2006.02.17

Anna Sierszulska

Meinong on Meaning and Truth

Anna Sierszulska, Meinong on Meaning and Truth, Ontos Verlag, 2005, 262 pp, € 78,00/$96.00 (hbk), ISBN 3937202943.

Reviewed by Dale Jacquette, The Pennsylvania State University, Netherlands Institute for Advanced Study (NIAS)


Alexius Meinong broke new ground in his development of object theory (Gegenstandstheorie) and intentionalist philosophical psychology. Following in the footsteps of his teacher Franz Brentano, Meinong dared to oppose deeply entrenched attitudes in logic, philosophical semantics, and ontology. He did so conscientiously, because he was convinced that Brentano in his (1874) Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkt was right to maintain that all psychological states are intentional, that all are characteristically about something by virtue in every case of being directed upon an intended object.

For Meinong, the intentionality of thought implied the necessity of recognizing at least as semantic targets of reference and true predications such beingless objects, among unlimitedly many others, as the golden mountain and round square. We think and talk and argue about such things, according to Meinong, even though by accident or definition they neither exist in spacetime nor subsist in an abstract Platonic order. It is the golden mountain and round square themselves as intended objects of thought that we judge not to exist when we recognize that there are not or cannot be such things, rather than some other objects or no objects at all. The golden mountain on this account is truly golden and a mountain, and the round square truly round and square, even though these intended objects of thought and its expression in language have no place in ontology. That, indeed, is why we are able to conclude that they do not exist, because we do not find in the world of existent objects any entities with just these combinations of properties. Plato in his dialogues the Parmenides and Sophist had previously explored the puzzles that arise when we try to say that a certain object does not exist. Whereas for Plato paradoxically and later thinkers paraphrastically it has seemed obvious that an object cannot have a property, even the property of not existing, unless after all it has being in some sense, Meinong took the bull by the horns and made it a cornerstone of his semantics and metaphysics to say that we can refer to and truly predicate properties of intended objects regardless of their ontic status. Thus, Meinong's object theory in semantics and metaphysics sprouted from the seed of Brentano's intentionality thesis in the philosophy of mind.

Sprouted -- but for many years not encouraged to thrive as vigorously it might have, and as Meinong and his followers hoped and assumed it would. The history of logic and semantic philosophy has not been gracious to Meinong's proposal. Anti-Meinongian polemics beginning with Bertrand Russell's influential criticisms in the first decade of the twentieth century have been harsh and stereotypically uninformed even concerning the main outlines of Meinong's philosophy. The stock objections are all too frequently delivered by critics who have not bothered to read, let alone study with any degree of sympathy, the extensive Alexius Meinong Gesamtausgabe (Collected Works). Russell, as the hero of early analytic philosophy, in his (1903) Principles of Mathematics, his epochal (1905) essay, 'On Denoting', (1919) Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy, and in a series of reviews for the journal Mind between 1904 and 1906 on Meinong's writings, gravitated from a cautious admiration of Meinong's project to virulent rejection. Whether Russell fully understood Meinong at any point in this odyssey is a question scholars continue to debate. Many historians who have examined Russell's objections to object theory with care have concluded on the contrary that Russell did not grasp certain of Meinong's key distinctions, just as he did not clearly understand aspects of Gottlob Frege's logic on its own terms, and as a result falsely attributed to Meinong views that, true enough, could not stand philosophical scrutiny, but were never a part of Meinong's teachings in the first place.

With the powerful impact Russell had on the development of twentieth-century philosophy, his criticisms of Meinong carried disproportionate weight among thinkers who read Russell instead of Meinong in deciding that Meinong was not only wrong but so deeply confused as not to deserve more careful study on his own. The secondary literature is littered with shallow red herring attacks against Meinong for his alleged incoherencies, attributing to him such absurdities as the view that there exist objects that do not exist, or that the golden mountain and round square must somehow have being in order to stand as intended objects of thought, despite Meinong's explicit avowal that they are altogether beingless.

It is therefore an important occasion when a book like this new study by Anna Sierszulska stands up to Meinong's typically obtuse extensionalist critics with solid textual research and plausible argumentation. Meinong's philosophy to be understood needs to be presented sympathetically first in order to be competently criticized, avoiding what Meinong himself referred to in his (1904) essay 'Über Gegenstandstheorie' as 'the prejudice in favor of the actual'. For those who, if not at least partly in harmony with Meinong's project, believe that philosophy requires an unbiased appraisal of all contributions to its history, the steady trickle of such expositions provide a breath of fresh air in a prevailing atmosphere of misdirected ideological hostility and dismissal of Meinong's work.

