2006.04.06

Tommie Shelby

We Who Are Dark: The Philosophical Foundations of Black Solidarity

Tommie Shelby, We Who Are Dark: The Philosophical Foundations of Black Solidarity, Harvard University Press, 2005, 336pp, $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674019369.

Reviewed by Bill E. Lawson, University of Memphis


What does black solidarity mean in the post-civil rights era? This is the question that Tommie Shelby attempts to answer in his provocative and insightful text. Shelby starts by correctly placing the notion of black solidarity in its historical context. Black solidarity has been advocated because of the racism blacks faced as a group in the United States. Solidarity in this context should be understood to mean black Americans uniting to fight racist restrictions on their personal and collective existence. Black solidarity has been the foundation of what has been called Black Nationalism. Starting with Martin Delany, who many consider the father of Black Nationalism, Shelby explores the manner in which the quest for black solidarity has been pursued from Delany to the present. Shelby rightly notes that black solidarity has been and continues to be seen as the solution to the problem of dealing with racism and white supremacy. It is his contention that the position that underlies the black nationalistic notion of solidarity is that of a black collective identity. In this work, Shelby critiques Black Nationalism based on a black collective identity thesis as the basis for black solidarity. Shelby thinks that calls for a collective black identity are doomed to fail in the post-civil rights era. There is a diversity of political and social opinions in the black community. This diversity gives rise to many differing ways of being black. The appeal to collective identity masks these differences. While there are many blacks committed to ending racism and social injustice, they do not think that there is one black identity. Shelby thinks that a more reasonable approach comes out of what he calls pragmatic nationalism. Pragmatic nationalism respects the diversity of lifestyles and ways of being black in the American social experience. If one draws just on the impact of racism on the lives of all blacks this would be a rallying point for black solidarity. Shelby contends that black and non-blacks can support pragmatic nationalism because it presents none of the problems of solidarity based on "collective identity." In this manner, those persons committed to ending racism and working for social justice can join with other likeminded persons without feeling that they must adhere to some view of collective identity.

Important to Shelby's argument about the pitfall of building solidarity on some form of collective identity is his belief that solidarity built on a collective-identity thesis is viewed and can be viewed as illiberal. Indeed Shelby goes to lengths to show how persons who push collective-identity conceptions of black solidarity often disrespect the autonomy of blacks who may think along different ideological lines about being black. Thus the collective-identity view is often illiberal. What he wants to do is to present a version of nationalism that respects the liberal tradition. Blacks of all political persuasions could support collective programs to end racism. Thus, Shelby is careful not to claim that those black persons who want to see themselves as "raceless" or "raced" cannot do so. African Americans should be free to choose how they self-identify. They should also be permitted to choose how they view their relationship with other African Americans and the larger non-African American community. In this manner Shelby sidesteps the debate of persons such as Appiah and Outlaw about the value of retaining the concept of race. For Shelby whether one sees oneself as raced or not does not matter, if one is committed to racial equality and social justice. Underlying Shelby's position is the, possibly true, contention that most persons deemed African Americans in the United States do not want their own country either in the United States or outside of its land mass. Since the goal is living a productive and safe life within the United States, the ultimate goal should be making race play less of a role in the lives of African Americans.

At issue here is the debate over what exactly is the role of race in the lives of African American at this time in United States history. One could argue that Shelby thinks that at this time many of the racial barriers that prevented African American from enjoying freedom in the US have been removed. The current political and social climate calls for a rethinking of the old political strategies to fight racism. While a "collective-identity" conception of blackness may have been justified prior to the passage of civil rights legislation, the current social and political climate requires a reassessment of the "collective-identity" understanding of black solidarity as a means for racial unity. In the post-civil rights era, an appeal to a "collective-identity" conception of blackness does more to divide blacks than unite them. Shelby is correct in that there are multiple ways of identifying as black and that those persons who push a "collective-identity" conception of blackness often alienate blacks who are honestly committed to black liberation. These alienated blacks see the "collective-identity" understanding of blackness as being too confining.

