Frederick Beiser


Frederick Beiser, Hegel, Routledge, 2005, 353pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415312086.

Reviewed by Martin Donougho, University of South Carolina

Frederick Beiser's Hegel ushers in a new series, 'Routledge Philosophers.' The list of contributing authors is a distinguished one, yet nobody will dispute Beiser's claim to belong there. From his first book -- The Fate of Reason -- on the context of Kantian critique, Beiser established a reputation which was only strengthened by a string of publications on Idealist and Romantic "constellations" of thought. The new book follows the series format: brief historical background, key arguments, philosophical legacy, as well as suggestions for further reading and a bibliography (all in an attractive typeface, I'll add). Beiser says that he wants to provide not so much exegesis as a comprehensive overview aimed primarily at the first-time reader. The result is in my judgment little short of a triumph. In 350 pages Beiser manages to suggest much of the sweep and challenge of Hegel's thought, in direct and straightforward prose, yet without shirking the procedural difficulties of Hegel's arguments and positions. Engaged and independent in his assessments, he adopts a manner that is the opposite of a bland encyclopedia entry. Along with the new edition of Stephen Houlgate's Introduction to Hegel, this text easily becomes a first recommendation.

Beiser's approach is thematic rather than work by work or biographical. He begins with the philosophical context and Hegel's early ideals, then in part two examines Hegel's 'absolute idealism,' his organicist metaphysics and conception of 'spirit,' and "the religious dimension" in his thought (an admiring nod here to Emil Fackenheim). Part three takes up epistemological issues: the 'dialectic' in particular, along with a more exegetical chapter on intersubjectivity in the Phenomenology (Lordship and Bondage). Part four turns to social and political philosophy, and part five concludes with the philosophy of history and Hegel's aesthetics, plus a short epilogue on "the rise and fall of Hegelianism" (ending in 1850, this admittedly is to give Hegel's legacy short shrift). Although comprehensive and thorough in his treatment, Beiser does omit a few things, notably the Logic and philosophy of nature. Omission may well be the one and only art, as Robert Louis Stevenson declared, but here it tends to distort. I share Beiser's expressed regret about the Logic especially, and even if there is some compensation in the few cogent pages on Hegel's dialectic in chapter 5, a separate treatment would I think have only strengthened the metaphysical interpretation that Beiser offers.

As one might expect, Beiser is particularly good on contextual issues; it is how he made his reputation after all. He starts out with the "Grunds├Ątzkritik" of the 1790s, something that I imagine will be unfamiliar to all but a few specialists. Recent work by, for example, Dieter Henrich or Manfred Frank has brought out the importance of this almost forgotten episode, and its prominence in the opening chapter is welcome. Equally welcome in my view is Beiser's emphasis on the formative role played by Jena Romanticism; Hegel's hypercritical attitude towards Schlegel and company indicates how significant they were for him. Overall the contextual or 'hermeneutic' approach constitutes in fact the book's greatest virtue. At the same time it leads Beiser to slight the so-called "analytic" interpretation which has been instrumental in the recent Anglophone revival of Hegel's philosophy, since Findlay and others. True, attending to Wittgensteinian themes can easily seem anachronistic, or conversely sound already somewhat dated, or (Beiser's major objection) will fail to sort out Hegel's own contributions from those of his peers. Yet to rule out of court such recent linguistic interpretations as, e.g., Brandom's (he receives merely bibliographic mention) will to some look a bit purist. It is of a piece with the other chief strategy Beiser champions, that is, a resolutely metaphysical take on Hegel. He rebuts the 'non-metaphysical' Hegel who has figured so large in his North American reception, not least under the influence of Klaus Hartmann's students.1 Nailing his own colors to the mast, Beiser declares that Hegel was a metaphysician through and through, albeit in a post-Kantian universe, and that we sell his views and arguments short if we don't factor that into our interpretations. Contrasting strategies -- Hartmann's 'categorial' line, Pippin's 'neo-Kantianism,' Pinkard's 'social epistemology,' not to mention humanist, existentialist, or other preferences -- are dismissed in a footnote or two, if they get even that. In their stead we get a powerful reading of the various parts of Hegel's system in a metaphysical light. Dialectic for example is rendered as comprising both a dualist ontology and its self-dissolution into a speculative monism -- which I think does justice to Hegel's Janus-faced Logic, even though I should have liked more on Hegelian 'negation,' or how the triad universal/particular/singular functions within the system as a whole. And other chapters are just as penetrating; on 'spirit,' say, or on Hegel's philosophy of religion, where Beiser manages to give a clear and balanced account of Hegel's critique of salvational myth (consistent with his 'immanent' conception of God) and his qualified endorsement of Lutheranism in the Berlin context. Or again, the sections on Hegel's social and political thought and his theory of the state benefit from a quasi-Aristotelian interpretation stressing a teleology less in nature itself as in the human will embedded in historical context. Beiser concludes: "Ultimately, Hegel's normative doctrine was original, profound and coherent. In a remarkable fashion it fused the rationalist, voluntarist and historicist traditions, preserving their truths and canceling their errors" (212). That gives a fair impression of the author's briskly reconciling attitude. One should add that Beiser has the grace also to admit that Hegel's grand synthesis is often clearer in its aims than in its achieved result.

