2006.01.03

Stephen Davies

Themes in the Philosophy of Music

Stephen Davies, Themes in the Philosophy of Music, Oxford University Press, 2003, 296pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199280177.

Reviewed by Garry L. Hagberg, Bard College


For those who are already familiar with the combination of argumentative power, conceptual clarity, and humane depth represented by Stephen Davies' writings on music, their high expectations will be handsomely fulfilled by this collection of essays composed between 1980 and 2002. For those who do not know of Davies' work, this collection offers a fine way to become familiar with his writing on the subject. The volume collects pieces ranging over and -- for the most part -- intricately through, issues of musical ontology, performance, expression, and appreciation. Throughout these inquiries Davies shows, as in his earlier work, that he is particularly adept at sorting out the structure of a debate, presenting positions on all sides and providing the reader with a perspicuous overview of the state of play.

Although these essays do indeed range widely (and impressively so), it can be useful to bear in mind one fundamental component of Davies' thought. The position he articulates and defends of musical expression, or more specifically his answer to the conceptual puzzle concerning the capacity of inanimate sound to express emotional states that are the exclusive province of animate creatures, is that of emotional appearance. Everyone knows that Bassett hounds, he explains, are sad-looking, yet no one believes that they feel the way they look. (And if a Bassett hound were sad, it would not express that emotion facially.) The hound's "sadness" is presented in its appearance, but not as the outward expression of an inner state which motivates or "shapes" that expression. Rather, the physiognomic profile of the dog, and its patterns of dynamic bodily movement, themselves present the appearance of emotions without being external indicators of inner perturbations. Music, for Davies, functions in the same way: it moves, and it does so in ways that fit the emotionally descriptive terminology we use for human action-description. Music, like human movement, can be "spritely, dragging, energetic, lethargic, and so on" (p. 2). If the notes of music, he claims, can themselves be "high or low, rushing forward or hanging back, tense and foreboding or relaxed and weightless, then" -- here is the important move away from the picture of inner-to-outer expression that motivates the traditional, and traditionally highly problematic, expression theory of art, toward the emotional appearance theory -- "music can be happy and sad independently of how its composer or the audience feels" (p.2). This conception of music's emotive content -- one that is autonomous from both the felt emotions of the composer and the felt emotions of the listener -- is one that is never too far from the surface (and often is on the surface) of Davies' writings, and the discerning reader will see this view motivating, or helping to motivate, a good deal of what Davies says on a number of topics. It is a collection of considerable internal consistency, and the pieces brought together here do reinforce or deepen each other in myriad ways, with themes appearing, submerging, and re-emerging throughout the book.

Davies frequently captures an aspect of a piece of music or of its performance-context that shows his enlarged frame of reference: he is, happily, not one to attempt to reduce everything of interest to notes, to pure sonic events regardless of everything else (nor is he, happily, one to reduce in the opposite direction, arguing that everything of interest in the musical work and its performance is a matter of social context or convention). Of John Cage's 4'33", he observes that, while his refraining as a non-pianist from playing the piano may exhibit as much dexterity as David Tudor's apparently similar restraint, his performance would still be lacking, and less interesting by contrast. It is not the same action (or inaction) for a highly trained, expert, talented pianist to not play for that duration (just as, I might add, it would not be the same action were a pianistic incompetent to sit at the piano, daunted and silent, coincidentally for four minutes and thirty-three seconds having never heard of Cage.) Davies also frequently employs the telling analogy: in arguing that Cage's piece is a work of art but not a piece of music (because, in excluding no sonic events from its content, it fails to meet the criterion of being organized sound), he suggests that it is better compared to an empty picture-frame presented by an artist who claims as content for the work anything that can be seen through it (and where, to remove intentional considerations, the frame's carrier is blindfolded). And Davies frequently exposes what an argument or an artwork does not show, where initially plausible intuitions are seen, upon analysis, to be just that. For the things Cage's work does do, it does not, he argues, demonstrate that music is all around us or that there is no distinction between audience members and performers or between music and performance art.