Sierszulska skillfully knits together many infrequently discussed aspects of Meinong's semantics and metaphysics. She focuses on Meinong's theory of Objektive (objectives), which have standardly been interpreted as subsuming both propositions and states of affairs. Clarifying Meinong's theory of objectives is indispensable to understanding his intentionalist phenomenological concept of meaning. Sierszulska argues that objectives are equally essential for Meinong's theory of truth attributions to the meaningful contents of such objective-intending mental states as judgments and assumptions, and, for that matter also, although she does not extend her discussion in this direction, for emotions, and, in an appropriately tailored Brentanian sense of the word, for all presentations (Vorstellungen), including the intentionality of sensory perceptions of ordinary empirical phenomena.

Sierszulska valiantly takes on some of the most difficult topics in Meinong studies. Her book is divided into four main parts, including an Introduction: I. Objectives and Other Objects of Intentional Reference; II. Meaning and Truth; III. Meinong's Truth in the Eyes of his Critics; and IV. Meinong's Theory in the Perspective of Philosophical Semantics. The book culminates in a Conclusion, The Costs of Preserving Epistemological Realism, followed by a Bibliography and Index of Names. A total of nine chapters are divided up between the book's four main parts, covering topics relevant to Meinong's metaphysics, philosophical semantics, epistemology and philosophy of mind. The emphasis throughout, as the title portends, is on Meinong's theory of truth and its relation to his commitment to the ontic category of objectives.

Sierszulska begins by taking sides on a recent controversy about the correct interpretation of Meinong's doctrine of Außersein. Two different accounts have emerged. One is that Meinong regards Außersein as the realm of whatever falls outside of ontology by virtue lacking being (Sein) in either of the two senses Meinong allows, following the Scholastic tradition imbibed from Brentano, in distinguishing between spatiotemporal existence (Existenz) and abstract subsistence (Bestand). The other construal is that according to Meinong every object, including those that happen to exist or subsist, can be considered in an ontically neutral way, somewhat in the manner of Edmund Husserl's suspension of ontic commitment to objects of thought in the epoché, as belonging to an 'extraontology', as one literal translation of the concept of Außersein. Sierszulska opts for the latter interpretation, treating 'pure' objects as belonging to a non- or extraontological order where Meinong's independence and indifference theses hold sway. Here we are invited to think of any potentially intended object of thought in terms exclusively of its Sosein or so-being, something like its intensional Fregean Sinn or sense, consisting of its characterizing or constitutive properties (konstitutorische Bestimmungen), such as being golden and a mountain or round and square, without ontic commitment to or even consideration of an object's ontic status as existent, subsistent, or altogether beingless.

Sierszulska maintains on the basis of this interpretation that Meinong's objectives as objects (by courtesy) of higher-order belong to Außersein. Thus, she writes: '[O]bjectives are abstract entities belonging to Aussersein' (7). I find this classification problematic for two reasons. First, if it is true as Sierszulska wants to hold that any and all intended objects belong to Außersein when considered as pure objects, then it would be trivially true to include objectives insofar as they are made objects of thought in the Meinongian extraontology. Second, if objectives are supposed to be abstract entities, as Sierszulska says, then surely they subsist, and thereby possess the mode of being that the Scholastic tradition regards as peculiar to abstract entities. What I do not understand is how Sierszulska or Meinong on Sierszulska's account could consistently have it both ways -- making Außersein a realm of ontically neutral 'semantic' objects in her terminology, while at the same time treating objectives in particular as abstract entities belonging to Außersein.

This is a delicate problem for Sierszulska. For her analysis of Meinong's concepts of meaning and truth depends on taking the semantics of objectives in quasi-Fregean fashion as function-like entities rather than as states of affairs. The interpretation, whatever its merits as a theory about what Meinong may have intended, is clearly incompatible with the view of Meinong's student Rudolf Ameseder, who famously asserts that when objectives obtain, they not only have being, but they literally are being. Meinong, to be sure, is not obligated to agree with Ameseder, but the fact is that on at least one important occasion Meinong does in fact endorse Ameseder's slogan on just this point. In Über Annahmen (1910, second edition), Meinong writes: '[T]he indirect path taken by R. Ameseder serves in an excellent way to give a precise description of the facts about object and objective, by which usage one could say: Every object has Being (or Nonbeing). But there are objects that not only have Being (in this broadest sense), but also are Being, and these objects are the objectives, while that which has Being, without being Being, is thereby characterized as an object' (p. 61; my translation).