I have reservations about a few things, for example, the treatments of intersubjectivity (chapter 8) and aesthetics (chapter 12). Beiser tells us that he had shelved early ambitions to write a commentary on Hegel's Phenomenology when he learned of H.S. Harris's "similar project, which finally bore such marvelous fruit in Hegel's Ladder" (xii), published in 1997. It is unfortunate that his own treatment of "Lordship and Bondage" largely ignores Harris,2 along with much other scholarship. In fairness that is because, hewing to a strong 'metaphysical' line, he grounds his own argument on what he sees as the proper context of Phenomenology Chapter IV: the circular ontology-cum-epistemology -- the 'I = I' -- of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre and the threat of "nihilism" that hovers over it. While broadly justified, this is to overlook Fichte's role in supplying the very term "recognition" (Anerkennung) that figures as key to the narrative (the "dialectic of experience") Hegel proceeds to tell. Beiser notes that many commentators assume that sociality exists from the start rather than seeing it as precisely what is to be won. Writing of ┬ž175 and its claim that "[s]elf-consciousness achieves its satisfaction only in another self-consciousness," Beiser correctly takes this to be from "our" (he calls it the "philosopher's") viewpoint, not for the agent itself, which will have to earn the right to such a claim in the dialectical adventures starting with the battle for recognition and continuing through Chapter V ("Reason"). In my view the dialectic of IVa is most plausibly taken as that of a single consciousness finding that in order to make good its claim to self-awareness and self-satisfaction in the world at large it must be conceptually prepared to recognize otherness, an other equal to itself; there need actually be another person involved. The battle rages within that consciousness, and it is for self-domination or self-enslavement. Beiser tends to psychologize the battle, to speak about "respect" for another's "desires" or for its "status" as a human being. And he is quite wrong to speak of the "liberation" of the slave, who quite fails to recognize himself in the products of his labor (otherwise the ensuing dialectic would be much shorter!). Beiser concludes that "it is a moral rather than a metaphysical refutation of nihilism" (191) -- which among other things ignores the moments of labor (I express myself in my own work), of service, and of fear and trembling.

As for Hegel's philosophy of art, while Beiser justly remarks on its relative neglect in the literature, he fails to take note of much recent work, especially Annemarie Gethmann-Siefert's studies of the various lecture series (the scholarly problems are almost intractable, more so than with say the philosophy of religion). The famous definition of beauty as "the sensuous Scheinen of the Idea" is found in no extant lecture notes, although one can make the case for the centrality of Hegel's argument that essence must "shine" and appear. Again, while Beiser is right to mention Hegel's debt to Romanticism, the reference to his "uncompromising classicism" is a canard: Hegel was much more interested in the "symbolical" world-view prior to the classical Ideal and in the "romantic" world-view devolving from it, and even with the Ideal he dwells on its internal contradictions. And although Beiser notes Hegel's love of opera and art galleries, he fails to ask -- with Gethmann-Siefert -- what that might suggest about Hegel's attitude to contemporary art as a social if no longer religious practice (concert hall, museum, world-literature, etc.).

It would be unfair to end on a note of complaint, however, when so much of the book is outstanding. Beiser may or may not be justified in concluding (313) that the owl of Minerva has flown from her roost over Hegel's grave, but something of the spirit of Hegel lives on in this book.

1 See Beiser's review of the Hartmann-inspired Hegel Reconsidered (1994), Bulletin of the Hegel Society of Great Britain 32 (1995) 1-13, where he enjoins us rather "to reconstruct Hegel's philosophy from a detailed study of his historical context and intellectual development."

2 In 'Further Reading" Beiser writes: "It would not have surprised Harris to know that his readings can be easily challenged" (334) -- yet no challenges are evident in his own argument.