In his paper on competing ontologies of musical works, Davies elegantly describes the theoretical positions one would expect to find if coming from a recent study of metaphysics: we encounter nominalists (everything said about a musical work is reducible, without remainder, to statements about performances, and work-titles, e.g. "Beethoven's Fifth", do not refer to an isolable entity but rather to sets of performances); realists (who see that the individuation of performances itself requires, or presupposes, the existence of works and that many critical-historical remarks we make about works are clearly not reducible to statements about -- exclusively -- performances or sets of them); Platonists (who argue that musical works are discovered, not created); Aristotelians (who argue that the idea of the work is an abstraction from a prior acquaintance with many particulars); cultural-contextualists (who argue for the primacy of the sonic-musico-historical setting in determining the work's identity -- and in determining the very idea of a work to begin with); type-token theorists (who argue that individual performances, as tokens of the type, share defining properties with that type); action-type theorists (who argue that the work is the artist's action of discovering the work's "outward face" (p.34)); and, with Davies, ontological contextualists, who acknowledge "the socio-historical embeddedness of some of the features making up the work" (p.34) but who also think -- avoiding the reduction entirely to the sociological -- "musical works are prescribed, sound-event kinds, rather than kinds or patterns of action" (p. 35). Yet "the possibilities for musical works", works not wholly reducible to their context, "are malleable and have evolved through time" (p. 35). Davies thus nicely avoids falling into theoretical options that are conceptually neat and thus are on one level intellectually attractive -- but too neat to fit the complexities of our practices. Davies sees clearly that "the terminologies and boundaries traditionally employed by ontologists -- universals, types, norm kinds, and so on -- do not map easily onto the kinds of identifications and distinctions that are important to composers, performers, and listeners" (p.35).

These many virtues do not, however, mean that Davies is immune from the dangers of mischaracterization as he otherwise adroitly moves along his argumentative path (who is?). In expounding on the previous point, he makes it clear that he "does not advocate the kind of ordinary-language philosophy that proceeds on the assumption that the theories implicit in the discourses and actions of the folk can never be wrong" (p.35). I for one do not know of anything that ever answered to the ungainly and misleading description "ordinary-language philosophy" that presumed the veracity of theories implicit in our words and deeds, our practices. The point, if generalizable at all, rather concerned the intelligibility of the terms used to give voice to generalized metaphysical questions torn from their contextual homes within which the emergent criteria for their uses were evident. Once awakened to those problems of linguistic meanings and contextually embedded meaning-determinants, one subsequently proceeded with a newfound subtlety concerning context-sensitive nuance and an awareness of the gulf that separates the generalized question from particularized usages of the words employed to frame that question. And the folk, whoever they are or were, were never elevated on a pedestal of epistemic invincibility; that philosophical movement never excluded expertise, technical vocabularies, or linguistic cultivation of the highest order. So the strokes with which Davies is painting on occasion are perhaps both a bit too broad and made too quickly. But the spirit of Davies' point here is, to my mind at least, wholly unobjectionable: if in saying that "the folk views cannot be rejected altogether, if one's goal is to analyze the familiar concept, as opposed to merely changing the subject" (p.36), he means that we would do well in musical aesthetics to maintain a mindfulness concerning the history and evolution of our uses of central musical concepts and the ways in which composers, performers, listeners, and others have acted around them or responded to their contextually-seated normative power, he is right. And we do find helpful the terms he himself on occasion introduces, such as his distinction between a "thin" and "thick" work (or really the continuum ranging from the one to the other). A thin work is one that allows individual performances of it to differ while still remaining "equally and fully" a faithful performance of that work. Thick works, by contrast, will thus allow far less -- or in the extreme case, no -- variance in performance if fully faithful, or, conversely, such variance if present would diminish accordingly the degree of faithfulness of the performance.

