In Nick Hornby's novel How to be Good, Katie has to adjust to her husband's damascene conversion from a bitter, failed writer into an all-loving bodhisattva, and to a very different love-life:
It's as if he has been reading an article in a women's magazine of the 1950s about reintroducing romance into marriage, and I'm not at all sure that I want romance reintroduced into marriage. I was happy enough with David's button-pushing routine, which at least had the virtue of efficiency; now he is looking at me as though this were our first time in bed together, and we were about to embark on the most memorable interior journey of our lives.1
It's well to keep in mind, as one reads Ann van Sevenant extolling the virtues of reflection, self-awareness, and authenticity in bed, that a wide variety of expectations are brought there, and that sex as button-pushing can be satisfying. (Katie doesn't achieve orgasm with her new husband.)
Van Sevenant's intriguing book provides an existential, Heideggerian-infused, analysis of sex, and urges that we connect our sex to our being in the world and see lovemaking as an existential quest. We are to stop conceiving of sex (or "sexual entercourse") as a pre-conceived scenario, along the lines of a three-course meal, leading to an "exitological" conclusion and, instead, to continuously rewrite our sex-script and open up our intimacy (our "sexual outercourse") to the "abyssal encounter with what there is possibly to come." (23) Though the subjects covered in the book are provocative -- chapter titles include: Orgasm-centered Sex and Coitus-cide, Coitus Orthopedicus, Telesexuality and Immediate Sex -- more thought seems to have gone into these and other neologisms than into the subjects themselves. The book may hold the interest of close followers of contemporary continental philosophy -- Luce Irigaray on femininity; Deleuze and Guattari on orgasmic release; Levinas on the sexual relation -- but I would wager only those very close to this field, as these views are never critically engaged or presented in any great depth, but rather are usually cited in passing. Van Sevenant reveals a lack of interest in other philosophical approaches to these topics, and except for brief appearances by Roger Scruton and Igor Primoratz, one looks in vain for Anglo-American thinkers such as Camille Paglia, Andrea Dworkin, Michael Levin, Catherine MacKinnon, and Alan Soble. That is an author's prerogative, I suppose, but her superficial understanding of these thinkers (and of major philosophers in general) is shocking. For example, we learn (on page 37) that philosophy since Kant is not about revealing the nature of things, but learning how they are perceived and (on page 39) that thinking, since Heidegger, is not all rational. Of Primoratz's liberal critique of positive morality, van Sevenant says:
It is clear that Primoratz wishes to assert that off-course attitudes are not to be interpreted in terms of a moral category, but rather in terms of a logical category. Nevertheless, this very argument prevents him from saying that prostitution is slavery, that paedophilia is wrong, or that rape is unacceptable violence. (103)
Of course this is sheer nonsense and a misrepresentation of Primoratz's views. Primoratz holds that sex is value-neutral, though its context (say, between non-consenting individuals) can give it moral status (so that paedophilia violates the consent standard), and surely neither "prostitution is slavery" nor "rape is unacceptable violence" are true a priori so I fail to see how Primoratz is prevented from saying such things.
The absence of analytical views here, I must immediately add, is understandable, for continental philosophy has all but monopolized discussions of the intentional and psychological aspects of sex and love, leaving moral, legal, and political issues to the recent Anglo-American and feminist approaches. In spite of the fact that most of my comments here are critical, as I think the author fails to adequately motivate her eponymous critical device, the book deserves credit for bringing Heidegger, Sartre, and their offspring to bear on the changing sexual landscape. The Introduction quite effectively motivates an existential philosophy of sex, making clear its theme that distance is the sine qua non of sexual union -- recall Heidegger's "Everyone is the other, and no one is himself"2 -- and the book succeeds best when detailing the epistemic components of lovemaking:
Lovemaking is a contact with the other, with otherness, possibly with an ever greater openness, … The present study underlines the open aspect of the interrelation. … What emerges from such an approach is the distinction one learns to make between involved and uninvolved sexual interactions. And it seems to be a universal fact that we give preference to the former, that we find them to be more worthwhile and dignified …
Sexual outercourse is the most intense way of carrying out existence and of implicating our being in it: it occurs in the greatest intimacy between lovers, when both of them come in contact with existence, as they are touched by being, possibly at the mercy of what happens to them, of what is granted to them. (19-20)
The opening chapter, "Philosophy, Sexuality and Lovemaking" reveals that the book takes a different tack from that of "other studies which develop a metadiscourse … in which the authors engage in issues concerning sexual morality, politics and sexuality, sex and gender." (28) Forewarned is forearmed, and none of these usual topics are discussed in any depth, with sex cast in ontological, Heideggarian terms throughout the book. This leaves one, finally, feeling the way one often feels after reading Heidegger: teased yet cheated and left wishing for normative direction, or even concrete conclusions. When conceptual and normative issues are parenthetically touched upon, they are done so in such an unsystematic and dissociative way that one is left baffled. She begins "nevertheless, with a reflection on the difference between sex and love" and here it is:
On the one hand, the dividing line between sex and love seems to be almost immeasurably fine, especially with regard to phenomena (such as incest) that signal how appealing the desire is to overstep the line. On the other hand, a radical dividing line is needed, at least if one wishes to prevent inadmissible sexual behavior between loved ones. (29)
To start with, is the line between sex and love really this fine, as perhaps the one between the attitudes of lust and love is, as "the desire to overstep the line" indicates good old concupiscence? That step may be appealing, but it usually is a big one, and is hardly signaled by phenomena such as incest. Secondly, the need for such a dividing line does not spring from narrowly moralistic prescriptions, though it may issue in them, but reflects a conceptual chasm between sex and love. This is an example of a recurring confusion over normative and descriptive philosophy of sex.
