Axel Honneth


Axel Honneth, Verdinglichung, Suhrkamp, 2005, 107pp, 14,90 EUR (pbk), ISBN 3518584448.

Reviewed by Frederick Neuhouser, Barnard College, Columbia University

Axel Honneth's most recent book is based on the Tanner Lectures he delivered in 2005 at the University of California, Berkeley. Its aim is to re-examine one of the central categories of twentieth-century Marxist thought -- Verdinglichung, or reification -- with an eye to determining what in the concept, if anything, remains of philosophical value today. Honneth argues that, properly reconceived, reification continues to be a significant phenomenon in the contemporary world and, so, a worthy object of philosophical study. In doing so he distinguishes three broad types of reification -- in a subject's relations to the objective world, to other subjects, and to himself -- and argues that all can be understood as manifestations of a single, underlying deficiency. Elaborating on Horkheimer's and Adorno's suggestive remark that "all reification is a forgetting," Honneth locates the essential character of reification in Anerkennungsvergessenheit, or "forgotten recognition." (A literal but less elegant translation would be 'forgottenness of recognition'.) The book's basic project, then, is to explain the phenomenon of forgotten recognition and to show how it underlies all three types of reification.

The locus classicus of the theory of reification is Georg Lukács's History and Class Consciousness (1925), though its central idea is set out already by Marx in the provocative but frustratingly obscure section of Capital entitled "The Secret of Commodity Fetishism." Because of this history of the concept, Honneth characterizes his aim as "reformulating Lukács's concept of reification" so as to make it relevant to contemporary critical social theory (28, 107). This description of the book is somewhat misleading, however, since very little of Lukács's original view -- and even less of Marx's -- remains in the theory of reification that Honneth develops. The allusions to Lukács, though rhetorically understandable, tend to obscure the fact that Honneth's book is much less a reconstructive enterprise than the erection of a new edifice on a thoroughly cleared plot of ground. Some readers will no doubt wish for a more sympathetic engagement with the original theory of reification (though one welcome effect of the book will certainly be that it will motivate some of its readers to re-examine Lukács's theory in order to challenge Honneth's criticisms of it.)

This, however, is a minor disappointment. For the book, though short, contains a wealth of provocative thoughts on the nature and causes of a broad group of phenomena that, as it persuasively argues, can fruitfully be understood as reification. And although its portrait of Lukács makes him look pallid and droopy, the book does an exemplary job of explaining and appropriating the ideas of a wide variety of other twentieth-century thinkers, including Heidegger, Dewey, and Stanley Cavell. One of the book's great strengths, apart from the fact that it is certain to inaugurate a lively discussion of reification in the philosophical literature, is that it sets an excellent example of how contemporary philosophers can engage creatively and sympathetically with views that come from very different places on the philosophical spectrum. There is an undeniable eclecticism at work in Honneth's text, and though those with a "purist" sensibility may find this problematic, it strikes me as embodying a general openness to truth wherever it can be found that is among the best elements of Critical Theory's legacy.

The aspect of Lukács's complex account of reification that Honneth sets out to appropriate is its diagnosis of the modern pathology of Teilnahmslosigkeit -- lack of participatory involvement -- in which agents are "no longer emotionally affected by what happens" (23) but instead habitually adopt the perspective of a distanced, neutral observer on the persons, objects, and events of their world. The widespread absence of "active participation and existential involvement" (29) on the part of modern subjects is a part --though, as Honneth admits, only a small part -- of the phenomenon Lukács attempted to theorize under the rubric of reification. What makes Teilnahmslosigkeit a form of reification is that habitually taking a purely contemplative, emotionally neutral point of view on the natural and social worlds, and even on one's own qualities and capacities, renders those "objects" of experience thinglike, which is to say: they are instrumentalized -- accorded a purely instrumental value -- and the worlds they make up cease to be meaningful frameworks for human action and interaction.

