2005.11.04

Constant J. Mews

Abelard and Heloise

Constant J. Mews, Abelard and Heloise, Oxford University Press, 2005, 328pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195156897.

Reviewed by Kevin Guilfoy, Carroll College


In recent years there have been several books on Peter Abelard and on his philosophy, among them M.T. Clanchy's biography Abelard: A Medieval Life,[1] John Marenbon's The Philosophy of Peter Abelard,[2] and The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard.[3] Constant Mews' book Abelard and Heloise fills a large gap in this recent literature.

Mews claims several very broad goals for his book. His first is to "provide a framework that can help readers explore for themselves the richness of the texts that have come down to us, not just of Abelard and Heloise but of their contemporaries" (ix). In this respect the book is brilliant. On topics covering the full range of Abelard's thought in logic, ethics, theology, literature, poetry, music, and liturgy Mews discusses what is known of many of the ancient and early medieval sources used by Abelard and his contemporaries. Even more significantly Mews presents the currently known thoughts and theories of Abelard's eleventh- and twelfth-century contemporaries. There are many places where one would wish that he had gone into much greater depth to explicate how Abelard rejected or elaborated these ideas, but Mews acknowledges that with such a broad goal many interesting topics needed to be treated briefly. The book compensates with extensive and detailed notes.

Mews' other stated goals are to argue "that the evolution of Abelard's thinking about language, theology, and ethics is marked by continuity rather than by rupture and that it cannot be understood apart from the influence of Heloise" (5). In particular, Mews takes exception to John Marenbon's 1997 book The Philosophy of Peter Abelard for presenting Abelard's logical thought as distinct from his ethical and theological thought. To this end Mews has written a sort of intellectual biography of Abelard. He traces the development of Abelard's thought topically and chronologically from his arrival in the Paris schools, through his love affair with Heloise, his political struggles and various condemnations, to his eventual death in 1142. Mews' choice to devote considerable attention to Abelard's lesser studied works -- e.g., the literal glosses and the biblical commentaries -- is another of this book's great strengths. However, Mews is not entirely successful in his attempt to show the continuity of Abelard's logic with his ethics and theology. The book too often reaches to draw facile connections between logic, ethics, and Heloise.

In the Dialectica, concerned with language rather than ethics, Abelard had laid the foundations for arguing that the meaning of a sentence could not be defined as an objective thing but rather had to be understood in terms of the intention of the speaker. Only in the 1130's, after he had renewed contact with Heloise, did Abelard transfer this insight to behavior (222).

Mews is more successful in his more limited claims about the discernable influence and contributions of Heloise. In chapter one, "Images of Abelard and Heloise", Mews dispels the false images and caricatures that have come down to us from various sources. The paucity of texts makes this task especially difficult with Heloise. For the most part Mews avoids the twin pitfalls of writing hagiography of Heloise or of dismissing her as merely a bright student with inspiring questions. Mews presents Heloise as Abelard's genuine collaborator and intellectual colleague. Her contribution is especially apparent in the early development of Abelard's ethics and theology. In these areas the existing texts reveal Heloise as a perhaps untrained but formidable intellect. Her contributions to Abelard's logic and philosophy of language are not so evident. In too many places the book reaches to make superficial connections.

When he wrote to Heloise, Abelard had waxed eloquent about her uniqueness. In glossing Porphyry, he transfers these concerns to the realm of analysis without giving anything away from the realm of personal experience (84).

Heloise all but disappears from the discussions of Abelard's most mature ethical and theological speculation.

The book traces the developments in Abelard's logic and philosophy of language in three chapters. In chapter 2 "The Early years: Roscelin of Compiègne and William of Champeaux," Mews gives much needed attention to Abelard's earliest philosophical works, the literal glosses. Mews paints an interesting picture of Abelard, who in these early years was a mere participant in philosophical debates, not yet the dominant figure he would become. Through his explications of Roscelin and William, as well as Gerland of Besançon and many others, Mews describes Abelard's early commitment to the vocalism of his first teacher Roscelin. Chapter 3 "Challenging Tradition" and Chapter 5 "Returning to Logica" discuss Abelard's development into a preeminent logician. In these chapters Mews focuses more on Abelard's own development and less on the thought of William of Champeaux and others whose opposition demonstrated the shortcomings of naïve vocalism and drove Abelard to his more mature semantic theories. Three chapters is entirely too limited a space for the discussion that this topic really deserves. Mews, however, is very good at providing quick and clear expositions of major philosophical positions and pointing out where Abelard's thought had developed from an earlier view or built on the arguments of other philosophers. Perhaps with an intention to avoid well-trod ground, Mews gives very little discussion of the problem of universals or to Abelard's theories of conditionals, loci, and inference. Instead he gives considerable attention to Abelard's theory of metaphor. By covering less well-trod ground Mews has made a serious contribution to the current literature, but the focus on metaphor leaves the discussion of Abelard's logic somewhat skewed.