Many of the papers collected here pertain, in some cases directly, and in most indirectly, to the vexing question of musical meaning. It is a virtue of the book that Davies does not succumb to the impulse to boil all of this variegated material into a succinctly expressed theory; one derives from Davies' writings more of an overview of the multiform ways in which music can mean than an essentialistic analysis. This way of working on the question of meaning is thus very like his way of working on musical ontology: he develops a wide, capacious view that follows from our diversified musical practices. I do think, however, that Davies -- not unlike other writers in the area -- is perhaps too quick in treating the analogy between language and music. Noting a semantic deficit along with a conjoined ambiguity concerning syntactic rules on the musical side of the analogy, he dismisses the modeling of music on language summarily. But this kind of conclusion -- a "thus music is not a language, q.e.d." kind -- prevents what at least this reader would like to have seen here among the other riches: a writer of Davies' intellectual clarity and cogency grappling not with only one formulation of the analogy, but rather with a good number of the very many ways in which the analogy can come into play. The fact that music is not a semantic system the coherence of which is ordered by syntactic rules should not blind us to the fact that there is such a thing as melodic coherence as an (perhaps rough, but potentially nevertheless illuminating) analogy to the much-discussed unity of the proposition. There are antecedent-consequent melodic structures that function, in thematic terms, dialogically. There are analogues to syntactic rules that function as coherence-preservers -- and this itself would be wide ranging, from diatonic harmony to serial ordering. There are thematic analogies to Wittgensteinian language-games, where a given move is made possible by prior ordered moves within the circumscribed limits of the game. There are structural analogues in composition to metaphorical restatement in language beyond Goodmanian issues of exemplification. There are deep analogies between our ways of speaking about aspects or parts of language that directly mirror our ways of speaking about music (shown in Davies' own insightful discussion of transcriptions, where he rightly concludes that transcriptions are of independent value in their own right even where we have the original to hand precisely because the transcription functions as a commentary on the original.) There are countless intricate ways -- far more intricate, and I think far more interesting than the rather blunt semantic-syntactic point -- where the analogy between the arts and language misleads (and has historically misled) aesthetic theory. And there are very many more such avenues for explanation that are prematurely closed by the semantic-syntactic point. (And of course that point itself is not as bluntly factual as it may seem -- music, as no one would dispute, can and has often been representational, also in numerous ways, so the link between mimetic content and semantic function deserves at the very least mid-length shrift.) Moreover, the characterization of language upon which the semantic-syntactic point is based is itself highly reductive and oversimplified: language does countless things, and again it would be a considerable pleasure to see a thinker of Davies' gifts treat these matters fully. Writing of the problem of musical ontology, Davies says: "The totality of musical works from culture to culture and from time to time do not have any single ontological character. Some musical works are thick with properties, others are thinner -- some works include the performance means as part of their essential nature, and much more besides, whereas others are more or less pure sound structures" (p. 77). Should we expect the primary "home" of meaning -- language -- to be any less diversified?