One of the intriguing features of Honneth's theory is his account of what makes reification objectionable. The problem, as both Marx and Lukács would agree, is not that reification is unjust or that it violates a moral principle. It is, instead, a social pathology, though here again Honneth's reasons for regarding it as such diverge fundamentally from Lukács's (or at least from what Honneth calls the "official version" of his position). For Honneth, reification is pathological not because it falls short of an ideal standard of "true" or genuinely human activity, whether of the sort supplied by Marx's philosophical anthropology (free, conscious, social production) or by the metaphysics of German Idealism (the identity of spirit and world, where objects are but the results of a subject's autonomous activity). Reification is pathological, rather, because it represents the "atrophy or distortion of an original praxis in which the human being takes up a practically involved relation to himself and his world" (27). In other words, reification rests on a failure to acknowledge -- a forgetting of -- some more primary relation to the world and to oneself that, as Heidegger famously put it, is "always already" present in or presupposed by a distanced, contemplative stance to the world.

This is the point at which recognition enters the picture, for it is precisely a kind of recognitive relation that Honneth claims has been forgotten in reification. This view rests on the general thesis that "in the human being's relation to himself and to the world an affirmative, recognitive attitude is prior, genetically as well as conceptually, to all other attitudes" (39). (As one would expect, Honneth devotes considerable energy to establishing both the genetic and the conceptual priority of recognition. There is a great deal of interest in his arguments for both -- to my mind his case for the former is more convincing than his case for the latter -- but it is not possible to do justice to these arguments here.) Having argued for the priority of recognition, Honneth is in a position to define the phenomenon he has set out to study: reification consists in and issues from -- it is both a process and a result -- a subject's losing sight of the original recognitive relation that is the condition of all human knowing and acting. On Honneth's account, reification is present not just any time someone takes up an "objective" (neutral, disengaged) attitude to things or persons but only when he loses consciousness of the measure to which his knowledge of them depends on his prior recognition of, or involvement with, the "objects" of his knowledge (68, 69).

A mundane though illustrative example of intersubjective reification is the tennis player who, in focusing so intently on the aim of winning, loses sight of "all other, possibly more original motives and ends" (71), such as the fact that his opponent is his friend and that the less egoistic rewards of friendship motivated their play originally. This counts as a paradigm case of reification because the tennis player has lost sight of a previous recognitive relation that is the condition of his present activity -- the single end of winning so dominates his attention to his world that all of its features not relevant to that end retreat into the background and are "forgotten." Other paradigmatic examples of intersubjective reification -- racism, sexism, human trafficking, treating people as commodities (98-9) -- belong to a different general type, in which our "attention to the fact of a prior recognition is lost because we let ourselves be influenced by prejudices and conceptual schemes that are cognitively irreconcilable with that fact" (72).

The success of Honneth's project depends in large measure on the extent to which his account of the essence of reification -- forgotten recognition -- is able to illuminate the wide variety of phenomena that both Lukács and he regard as instances of that pathology. Here, too, the full richness of Honneth's discussion cannot be reproduced or examined in this review. Perhaps the most innovative part of the book's treatment of the different kinds of reified relations is its discussion of self-reification in chapter V. First, Honneth examines and criticizes a number of accounts of the kind of relation a subject establishes to itself when it seeks to know its own inner states: detectivism, constructivism, and expressivism. Then, having defended the latter, he formulates a conception of self-reification inspired by Freud and Winnicott: a reified relation to self is one that precludes a "playful-exploratory involvement with one's own drives" (81) or that prevents one from articulating one's wishes and feelings and thereby appropriating them as one's own (82). (This discussion points out, by the way, how close reification is to the other great pillar of humanist Marxism, alienation. One question Honneth leaves open is how, if at all, they differ.) As Honneth makes clear, it is not difficult to understand reification of this sort as a case of forgotten recognition: a subject that is capable of knowing, owning, and playfully exploring his own desires "must regard his own feelings and wishes as something worthy of being articulated; to this extent it makes sense to speak here, too, … of a prior recognition" (88-9).