Mews devotes considerable attention to metaphor because he believes it to be the key feature of Abelard's philosophy of language, the feature that unifies Abelard's thinking in logic, ethics, and theology. By far the most contentious point of Mews' discussion is his claim that for Abelard metaphor (translatio) is "a perfectly legitimate form of signification" (113). While there are several passages in which Abelard discusses metaphorical language, most scholars of Abelard's philosophy do not consider this a main part of his theory of signification.[4] In many of his discussions of metaphor Abelard seems interested in explaining away some peculiar linguistic phenomena, like how a corpse can be called a "dead man", or what we really mean when we say "the fields laugh". In most of these passages he claims that metaphorical signification is not proper to the word by imposition; it is accidental.[5] Mews, however, claims that these discussions reflect "Abelard's deepening awareness of the lack of objectivity in all linguistic assertion" (138). He elaborates this line of thought in his discussion of Abelard's theology.

There is a close relationship between understanding of the provisional character of all language and his demonstration that patristic discussions about the Trinity are necessarily not the final word on the subject (139).

Abelard, like most theologians, is perfectly willing, in fact eager, to accept the wisdom of the Fathers while distancing himself from some of the literal meanings of their words. Mews takes this to be a philosophically inspired claim about all language.

Far from being an exception to ordinary speech, the metaphorical character of theological language reflects deeper principles about all discourse (109).

Mews' interpretation of metaphor is supportable from the texts and by argument, but it is contentious. Mews presents his views as settled interpretation without discussing the more standard elements of Abelard's theory of signification.

The majority of the book is devoted to Abelard's ethics and theology. In chapters 2 and 8 "Heloise and discussions of Love" and "Heloise and the Paraclete," Mews argues that Heloise is more than just an inspiration for Abelard but is the genuine source of many of Abelard's best ethical and theological ideas. For example, Mews traces Abelard's ethical commitment that moral responsibility attaches exclusively to intention and consent to Heloise's arguments that the reform of the inner person is essential to an ethical life. The case for claiming Heloise as the origin of these ideas is supported by Mews' discussions of Abelard's earlier ethical writings in which he is still committed to the claims that bad will and wrong acts are morally culpable, views he gives up in the Scito teipsum.

In the remaining chapters Mews outlines Abelard's life-long development of an ethic and theology based on human and divine love. Mews traces Abelard's thought from the very early letters exchanged with Heloise about the nature of their personal relationship. He argues that Abelard sees their relationship as based on shameful desire (cupiditas), while Heloise "holds to an ideal of pure love that combines passionate longing (amor) with selfless love (dilectio) and friendship (amicitia)" (175). Abelard is moved by Heloise to an understanding of amor and dilectio as a force of the soul longing for its natural end (67). A force that is the "heart of the vision of God that is beyond any category but rather transforms the human soul, unless it consciously rejects God" (184). Similarly Mews describes a change in Abelard's understanding of the Holy Spirit as divine benignity to caritas, the emanation of divine love. Caritas is the foundation of all virtues, but the extent to which we accept caritas depends on our own amor. Love, both human and divine, is the foundation of all ethics. The book's discussion of the ethics and theology of love is excellent.

It is not a valid criticism to say that a book with such a broad mandate does not discuss all implications of the interpretations advanced. There are, however, some peculiar omissions from the discussion of ethics that must be pointed out. Some of the obvious twelfth-century sources are not discussed. William of Champeaux, for example, had argued that fear of God, and not love of God, is the source of good intentions and thus virtue. William in fact defines the respectful fear of God as "love" of God.[6] Some of the puzzles that the view presents are not discussed in any detail. Abelard recognizes that acting out of love of God is necessary for ethical goodness, but it is not sufficient. Abelard writes:

otherwise the infidels themselves would also have good deeds, just as we do, since they too believe no less than we do that through their deeds they are saved or are pleasing to God.[7]

Mews does not discus the myriad ways we can sin out of love, a major concern in Abelard's Scito teipsum. All of these issues require explanation to understand fully Abelard's attempt to base a theory of moral responsibility on the intention to act out of love of God.

The discussion of ethics and theology brings together all the book's strengths. Mews discusses the pagan and Christian authorities Abelard would have read. He carefully and convincingly demonstrates that Heloise is the source for many of Abelard's ideas. He discusses the thoughts and reactions of Abelard's contemporaries and critics. Finally he painstakingly details the slow maturation of Abelard's thought. Most impressively, Mews does all this in a coherent and readable fashion.

I have not commented on Mews' discussions on Abelard's poetry, Heloise's literary style, Abelard's skills at musical composition, or Heloise's somewhat negative assessment of Abelard's musical skills. These issues, which philosophers left to their own devices would likely ignore, round out Mews' excellent depiction of Abelard's complete intellectual life.


[1] M.T. Clanchy, Abelard: A Medieval Life. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1997.

[2] John Marenbon, The philosophy of Peter Abelard. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.

[3] Brower, J. and Guilfoy, K., (eds.) The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.

[4] There is no mention of metaphor as an important form of signification in Klaus Jacobi's explication of Abelard's philosophy of language in "Philosophy of Language," in The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard.

[5] See, e.g., the Logica ingredientius commentary on the Periemeneias 336.25; 350.6; 364.33. Geyer, B. ed., Peter Abaelards Philosophische Schriften, Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters 21, 1-3 Munster, 1919-1927.

[6] William of Champeaux, Sententiae, ed. O. Lottin, Psychologie et morale au XIIe et XIIIe siècles, Gembloux: Duculot, 1959. vol. V, pp. 220-221, sec. 276.39-43.

[7] P. Abelard, Scito teipsum, trans. Paul Spade, Peter Abelard: Ethical Writings, Hackett 1995, p. 24.