Shelby thinks that without the appeal to collective identity it will be easier to form a workable coalition of the various social and political ideologies that exist in the larger black social space. I hesitate to use the term "black community" at this point because, given what Shelby seems to argue, the ideal of a black community may only make sense as a claim about a group of people who possibly share some of the same fears about being identified and treated as black. This understanding of the impact of race on the lives of persons deemed black may be all that is needed for solidarity. Shelby seems to think that ending racial animosity is something all blacks could or can support. Additionally, Shelby claims that removing the weight of "collective identity" allows sympathetic non-blacks to work closely with likeminded blacks to fight racism and social injustice. Whites who see the problem of racism and social injustice can join with blacks. Since race plays no other role than as a marker for being a possible victim of racial discrimination, then any concerned person can join with blacks to fight for social justice. There are non-blacks who want to work with "blacks" to fight racism. If this is true then, what is the "black" in black solidarity? Pragmatic nationalism, it seems, is colorblind?

In this regard, there appears to be an acceptance of the doctrine of colorblind liberalism in Shelby's work. This is the position that in a liberal democratic state, such as the United States, race should not be a factor in the life chances of any person. This view cuts both ways: whites should not be advantaged by race and blacks should not be disadvantaged because of race. The goal of public policy should be to eliminate any bias based on race. Our public policies should be colorblind. In this manner the life chances of any person regardless of color would be ensured. Shelby would seemingly agree with what some take to be the moral vision of colorblind liberalism. The vision is not that race disappears as a social category, but that its presence makes no difference in a person's life chances. Shelby's commitment to colorblind liberalism can be seen in his vision of what the end of the political struggle seems to be. The goal according to Shelby is to help reform the legal and political system so that racism and racial discrimination do not impact negatively on the life chances of African Americans. All blacks regardless of their political views appreciate the value of ending racist social practices. It has to be admitted that there are some non-blacks committed to ending racist practices. The problem then is forming both workable interracial and intra-racial coalitions. According to Shelby, pragmatic nationalism would help solve this problem.

Whether African Americans find Shelby's argument for pragmatic nationalism persuasive will turn on how many of them view the current social and political conditions of the masses of black Americans. It is important to remember that the "black nationalism" tradition did not arise in a historical vacuum. Delany and other "black nationalists" came to this position after reflecting on how blacks were being treated in the United States. It is Shelby's reading of the contemporary state of black America and the role that race now plays that is the fulcrum of his book. An understanding of how blacks are now being treated still guides the thinking of those persons wanting to address the social ills still afflicting blacks in America.

In this regard, an interesting litmus test for Shelby is "The Covenant with Black America." It is a proposal for blacks of all social and political persuasions to work to resolve some of the pressing issues in "black" America. Can an appeal to pragmatic nationalism draw blacks of all political persuasions to this cause? I am not sure. Why? For all of its appeal to diversity, the Covenant still has some strong attachments to the collective-identity view of blacks in the United States. As Shelby notes, the black nationalistic traditions still hold adherents in the "black" community. The political goals have been expressed as blacks controlling their own landmass, controlling their communities within the United States, or controlling the basic institutions that impact on the life of the black community. Since blacks are not leaving the United States, they should at least have control over the institutions in the United States that impact their lives. These institutions would be schools, police protection, and other social institutions. If the goal is to have some black control over the basic institutions that impact their lives, then pragmatic nationalism with its emphasis on interracial membership will not work for many blacks. There is still a feeling among many blacks that blacks have to work out these racial problems by themselves with modest support from non-blacks. Blacks have to solve the problems of the black community "in house." It might be argued that Shelby wants to open "our house" to those who have been the oppressor. It will be argued that blacks cannot with reason do this. Nonetheless, the value of Professor Shelby's book is that it forces us to rethink many of our cherished beliefs about black solidarity and collective identity. What he makes clear is that the problem of racism and white supremacy are not solely the problems of blacks.

In sum, this is a provocative and insightful book. Professor Shelby has done a great service to both philosophical and historical academic studies. He has in clear and lucid terms presented the basic assumptions underlying Black Nationalism, the collective-identity thesis, and interracial and intra-racial coalitions in the fight for social justice. What makes this book worth reading beyond the scholarship and its scholarly insights is Professor Shelby's attempt to move Black Nationalism into the post-civil rights era.