2006.02.10

Gotthold Ephraim Lessing, H.B. Nisbet (trans. and ed.)

Philosophical and Theological Writings

Gotthold Ephraim Lessing, Philosophical and Theological Writings, translated and edited by H.B. Nisbet, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 280pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521538475.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Y. Melamed, University of Chicago


"Not the truth which someone possesses or believes he possesses, but the honest effort he has made to get at the truth, constitutes a human being's worth. For it is not through the possession of truth, but through its pursuit, that his powers are enlarged, and it is in this alone that his ever growing perfection lies. Possession makes us inactive, lazy and proud." (98).

There is something peculiar about Lessing's (1729-1781) philosophical works. The reader is not likely to find in these texts any systematic exposition of a difficult issue. Yet, the more one reads the text the more one gets the impression that something interesting philosophically is being done here. It is not difficult to trace the philosophical and literary tradition to which these writings belong; Montaigne, Bayle, and (under some interpretations) Kierkegaard are three names that come easily to mind. The skeptical sympathies of these philosophers seem to have a close connection to their ability to write polyphonic texts and real dialogues (rather than Socratic preaching to the surrounding straw men). For the skeptic, the success in creating a philosophical polyphony (i.e., a text in which several competing positions are presented in their force) may usefully lead to the desired conclusion of suspension of judgment. Yet neither Lessing nor the other aforementioned figures were in any sense pyrrhonic skeptics. In their case (or perhaps cases) skepticism has much more to do with the politics of tolerance than with any metaphysical conviction.

The non-systematic nature of Lessing's philosophical works may provide a partial explanation for the sparse interest paid to him in the Anglo-American philosophical world. Indeed, as of today the standard English study of Lessing's philosophy is still Henry Allison's remarkable, yet forty-year-old, book: Lessing and the Enlightenment (Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1966). Obviously, the availability of high-quality translations is also necessary for a development of wide and serious engagement with Lessing's philosophical writing, and in this respect Cambridge's "Green" series -- the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy, in which the current volume appears -- continues the highly important task of widening the scope of historical texts that are taught and discussed in Anglo-American philosophy programs.

The translator and editor, H.B. Nisbet, has produced some of the best translations of German philosophical texts into English.1 The present edition follows the same high standards. The fine translation is accompanied by an editorial introduction and notes that are very helpful in clarifying the various contexts of the essays.

The essays collected in the book belong mostly to two main groups. One group deals with Lessing's reception and evaluation of Spinoza and Leibniz (and of Leibniz's relation to Spinoza), while the other focuses on the controversy that ensued following Lessing's publication of Reimarus' boldly anti-Christian Fragments. To the first group belong the early short pieces, "The Christianity of Reason" (c. 1753), "On the reality of things outside God" (1763), "Spinoza only put Leibniz on the track of pre-established harmony" (1763), the essay "Leibniz on eternal punishment" (1773), and Jacobi's report on his conversation with Lessing in August 1780, shortly before Lessing's death. A careful reader of the early texts will easily find in them a deep sympathy with Spinoza's philosophy which appears to go as far as endorsing Spinoza's pantheism (see Lessing's denial of "the reality of things outside God", pp. 30-1), but it is the latter text -- the conversation with Jacobi -- that initiated one of the major events in the history of modern philosophy: the Pantheisumusstreit.

As we shall soon see, by 1780 Lessing could hardly be suspected of orthodoxy. Yet when in 1785, four years after Lessing's death, Jacobi published the alleged transcription of their 1780 conversation which included the following lines, it became immediately clear that something of great consequence had happened.

"Lessing: I have no more use for the orthodox concepts of the deity; they give me no satisfaction. 'Hei kai pan' ['One and all']. I know nothing else …

Jacobi: Then you would be pretty much in agreement with Spinoza.

Lessing: If I must call myself after anyone, I know of no one else" (243).

Lessing did not stop just by revealing his own sympathy to Spinoza, but went further and suggested that he was not the only Spinozist around.

Lessing: "… Good. But what sort of conceptions do you have of your personal, extramundane deity? Those of Leibniz, perhaps? I fear that he was himself a Spinozist at heart.

Jacobi: Do you really mean it?

Lessing: Do you really doubt it?" (247).

The accusation that Leibnizians were crypto-Spinozists had loomed since the beginning of the century, and the endorsement of this view by a respected figure such as Lessing could not pass silently. The detailed story of the development of the Pantheism-controversy cannot be told here for obvious reasons,2 but it will suffice here to suggest that one of the immediate results of the controversy was the rehabilitation of the philosophy of the "damned" Spinoza, a rehabilitation that played a crucial role in the formation of German Idealism a decade later.

The Jacobi-Lessing conversation dealt with some of the more general features of Spinoza's philosophy, and it seems that for Lessing the endorsement of Spinozism was primarily an endorsement of Spinoza's pantheism, and of his rejection of free will3 (and perhaps also of final causation (249)). It was not an endorsement of the delicate machinery of the Ethics, but it was still markedly a bold and significant expression of agreement with Spinoza.

