From Plato’s banishment of the poets from the Republic to Ayer’s dismissal of aesthetics (alongside normative ethics) as a legitimate field of philosophical inquiry, aesthetics has often been treated as the red-headed stepchild of philosophy. Gregory Currie blames this state of affairs in recent times on aestheticians who have attempted to “carve out a domain of problems about the arts that could be investigated without serious help from other areas of philosophy.” This attempt, he believes, resulted in “stagnation and marginalization,” since many problems about the arts depend for their solution on the philosophies of mind and language, and on psychological theories of human development. Currie hastens to add that the stagnation and marginalization of aesthetics has, at this point in time, been largely reversed. He also believes that at least some problems in aesthetics are not illuminated by empirical research (whether or not he believes there can be a philosophy of art that isn’t derivative from other philosophical disciplines he does not say). Nevertheless, this book is offered as an attempt to address several of the thorniest problems in aesthetics within a broader philosophical context. Even if he doesn’t solve these problems outright, Currie hopes to show that any solution that neglects the broader context is doomed to failure.
The book is a collection of thirteen papers written over the past twelve years. Five of the papers are appearing for the first time in this volume. Three others have been substantially revised. The papers vary greatly in topic and focus. Some ask grand questions about the nature of interpretation (in narrative works of fiction and in general), the ontological status of fictional characters, and the possibility of a “literary philosophy of time.” Others explore very narrow aesthetic questions, e.g. what is a documentary, what is the nature and limits of genre, what does it mean for a narrative to be unreliable. Though all of the essays are well crafted and well argued, the book as a whole, unified as it is under the rather weak them of “aesthetics within, and dependent on, a broader context”, does not really exist except as a vehicle for the publication of some new essays and the revision of some previously published work.
There is one essay, one of the previously unpublished ones, that is not only interesting in its own right but also deals explicitly with the book’s general theme of aesthetics’ dependence on other philosophical and empirical disciplines. The essay is entitled “Interpretation and Pragmatics”, and argues for author-intentionalism – the highly contentious view that interpretation of narrative art works involves deciphering in some way the intentions of the work’s author. Currie is well aware of the long tradition that stands in opposition to this view, but believes that this opposition rests on a mistake: “[I]n the course of the large-scale philosophizing which has driven [movements in semiotic, new critical, and structuralist traditions], their advocates have not given us plausible, detailed and empirically testable hypotheses about how people actually go about interpreting the things they hear and read. Indeed, they don’t seem to have thought of this as a relevant part of the project.” Currie believes that aesthetics must be informed by other philosophical and empirical disciplines, that aesthetic activity is a psychological activity. And the act of aesthetic interpretation is a species of communication generally.
Currie’s argument in this essay is based on recent work in the philosophy of language which seeks to explain the way we process communicative acts as a function of efficient stimuli processing in general. We have “evolved to be seekers of relevance: [we] seek to process stimuli so as to get the maximum cognitive effect for the minimum effort.” Since the aim of a communicative act is the transmission of some cognitive content from speaker to hearer, the most efficient way of dealing with communicative acts – the way to get the maximum cognitive effect with the least effort – is to ascertain the speaker’s intended meaning. Since works of art are a species of communicative act, interpreting these works must also be a matter of ascertaining the speaker’s, i.e. the artist’s, intentions.
Currie further refines his argument by differentiating two basic claims made by author-intentionalism: “1) We use the text, together with various other things, to come up with the best ideas we can about what the author intended to convey; 2) legitimate interpretations are exactly those that correspond with what the author intended to convey.” His position is a “revised” author-intentionalism because he endorses the first claim but rejects the second. Currie also embraces a pluralistic, as opposed to a monistic, theory of interpretation, which means that he believes that there can be at least two contrasting, equally legitimate interpretations of the same work. So his view is not the nearly universally rejected, rather naïve view that appreciating art means figuring out what the author had in mind when she created the work – a view that reduces aesthetic activity to a kind of puzzle solving. Rather, he argues that “an interpretation of the work cannot be legitimate unless it provides us with a way of seeing the text of the work as an appropriate vehicle for the intentional communication of that very interpretation.” Works can support various interpretations, but any interpretation, if it is to be legitimate, must be something that the author could have intended. Currie clarifies this point by appealing to the distinction between utterer and utterance. The aim of interpretation is not to figure out what was in the mind of the utterer – the artist – but to find a meaning in the utterance that is supported by the linguistic properties of that utterance. The discussion is rounded out with references to recent studies in experimental psychology with normal and autistic children that establish various links between language skills and the ability to decipher the intentions of speakers.
Though Currie begins this essay by drawing a sharp line between his position and that of the opponents of author-intentionalism, his final, revised version of author intentionalism doesn’t seem all that far from the opposition. Assuming that narrative, and especially literary, art works should indeed be viewed as communicative acts (though I personally am sympathetic to this view, Currie never provides an argument for it, at least in this book), and conceding that a legitimate interpretation must indeed be supported by the linguistic and stylistic properties of the text, it is not clear to me where an author’s intentions come into play. Isn’t it simply enough to say that a legitimate interpretation must be supported by the text? Why is it necessary to add that an author must have been capable of reasonably intending any legitimate interpretation? What does talk of intentions gain us here?
Another problem with Currie’s account is its ambivalence between the ontology and axiology of interpretation. Appealing to the empirically verifiable mechanism of interpretation – to the way people actually interpret what they hear and read – seems to signal an ontology of interpretation. And yet Currie talks about distinguishing “legitimate” interpretations from “illegitimate” ones, which is clearly an axiological concern. Does the empirical study of how people really interpret the things they hear and read explain what interpretation is and must be, or does it help us distinguish good interpretations from bad ones?
This brings me to my final criticism of the essay, which is also a criticism of the book’s unifying theme. I take is as uncontroversial that, to a certain extent, an understanding of the fundamental psychological/biological workings of the human mind is important for any philosophical theory that takes the human mind as its object. We cannot fully understand intentional states without understanding how the mind is able to generate a mental state per se. A theory of scientific knowledge depends in part on an understanding of how the human senses perceive the physical world and under what conditions sensory data are reliable. Any conception of music operates within the context of the empirically measurable range of sound waves audible to the human ear. And so on. However, it is a truism that while many philosophical theories need the empirical sciences to provide them with context and limits, the reason we have philosophy at all is that third-person scientific discourse, while very good at providing the what and the how, has very little to say about the why. In other words, our philosophical theories have to operate within the realm of the possible, which is determined by empirical science, but they must also go beyond empirical science if they are to be in any way useful.
Interpretation is not just a matter of mental processes and the mechanics of communication and reception. It is an aesthetic activity that is subject to evaluative criteria – there is a right way and a wrong way to interpret a narrative art work, and interpretation plays an important role in art creation (various performances – theatrical, musical, cinematic – involve a type of interpretation), criticism, and assessment. Understanding the psychological process that underlies reception of narrative art works can help set the limits of a philosophical theory of interpretation. But understanding the basic mechanism of interpretation will not be very helpful in understanding the complex role interpretation plays in many aesthetic activities, and it will only be helpful in understanding what role interpretation ought to play by setting the limits of the “can” implied by any proposed “ought.” It is certainly not clear how Currie’s revised intentionalism is helpful in these matters.
Gregory Currie is a highly influential, highly prolific philosopher of art who has, in this and other works, succeeded in combining aesthetics with other disciplines, enriching the field in the process. But I remain unconvinced that aesthetics must of necessity appeal to other philosophical disciplines and the sciences in order to solve its various problems. This book, though valuable as a collection of some important and interesting essays, does not succeed as a unified work.