Chapter 2, "Vitalism and Pansexuality" begins usefully enough by contrasting traditional vitalist or "organic" sexual economies, by which van Sevenant means those that put biology and the body as the locus of sexual energy and expression (and hence of ideological control) with pansexualist or "non-organic" ones, in which any thing or force can be sexualized. She quickly traces how postmodern views (such as Foucault, Bataille, and Deleuze) emerged out of "symbolical" [sic] ones such as Freud's, wherein even death had a sexual dimension. This discussion is reminiscent of some of Julia's Kristeva's work, which looks to find other, non-discursive, expressions of desire within thinkers such as Bernard de Clairvaux.
Chapter 3, "Solitary Sex", begins by attempting a typology of masturbatory practices, distinguishing childhood, teenage and even old-age forms. This attention to life span is intriguing. Most of the chapter discusses Lacan's notion of joy and fulfillment. She claims that the limits of the will are made clear in sexual arousal; that much of sex is uncontrollable is part of its attraction. She seems to argue for the Irigaray-like claim that women retain more autonomy than men in sex, because, "the whole vaginal movement, which indirectly stimulates the clitoris, can take place even without an exterior object intervening. The male erection is indeed more dependent on an exterior object, needs contact with another body, even if it be only clothing, in order to be further stimulated" (70). The philosophical implications of these mundane observations, and the book is replete with them, are left implicit, so implicit as to approach mental masturbation.
Sex is a two-way extension of the self and not a penetration of one (female) by the other (male) and Chapter 4, "Orgasm-Centered Sex and Coitus-cide", urges us to replace the subject-object conception of lovemaking with a "less linear, less hierarchic, less orgasm-centered, less mimetic, less symmetric" (86) one. Van Sevenant seeks to problematize the social constructs surrounding sex, including the sort of Mars-and-Venus paradigm governing each gender's expectations in bed. She rightly faults this as simplistic, and claims it leads to "coitus-cide" (essentially, faking orgasm). With the help of Levinas, she wonders if new "social constructs" -- she includes birth control, the simultaneous orgasm, and Viagra in a very odd assortment -- are as liberatory as claimed.
The ambivalence between her descriptive/analytical and prescriptive/normative aims for the book shows up clearly in her curious claims concerning these "social constructs". Her most direct target, "one of the major obstacles on the sexual scene", is "the idea that something specific should happen, in accordance with a preestablished development or progress" (p. 13). But nowhere do we learn what exactly the deficiency is in such a style (Katie's preferred style) of lovemaking, and given her sound concession that "the sexual is constituted by a never-ending amount of perspectives" (23), it is difficult to see why we should favor outercourse over innercourse. And what, then, are we to make of the following poignancy?
[O]ne should not forget that humans, however eager they may be to engage in sexual outercourse, must also make their peace with sexual intercourse, are very vulnerable to having sexual entercourse, or even to reconciling themselves, from time to time, with simple innercourse. (15)
In regard to the "tripartite" presentation of much of sexual education, i.e., where "sexual intercourse is presented in a linear way, composed like a three-course meal" of foreplay, orgasm (preferably simultaneous), and relaxation with afterplay, van Sevenant says:
This linearity has been disrupted and is being replaced by a more unpredictable interplay among the many aspects that surround the enjoyment of each other's presence. (75)
But is this an empirical claim, left unsupported by the author? Does she think it obvious? Perhaps it is, and it receives some support from the fact that, in recent decades, our attitudes to deviant and kinky sexual behaviors have "softened" considerably but consider how she continues:
This more unpredictable interplay should not be interpreted as a technique, a mechanism to be manipulated. With regard to penetration, for instance, it is documented that many young girls will agree to a kiss, if the boy promises to go no further. A boy who keeps his promise will thus find himself admitted to further touching, to the stroking of the breasts, thighs, etc. It sometimes even turns out that such reserve is the best strategy to make her eventually consent to intercourse. Young girls who are aware of this mechanism may be reproached by the boys, who feel frustrated and no longer know which of their actions will lead to a satisfactory result. In fact, during the last decade, male partners have been confronted with what appear to them as strategies employed by the female partner to assume control over the relation. This is bound to happen whenever sexuality is thought of in terms of power. (75)
As a male, I can attest to being confronted with these strategies, but I seem to recall such frustration for as long as I've been promising anything that might result in the aforementioned satisfactory result while simultaneously, yet unconsciously, thinking of sex in terms of power. (I mean to say: I don't know what to make of this passage, and the book is replete with ones like it.) Where are these techniques "documented"? Why is any of this "with regard to penetration" and relevant to the three-course meal plan, which perhaps the boy and girl in question would both find "satisfactory"? Why does it only "sometimes work out" to promise kissing sans pressure for sex? Why are these confrontations "bound to happen whenever sexuality is thought of in terms of power"? The general tenor of this passage is representative of much of Sexual Outercourse; it reads like a loose patchwork of tentatively advanced observations, strung together as an exercise in free association.