This brief description of self-reification brings to light a surprising feature of the concept of recognition that Honneth's theory of reification relies on. If a reified attitude to oneself is explained as a failure of self-recognition, then recognition is no longer taken to be an essentially intersubjective phenomenon. Even more surprising, Honneth's account of reification in relation to the objective world invokes a notion of recognition that allows for non-subjects -- things -- to be the object of a recognitive stance. In regarding recognition as directed at "persons or things" (42), Honneth runs the risk of flattening the concept into the much broader idea of interested involvement (Anteilnahme) in general, thereby ridding it of what, at least since Rousseau, the tradition has considered its distinctive content. Expanding the concept to accommodate self-reification may have its point -- at least here it is still a subject that is recognized or not -- but I am reluctant to follow Honneth to the very bottom of this slippery slope, where the objective world, too, can be on the receiving end of recognition as long as a subject adopts an attitude of concernful involvement towards it.

Presumably the main reason Honneth broadens the concept of recognition in this way is that he wants to do justice to Lukács's original intuition (and to our experience), according to which the pathologies of modernity include reified relations not just to other subjects but to nature itself. (Another reason may be that Honneth is following Heidegger's lead too closely, for whom care, not recognition, is the original mode of being-in-the-world that is susceptible to being covered up or forgotten.) But making sense of a reified relation to the objective world, even on Honneth's own account of it, does not require including things among the possible objects of recognition. As he himself characterizes it, a reified relation to the world results when subjects "lose sight of the many meanings [the world] has for those other subjects they have previously recognized" (78). Following Adorno, Honneth conceives of the reification of nature as a cognitive attitude to objects that depends on suppressing, ignoring, or forgetting those features of things that appear meaningful from the perspective of others. (Interestingly enough, this "derivative" (78) type of reification is closest in form to the phenomenon Lukács himself was most concerned with: for him reification in its truest sense occurs when we regard what are in fact intersubjectively constituted things -- commodities -- as though they were only things, which is to say: as products of nature rather than of purposeful, meaning-laden human activity). There is indeed a failure of recognition underlying a cognitive attitude of this sort, but it is best understood as a failure to recognize other subjects. To "forget" the importance of others' perspectives is to fail to accord appropriate value not to the things those perspectives reveal but to the subjects whose perspectives they are. Honneth is right, then, to say that reification in relation to the objective world is always derivative of a failure to recognize other subjects, but he seems not to notice that this makes it unnecessary to widen the concept of recognition to include relations to things in order to make sense of the idea of a reified nature.

The scare quotes of the previous paragraph hint at the final question I want to raise: in what sense is it really the forgetting of a prior recognition that is at work in the various forms of reification that Honneth seeks to illuminate? In the example of the tennis player the forgetting is easy to see. But is it plausible to understand racism or human trafficking, for example, as the results of forgetting acts of recognition that have (in some sense) already taken place? Clearly, some kind of recognitive failure lies at the core of racism and human trafficking, but it is hard to see why it must be construed as a losing sight of some previously accomplished recognitive act. Honneth's argument here seems to rest on a version of Cavell's claim (defended in chapter III) that knowledge of others' perceptual states is possible only on the basis of a prior recognition, or "acknowledgment," of them as subjects whose utterances make a claim on their fellow beings to be responded to in an appropriate manner. The problem here is that many kinds of "reified" relations among subjects -- think of racism --seem not to involve even the minimal knowledge of or concern for others' inner states that, according to Honneth's argument, implies the existence of a prior recognitive relation that is susceptible to being forgotten. Perhaps the answer to this question is to be found in a more extensive account of the nature of the forgetting that reification depends on. Honneth himself hints that there is more to say about this concept when he suggests that 'denial' or 'defense' might in some cases be more appropriate terms (72). This is certainly one aspect of his book -- only one of many -- that is likely to strike other philosophers as a fruitful topic for further inquiry.

Despite the reservations I have expressed about some of Honneth's claims, his book is a welcome addition to the literature on a central and unjustly neglected doctrine of Critical Theory and the Marxist tradition. Perhaps its most important contribution will be to help resuscitate a brand of social theory for which justice is not the only normative standard by which to evaluate institutions. At the very least, Honneth has made a persuasive case for the importance of attending to a different sort of normative standard, one implicit in the idea of a "social pathology," of which reification represents an especially compelling example.