To say "To understand a musical utterance is not to know whether that utterance is true or false" (p. 125) is to imply that language is fundamentally a matter of knowing whether a given utterance is true or false. That is a misstep in one of two ways or both: if we do, following Davidson, want to proceed on the belief that an understanding of linguistic meaning will follow, and be dependent upon, a theory of truth, Davies' claim is in trouble. It would be a matter of knowing the truth conditions for an utterance as the determinant of its meaning and not its truth value. Or it is, in a larger frame of reference, a misstep to proceed on the reductive and essentializing belief that language is composed wholly, or even foundationally, of "utterances", where these are regarded as uniform propositional assertions of the "The cat is on the mat" kind. Here, incidentally, one should ask how rarely, and in what particular sense-determining circumstances, we actually call something in the vast sea of human speech an "utterance". And once that is clarified, the presumed intelligibility of the generalized concept of utterance at work here is very much called into question. Davies says next "We do not regard musical utterances as subject to truth-conditions" (here the very use of the phrase "musical utterances" suggests certainly the fittingness and perhaps the value of the kind of music-language inquiry I am recommending), which seems true enough. But that is, if not like a reductive picture of language, certainly like real language -- much of it we do not hold as explicitly subject to truth-conditions. He continues the phrase with "or as meeting standards of assertive correctness or incorrectness of use". We do have remarkably clear senses of correct and incorrect uses -- think of the incorrectness of parallel fifths in the harmonization of a chorale melody, or of the expansion of what we tellingly call a harmonic language by breaking rules of correctness, as Debussey explicitly did, or of P.D.Q. Bach's hilarious stylistic fractures where a blues fights its way out of a fugue, behaving in the end rather like the increasingly unruly and badly-behaved speaker in Plato's Symposium. And on the positive side, we indeed take a distinct pleasure (as Michael Krausz has investigated at length) in the sense of rightness, the sense indeed of correctness, that some works convey; in such cases, are not standards of "assertive" correctness met, and handsomely so? Prematurely closing the avenue, Davies concludes the passage with: "In respect of its meaning, music cannot usefully be compared to a language" (p. 125). And with that blockade to further reflection on the topic installed, he can then later in the book say, falsely, that "There are no plausible equivalents in music to … propositional closure" (p. 174). If, to take only one of countless possible examples, the closure provided in the mature classical symphony composed in sonata-allegro form, where the thematic material of the exposition is presented, those two themes treated in the development section, and then -- once those dialogical implications have been worked out -- recapitulated where we in a sense know them for the first time and then logically and satisfyingly closed with the coda, is not a plausible equivalent to propositional closure, nothing is. (Of course that could be Davies' point -- that the music is not language, but that is only trivially true. Nothing else not language is language either -- the point concerns the illuminating analogies and comparisons (which he surely knows, since he is otherwise allergic to trivial truths throughout this book and is after all speaking of "plausible equivalents".) Davies also refers to language, generically, as a linguistic system, which it is not. One can devise systems out of little parts of language which can then work, well …, systematically. Codes, similarly, are parasitic on language, and are thus not revelations of its essence: code-breakers are not translators, nor, for that matter, are native speakers (contra the language-of-thought model). All of these considerations hold relevance for our understanding of musical meaning, but one will never clarify, much less initially recognize, their significance by starting with a caricature of language. Similarly, verbal creativity, rightly understood, could show us something about musical creativity and improvisation. Why close this off? But of course, no book can do everything at once, and what this book does do it does very well indeed.

A simplified and unitary picture of intention in language (as Cartesian inward pre-hearing) has caused an inordinate amount of conceptual confusion in the history of aesthetics. Work in the philosophy of language loosening the grip of that intentionalist template has proven of value to aesthetics, as it has to other areas of philosophy, and it is clear that Davies is entirely free of that falsifying and vision-narrowing picture. Thus writing on the problem of the authentic musical performance, he rightly says that ideal authentic performances "faithfully preserve the composer's determinative intentions", and what he says next rightly undercuts the falsifying intentionalist template: "and because those intentions underdetermine the sound of a faithful performance, different-sounding performances may be equally and ideally authentic" (p. 88). He sees clearly what could easily cause the intentionalist confusion here, and he avoids it not in the cheaper and far less plausible way -- by denying the relevance of intention at all, but in the better way -- by appealing to a conception of intention that at once reinforces its aesthetic significance while eroding the false authority of the simplified picture of intentional action, compositionally speaking.