Sexual Outercourse fails to provide straightforward answers to fairly straightforward questions in the philosophy of sex. What is the goal of sex, you ask?
[Sexual Outercourse] thus offers a presentation of human existence in which the accent is not solely on the achievement of a pre-determined goal, but neither is it on the absence of a goal. (122)
What role does biology play in gender differences, you wonder? Well, while "biological factors cannot justify everything, neither can they be overlooked" (74). Does commerce preclude consent in sex, say, with a prostitute? Not necessarily (138). Is such sex non-morally bad? It may be (32). In typical post-modernist fashion, no single "perspective" on sex is to be favored over any other, even the criticism of the "three-course meal" plan on offer here:
Foreplay … usually protects against an overly direct physical entercourse. … In such a case, the tripartite composition of the love act may actually turn out to not just a traditional vision, but one that holds promise of a future. (75)
"Usually", "in such a case", "may" … who could object to such an insipid normative analysis?
Chapters 6 through 10, comprise Part Two of the book, but the rationale of this grouping escapes me, as the discussion continues to roam all over the landscape of sex. (Pornography appears and disappears in one footnote on page 207.) In Chapter 6, "The Excursive Character of Lovemaking", our quest for "better" sex is delimited via negativa, by citing a report of "nonexcursive sexual innercourse" from the field:
When I sleep with my husband I like to lie on my back. And while he is busy, I feel very, very nice, I shiver with pleasure, and as he keeps pushing I feel it nicer than anything I have ever had under the sun, and I like him more and more … And when he discharges into me, it is nicer than ever …
Sounds lovely enough, but there's apparently a problem, as we are told:
… sexual outercourse could sound like this: "When we make love, we explore together the deep extensive space that we discover in each other's eyes, while we embrace and caress the silky skin of our bodies and souls. Every contraction of our genitals is an attempt to kiss each other, right there, right on the spot where our bodies separate. Again and again, an immeasurable fine-tuning pulling us away from closeness, so that we can take off to an even greater extension …" (110, fn. 13)
While I appreciate the poetry of the latter, I fail to see why the sex it describes is any more valuable than the innercourse described by the former? My biases incline me towards articulate romantic poets for lovers -- sometimes anyway -- but as long as Stanley turns Stella's lights on, consensually of course, then who needs such excursions? Janice Moulton's critique of Thomas Nagel's and Robert Solomon's theories of perversion springs to mind in this regard.3 She argued that their claims regarding the goals of normal sex -- respectively, heightened interpersonal awareness and communication -- more accurately characterize sexual anticipation than the attitudes at work in typical, unadorned sex. The same could be said of much of the grandiloquence of van Sevenant.
There are useful insights amongst this debris. For instance that even "normal" lovemaking often involves perverted, abnormal, or "off course behavior" and that these are part of its excursive character. (There is a missing "open quotation" mark at the start of a brief quote from Freud on 105.) The notion that all sex is unnatural or "prosthetic" -- see Chapter 7, "Coitus Orthopaedicus" -- is also intriguing. Van Sevenant here argues that birth control and recent reproductive technologies destabilize the notion of natural sex as normative; and, going beyond this, that Fromm's idealization of orgasm as the answer to alienation, in addition to much of the recent compulsive pedagogy over proper sexual technique and performance, add further technocratic obstacles to excursive sex. In addition, the book usefully summarizes some exciting new thinkers and trends in the areas of "virtual sex" (such as Claudia Springer) and there is, in Chapter 6, a worthwhile excursus on Heidegger's credo that "the future is a matter of decision" and a discussion of the temporality, contingency and spontaneity of lovemaking.
In conclusion, Ann van Sevenant is to be commended for probing the existential and epistemic dimensions of sex and lovemaking, but without a grounding in some sort of theory of value or normative axis, it's hard to recommend sexual outercourse or Sexual Outercourse.
1 Hornby, Nick. How to be Good, (New York: Penguin Putnam, 2001). Page 74; all subsequent page references are to van Sevenant.
2 Being and Time, tr. John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson (New York: Harper and Row, 1962) ¤27, 165
3 "Sexual Behavior: Another Position," in Alan Soble (ed.) The Philosophy of Sex: Contemporary Readings, 4th edition, 31-38, (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2002).