Incidentally -- or perhaps not so much so -- Jacobi first revealed the content of his conversation with Lessing in a letter -- dated July 21, 1783 -- to Elise Reimarus, the daughter of Herman Samuel Reimarus.4 The latter was the unmentioned author of the Wolffenbüttler Fragmente, whose publication by Lessing enraged the German Protestant establishment (and which are at the center of the other group of essays in this volume). Reimarus (1694-1768) was an impressive scholar of wide interests. He was a proponent of natural religion -- which was for him constituted primarily by the beliefs in a beneficial and wise creator and the immortality of the soul -- and a bold critic of revelation and miracles. Upon his death in 1768 Reimarus left a thick manuscript -- entitled Apology or Defense of the Rational Worshippers of God [Apologie oder Schutzschrift für die vernünftigen Verehrer Gottes] -- which circulated among his friends. The treatise argued that the bible is a collection of lies, absurdities, and contradictory testimonies, whose aim was to promote the political ambitions of the biblical authors and the apostles. In 1770 Lessing was appointed Librarian to the Prince of Brunswick at Wolffenbüttel (a position formerly held by Leibniz). Shortly before assuming this position he got an early draft of Reimarus' Apologie from the latter's daughter, Elise. Lessing was astonished by the content of the treatise; later he would claim that the treatise's author "has mounted nothing less than a full-scale onslaught on the Christian religion" (96). It was clear that no censor would ever permit the publication of the treatise. However, when in 1772 Lessing was granted permission to publish rare manuscripts from the Wolffenbüttel library collection without submitting them first to the censor, he seized the opportunity and published a single and rather innocuous excerpt from the treatise that advocated the toleration of deists (1774). When the latter's publication passed calmly he went on, and in 1777 published five more fragments. This time, however, the content of the fragments was far more provocative. Among other things the fragments pointed out various contradictions in the story of the resurrection, and suggested that Jesus was a Jewish nationalist whose aim was the "temporal redemption of Israel" rather than "becoming a suffering spiritual savior of men." Lessing published the texts under the title "Wolffenbüttler Fragmente" pretending to find them in his library collection, while intentionally withdrawing the name of the author. Lessing accompanied the publication with editorial commentary (61-82) that made clear that although he considered the Fragments to be highly important he did not endorse the views of their author. Since Lessing's editorial commentary included an explicit criticism of the religious importance of the bible -- "[I]t must also be possible for everything that the evangelists and apostles wrote to be lost once more and for the religion they taught to continue to exist" (63) -- and of the Lutheran adherence to the letter of the bible, he could hardly have expected that the publication would pass quietly.

It is hard to figure out Lessing's intent in publishing the Fragments. Seemingly, Lessing, the foremost German dramatist of the day, was about to test his talent in authoring a real-life drama. Nisbet sensibly suggests that Lessing's primary aim was to provoke the 'neologists' or liberal protestant camp which Lessing viewed as "a half-baked religion, as well as half-baked philosophy, inferior both to the older Lutheran orthodoxy and to the radical deism of Reimarus, both of which at least possessed the virtue of intellectual honesty" (7). Yet, as one could expect, the characters in this plot refused to play their role, and the major and most furious response came from Johan Melchior Goeze, one of the leading figures of Lutheran orthodoxy (and a figure who was held in high respect by Lessing). Thus came about what turned out to be "the greatest controversy in German Protestantism in the eighteenth century, if not since the Reformation era" (8).

Lessing's response to Goeze is a polemic masterpiece, and the reader is invited to consult the text itself. If I were to change anything about this fine edition it would be to include parts of Reimarus' Fragments and of Goeze's criticism,5 in the absence of which we remain somewhat in the dark regarding the controversy, especially the perspectives of the other parties to the dispute. Be that as it may, the current edition is a marvelous contribution to the corpus of English translations of modern philosophy, and I have little doubt that it will be highly appreciated by both students and scholars.


1 Kant, Political Writings, edited by Hans Reiss and translated by H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1970 [1991 2nd enlarged edition]. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, edited by Allen W. Wood and translated by H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991). Hegel, Political Writings, edited by Laurence Dickey and H.B. Nisbet, translated by H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).

2 For discussion of the Pantheismussterit, see Fredrick C. Beiser, The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte (Harvard University Press: Cambridge Mass., 1987), chapters 2-4). Some of the main texts of the controversy were translated by Gérard Vallée (The Spinoza Conversations between Lessing and Jacobi, University Press of America: Lanham, 1988), and George di Giovanni (Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, The Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill, McGill-Queen's University Press: Montreal, 1994). Most of the original German texts are included in Scholz, H. Die Hauptschriften zur Pantheismusstreit zwischen Jacobi und Mendelssohn. Berlin: 1916. A reprint of this edition has just been published (Waltrop: Spenner, 2004).

3 "Lessing: I see you would like to have a free will. I have no desire for free will" (246).

4 The three-sided correspondence between Jacobi, Elise Reimarus, and Moses Mendelssohn is of crucial importance to understanding the development of the Pantheismusstreit. Surprisingly, one of these letters -- Elise Reimarus' letter to Mendelssohn, dated April 10, 1784 -- is still unpublished. This manuscript is currently held by the library of the Hebrew Union College in Cincinnati (see Fritz Bamberger, Spinoza and Anti-Spinoza Literature: The Printed Literature of Spinozism 1665-1832

5 For an English translation of the Wolffenbüttler Fragmente, see H.S. Reimarus, Fragments, edited by Charles H. Talbert and translated by Ralph S. Fraser (Philadelphia, Fortress Press, 1970). A two-volume selection of texts from Reimarus' manuscript (which includes the fragments published by Lessing) is available in a modern German edition: Herman Samuel Reimarus, Apologie oder Schutzschrift für die vernünftigen Verehrer Gottes, hrsg.von Gerhard Alexander (Frankfurt a.M.: Insel Verlag, 1972). For Goeze's attacks on Lessing, see Goezes streitschriften gegen Lessing, hrsg. von Erich Schmidt (Stuttgart: G.J. Göschen, 1893). The latter texts are also included in Wilfried Barner's edition of Lessing's Werke und Briefe (Frankfurt a.M.: Deutscher klassiker Verlag, 1985-2003), vol. 9, pp. 11-37.