Davies, even with all his erudition, has certainly not forgotten how to make philosophical work enjoyable -- see his piece (beginning with the line "I have always wanted to play the Brahm's Violin Concerto with the Vienna Philharmonic, I am thwarted in this ambition by my inability to play the violin" (p. 94)) on why it is too late to sing with the Beatles or others, despite ontologically curious "music-minus-one" recordings. Nor has he lost a sense of the ethical issues that in some places underlie our aesthetic reactions (see his "What is the Sound of One Piano Plummeting?"). It is in the course of this essay that Davies takes up what to my mind is among the most fascinating (and among the least examined) areas of musical aesthetics: the nature of the instrument. Davies describes the distinct -- and somewhat mysterious -- sense in which an instrument becomes an extension of the body, or even a part of the person who plays it. Instruments, he notes, are "held against the body, tucked into its crevices, or firmly grasped. They are placed in the mouth, or against the lips, or they are caressed by the hands" (p. 114). He emphasizes the fact that instruments have a "touch", and that years of practice bring the two "into seemingly ceaseless contact", and the "long history of this physical intimacy is apparent to anyone who watches a master musician at work." One could not ask for a better succinct description of the integration of human bodily movement into the manipulation of the instrument to such a degree that the boundary is occluded: "And this expansion [of the boundaries of the person] is emotional and personal, as well as physical, to the extent that the instrument provides the player with new means for expressing her ideas, personality, and passions. This nexus of corporeal embodiment, action, and expression is melded indissolubly with the music that is sounded, which in its turn implicates the human body and organic processes through the ebb and flow of its pulse and rhythm, of its gestures and sighs, of its tensions and resolutions" (p. 114). And he here approvingly quotes Lydia Goehr's valuable observation that performers feel about their instruments as they do their bodies and voices, with an outward aspect seeing instruments as objects upon which they intentionally act and with an inward aspect as internally-contained "voices" with which they impose musical sound upon their world, along with Liszt's remark (that Goehr quotes) that his piano is, for him, "my speech, my life". These remarks are made in pursuit of a better understanding (which Davies clearly provides) of our unease, or worse, at seeing instruments mistreated, harmed, or destroyed. Here again, there is an opening to what I think is a particularly useful comparison -- between works of art and human beings, and in this special case between musical instruments and human beings. This in turn could open the way to an examination of the very distinct -- actually, unique -- mode of perception we bring to our acknowledgment of a human being (Wittgenstein's "eine Einstellung zur Seele", an attitude towards a soul); this matter lurks just off stage in Davies' discussion, and I for one hope that he will before long bring it to a position of central attention. The intricacies of that investigation -- considerably more intricate than what Davies suggests here (although I say again that one cannot do everything at once) -- could cast genuinely new light on these important issues. In addition, the ventriloqual metaphor (as recently examined at length by David Goldblatt) can shed much light here as well, particularly as the matter of the instrument-as-voice interconnects with considerations in the philosophy of language and particularly speech-act issues.

It is in the third section of this book that Davies, through four fine papers, fully articulates his foundational insight (which he acknowledges is related to, and he usefully compares it to, Peter Kivy's widely discussed "contour" theory) regarding appearance-expressionism. His most compact expression of it is strikingly straightforward: "The point is this: Anything that can wear an expression or have a gait, carriage, or bearing in the way a person's behavior may exhibit these things can present the aspect of an emotion characteristic in its appearance. Few non-sentient things will be able to meet these requirements, but among these few music will find a place" (p. 142). He here investigates some fascinating issues involving the power of the context of the full musical work to determine whether or not what he usefully calls "the mirroring response", the recognition of the specific emotional appearance-content by analogy to our own expressive gaits, carriages, bearings, and so forth, will be appropriate (other parts of the work, for example, may override what seems to "locally" justify that response). (This, incidentally, whether Davies wants to admit it or not, is illuminatingly parallel to the significance context has on the determinations of layered meanings of words.) He insightfully discusses how the musical work can provide the "space" for the contemplation of an emotion precisely because in musical form it has been divorced from the human contexts in which it arises, allowing a new or deepened understanding of the emotion. He works through his objections to the theory of the hypothetical persona in musical hearing (that the listener imagines the presence of a person who undergoes the emotional changes or alterations chartered by the music). His argument is, as (almost) always, detailed and sophisticated, but this point is central: for Davies, the listener to a greater extent projects onto, rather than perceives from (he does not use these terms), the work the persona, and that projection is too late to do the explanatory work it promises to do -- the listener projects after the emotive content has already been recognized, so the imagined persona is hardly an essential pre-condition of expressive hearing. The imaginary narrative of the persona's progress is indeed possible, but it follows, and only contingently, the "grasping of the music's nature", "recognizing its unity, integrity, symmetry, and so forth" (p. 168) upon which the narrative projection is cast.

