Since it offers no single, definitive account of menstrual experience, “Menstrual Meditations” opens the way for readers to carry its reflections further and, I find, is highly promising as a result.

On Female Body Experience is a rich and thought-provoking work that addresses themes often overlooked, even in feminist writings. Its value consists not only in its attention to the theme of female embodiment, but also in the particular aspects of embodiment chosen and in the care and detail of its analyses. It offers new ways of thinking about lived bodies and opens new avenues of investigation in feminist phenomenology and ontology.


Notes

[1] Iris Marion Young, Throwing Like a Girl and Other Essays in Feminist Philosophy and Social Theory (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990).

[2] Iris Marion Young, “‘Throwing Like a Girl’: Twenty Years Later” in Body and Flesh: A Philosophical Reader, ed. Donn Welton (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers Ltd., 1998).

[3] I realize that Young’s point here is that once a realm of free imagination is opened up, other possibilities will present themselves (p. 74). But, in my view, this imaginary sphere will always be circumscribed by the consumer culture and fashion industry that enables it; the only actualization that we will then be permitted is that of buying different clothes.

[4] As Young notes: “Reflective inquiry that aims to express embodied being-in-the-world captures some of the feeling that can motivate social criticism and political organization. Descriptions of lived female and feminine experience can reveal reasons that differently situated women may have to sympathize with one another’s embodied situation, while at the same time remaining sufficiently vague to allow for concrete variation.” (p. 9)