It would be exciting news for Meinong scholars to learn that Meinong at some stage changed his mind and parted company with Ameseder on the metaphysics of objectives. Sierszulska unfortunately offers no textual evidence or philosophical arguments in support of this potentially significant thesis. Indeed, Sierszulska's book makes no mention of or reference to Ameseder whatsoever. This is a remarkable omission, in light of the fact that most historians of Meinong's philosophy recognize his theory of objectives as profoundly influenced by Ameseder's proposition that the sum of objectives that happen to obtain are collectively coextensive with being.

Similarly, Sierszulska waffles on the question of whether objectives are properly classified as objects (Objecta) for Meinong. The above quotation from the early Meinong makes it clear that in this phase of his thinking at least he unequivocally included objectives as objects. Sierszulska challenges this categorization in her monograph, when she writes: 'Since objectives are the proper objects intended in acts of judgment and assumption, they are called objects as well, even though they are neither real existing objects, nor do they belong to the general category of objecta' (40). Here is another important thesis for which Sierszulska stakes a potentially exciting claim but offers no documentation from Meinong's voluminous writings. If objects generally are intended by acts of judgment and assumption (and emotion and presentation), and if not all objects exist anyway, notoriously including such beingless objects as the golden mountain and round square, then it should certainly be no stretch to regard objectives as subsumed also by the general category of objecta; on the contrary, it should be obligatory to categorize them as such, precisely as Meinong asserts. What is more, Meinong in many places appears to endorse exactly the position that Sierszulska is at pains to deny, that for Meinong, as for Ameseder, objectives are at once both propositions and states of affairs.

I found it curious in this regard that Sierszulska does not explore an obvious connection involving the identification of objectives as (true or false) propositions and (existent or nonexistent) states of affairs that we find for example in Rudolf Hermann Lotze, who was briefly Frege's teacher and whose ideas carry weight in Husserl's later conception of the logic of propositions. An even more important oversight is any discussion of the early Wittgenstein in Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, who tells us, for example, in 4.012, 4.021 and 4.03, that propositions are pictures of facts, and in 2.14 and 2.141 that pictures are themselves facts. This stance is remarkably close to the conventional identification of objectives as both propositions and states of affairs in Meinong and Ameseder. It would have been extremely useful as a result for Sierszulska to have compared her interpretation of Meinong on these subjects with Lotze and Wittgenstein. She seems to think that it is hopeless to identify propositions with states of affairs in a properly unified concept of objectives, but she seems unaware or in any case chooses not to discuss the fact that there is a history of such syntheses in the philosophy of logic and semantics preceding Frege, Meinong, and Russell.

Sierszulska gets many things right about Meinong's ideas where other commentators have failed to understand the depth and complexity of his philosophy. The first half of the book is driven by a close examination of certain parts of Meinong's writings, even if the exposition does not always proceed as thoroughly in every respect as it might. The latter half of the book is marked in contrast by Sierszulska's departure from linear exegesis as a foundation for interpretation, but launches out more freely into philosophical argument that is not nearly so tightly connected to or supported by Meinong's texts. Even in those places where Sierszulska delves into Meinong's original writings, she offers almost nothing in her account to clue the innocent reader to the fact that Meinong changed his mind over time about certain of his central theses, many of which are relevant to the evolution of his theory of objectives. Readers who already have a detailed grasp at least of the main outlines of Meinong's philosophy should be able to benefit from many of the subtle, and in my opinion doctrinally correct, turns in Sierszulska's interpretation of Meinong on the topics of meaning and truth. Others, I fear, who may be entirely new to his way of thinking, who have been corrupted by the deluge of baseless criticism and misinformation about Meinong, or who do not already possess a firm background in Brentano's intentionalism and the history of early Austrian phenomenology, are more likely to be baffled by many features of this discussion as it plunges into specialized topics in Meinong's object theory without laying down a proper motivation for interest in this field.