Davies, as we saw above, introduced the distinction between a thick and a thin work. That very distinction might, with remarkable fittingness, also be applied to conceptions of language, and Davies own somewhat thin conception of language causes trouble beyond the scope of explicit formulations of the analogy between music and language. Discussing Peter Kivy's view that, as Davies succinctly expresses it, "expressive instrumental music recalls the tones and intonations with which emotions are given vocal expression" he judges the view dubious. His reason is telling: "It is true that blues guitar and jazz saxophone sometimes imitate singing styles and that singing styles sometimes recall the sobs, wails, whoops, and yells that go with ordinary occasions of expressiveness. For the general run of cases, though, music does not sound very like the noises made by people gripped by emotion" (p. 176). The implausibility that Davies sees is a function of his own thin view of language: both are powerful artists, but here he perhaps needs a close look at Henry James rather than Howlin' Wolf. If we (following Wittgenstein's suggestion) first investigate the astoundingly wide diversity and extraordinary range of what we call ordinary language, the pervasive musicality of our linguistic acts will be everywhere apparent. If we begin with a picture of persons seeing a cat on a mat and then, flatly, asserting the corresponding semantic content with explicit obedience to syntactic rules, we will indeed find Kivy's suggestions implausible. If we begin, however, with an awareness of the nuances of tone that convey the emotional content of, say, a greeting, a warning, a leg-pulling, a farewell, a condolence, a hope-against-odds, a query, an order, a fear, a promise, and so forth through the many thousands of things we actually do in language, the picture changes. And, in truth, of course, the list I have just given is far too brief to capture the musical aspect of our speech -- the list only dimly hints at it. A single case of saying a farewell to someone can have layers of tones -- a resignation on the surface, a momentary splash of anger, a hint of abiding attachment, an undercurrent of hope for reunion, an acceptance of separation, and countless other things. It might be said that, strictly speaking, these elements are not in the locution itself, and that -- what we would see in a transcript -- is what language really is. But that is not really to speak strictly -- strict speaking is yet another, contextually-seated thing -- but rather to speak thinly. It would be all too like saying that only those phrases in the language written by, or spoken by, a poet can have poetic content. But, just as the reach of the aesthetic is vastly greater than the explicitly artistic, the reach of the poetic is vastly greater than the set of all poems. And, whenever the language analogy comes into play as an explicit or implicit influence on our aesthetic thought, we should recall that the musical dimension of language is vastly more prevalent, as it variously manifests itself on a continuum from the most overt to the most subtle, than one might initially think when assuming that fact-stating propositional assertion is the essence of language (how often do we assert something?). A "thickening" of this kind not only reveals what is importantly plausible about Kivy's position (although it does significantly do that), it also calls into question the generalized applicability -- indeed the sense or, once again, the intelligibility of, the generic terms in which the thin conception of language is expressed ("assertion?"), and it renders otiose the employment of generic phrases (like Davies' "For the general run of cases") that close off our access to the details of human verbal expression that, each in their own way, show the content of the concept of musicality in speech. There is no more a "general run of cases" in language than there is in music.

There is, as we all know, a long, distinguished, and -- as many of us know -- deeply misleading intellectual tradition going back to Descartes that separates, not just nominally but ontologically, mind from matter, picturing the hermetically-sealed consciousness as the inward stage upon which thoughts appear -- and thus the place from which linguistic meaning emanates. Donald Davidson has rightly said that, even once this picture's worst faults are repudiated, its influence on thought is nevertheless difficult to escape. Davies says, in a summarizing passage, "I concluded that the resemblance claim is at its most plausible when it compares music's dynamic pattern to that apparent in nonverbal, behavioral expressions of emotion" (p. 184), and he has said, just previously, that his position is distinct from Kivy's in that Kivy "is more inclined … to find an expressive resemblance between music and the human voice" (p. 181, n 8.). Music, Davies argues, more resembles gait, carriage, and comportment than it does facial expressions on the one hand or the human voice on the other. But one wants to ask: what motivates the choice? What suggests the ontological divide separating the linguistic from the expressive gestures and dispositions of what we will now call the body? We should be thinking, not of the expression of initially-hermetically-enclosed propositional thought in language versus the gestural movements of the body (in which that Cartesian consciousness is contingently seated), but rather of a human person. Language is embodied, as are gesture, gait, carriage, and so forth, and the choice is framed in terms of a dubious intellectual inheritance. Davies does not for one moment in this fine and acute set of studies descend into any crude or explicit Cartesianism. But it is possible to write with his degree of philosophical exactitude and yet still show the veracity of Davidson's observation. Indeed, a "thicker" consideration of these matters as well would reveal that we do speak of bodily evidence separately from, rather than in indissoluble concert with, the verbal, but in cases where we detect an inconsistency between what is said and what is gesturally indicated. And there we might hear, in an expressive voice insisting on happiness, an undercurrent of saddened resignation that was first discerned in a trace of more heavily weighted comportment. I for one would suggest that the best analogy available here is not between music (as though that word named one uniform thing) and the voice (where this is understood as separated out from all the rest that human embodiment entails) or between music and the expressive dispositions of the body, but rather between music and the expressive dimensions of the embodied voice-with-gestural-movement, the person's voice. To choose one of two in truth indissoluble elements is rather like seeking a full accounting of the power of a melody but without considering its harmonic setting, or, perhaps better, it is like seeking a full accounting of the power of the thematic subject in a two-part fugue without considering its implicit harmonic implications and the relation of those implications to the second melodic line. Such an analytical program would strike any musical analyst as oddly and arbitrarily restrictive, as "thin" in a needless way. But then analysts are not beginning with a Cartesian dichotomy in the intuitive subterrain. And I do want to emphasize: the fact that I have identified what seemed to me to be a few missteps, while pointing out a few possible steps I wish Davies had taken, should not conceal another fact, i.e., that it is a great pleasure to walk a book-length in his shoes by giving this collection the close reading it clearly deserves.

The final section of Davies' book is devoted to questions of appreciation and evaluation. Here too, like the preceding three sections of the collection devoted in turn to ontology, to performance, and to expression, we find a cornucopia of exacting, precise, contributions that shed valuable light on why we value music as we do. This section alone could easily justify another review-essay of this length. But there is room to say here that we see, in a manner I for one take to be incontrovertible, the considerable advantage of having background training in harmonic, melodic, and rhythmic analysis, in ear training, and in musicianship. One would like to think that such advantages would be both evident and beyond dispute (rather like the training and background we expect and value of a surgeon, which only a lunatic or a fool would dispute). But Davies sees, here too with exacting clarity, what has gone awry, i.e., a democratic principle, of profound intrinsic value within its proper sphere, has been aesthetically misapplied. He writes:

We live in an age in which it is regarded both as offensive and as false to suggest there is not democratic equality among all kinds of music in their artistic value and among all listeners in their understandings of music. It seems also to be widely held that understanding comes simply as a result of one's giving oneself over to the music (as if there must be something wrong with a work that does not appeal at first hearing). The ideas that there are worthwhile degrees of musical understanding that might be attained only through years of hard work and that there are kinds of music that yield their richest rewards only to listeners prepared to undertake it smack of an intellectual elitism that has become unacceptable, not only in society at large but in the universities. 'Anti-democratic' ideas are rejected not just for music, of course, but across the social and political board, but the case for musical 'democracy' is especially strong, since almost everyone loves and enjoys some kind of music. Nevertheless, the arguments I have developed above suggest to me that many music lovers mistake the enjoyment they experience for the pleasure that would be afforded by deeper levels of understanding (p.232).

Indeed they do.