2006.04.19

James McGilvray (ed.)

The Cambridge Companion to Chomsky

James McGilvray (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Chomsky, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 344pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 052178431X.

Reviewed by John Collins, University of East Anglia


As with the preceding 'Companions, the present collection of original papers is an up to date introduction to its eponymous subject. The contributors are drawn from the fields of linguistics, philosophy, psychology, and politics; the scope of the collection is as broad, covering in detail Chomsky's thoughts on syntax, language development, phonology, the philosophies of mind and language, international relations, media, the role of intellectuals, etc.

Notwithstanding the real virtues of all of the contributions, the collection is somewhat quirky. Firstly, there is a good deal of overlap. The four papers dealing with Chomsky's non-philosophical/scientific work could well have been slimmed down to two without significant loss of content. Similarly, the issue of 'nativism vs. empiricism' dominates three of the papers. Secondly, such repetition is disappointing given that key elements of Chomsky's thought are relatively neglected. For example, throughout the collection there is no proper discussion of Chomsky's contribution to computability theory or his general philosophical understanding of computation. Also missing is a proper discussion of what we may call Chomsky's historically grounded 'philosophy of science' -- it crops up here and there; ditto for the disputed notions of 'modularity/organology', 'knowledge of language', 'biolinguistics', etc. Thirdly, two of the papers aren't directly concerned with Chomsky's work at all, but instead offer overviews, fascinating in themselves, of recent research in fields that have been shaped by Chomsky's original contributions.

These editorial qualms don't detract from the value of any of the individual papers, nor, perforce, the interest of the collection as a whole. There is much here for both the novice and the expert -- certainly more than enough to challenge many of the preconceptions that retard the proper appreciation of Chomsky's work.

The collection begins with McGilvray's introduction that places Chomsky in the lineage of Galileo, Descartes, and Turing as a philosopher-scientist. The essay also argues for the unity of Chomsky's thought coordinated by a conception of humanity's creative self-expression being a function of biological complexity that, in part, can be rigorously investigated, but which, in another respect that perhaps grounds our individual dignity and autonomy, escapes our capacity for scientific inquiry. As is to be expected from McGilvray, the presentation lucidly encapsulates the beauty and profundity of Chomsky's vision.

The first part of the volume concerns 'Chomsky on the human language'. Neil Smith ('Chomsky's science of language') sketches some of the main themes of Chomsky's methodological approach to universal grammar and language acquisition. An attractive feature of Smith's presentation is his use of very simple examples to highlight the complexity of the reasoning in generative linguistics. Take, for instance, the phenomenon of contraction in English.

a. Who do you wanna visit? [want+to]

b. I'm so hungry [I+am]

c. The meeting's tomorrow [meeting+is]

From such a sample, it might be concluded that contraction is everywhere permissible. Such an inference would be erroneous.

a. *Who do you wanna visit Bill?

b. *Mary is going to the party, and I'm too.

c. *Bill was wondering where the meeting's.

As Smith explains, there appear to be constraints on contraction that essentially involve the role of empty categories (elements of a structure that have no phonetic properties -- silent words, as it were). Empty categories are otherwise required for the explanation of syntactic and semantic phenomena across a range of constructions across a range of languages. As in other sciences, therefore, we find that the positing of elements that are not part of our surface description of phenomena serves to unify otherwise disparate phenomena. Also consider the position of the child acquiring a language. It would seem that the child must target a general constraint that involves elements that are not visible in the data. A reasonable hypothesis, and the one Chomsky has long held, is that the child comes equipped with the constraints in place, ready to be triggered; otherwise, the child would simply not be able to acquire the constraints rapidly and without error from the variable data to which it is exposed. As Smith points out, this is not a peculiarity of language; no biological development is wholly governed by the contingencies of the environments in which organisms find themselves. After all, we acquire language, but our pets don't. For Chomsky, a science of language is an inquiry into this human biological endowment.

David Lightfoot ('Plato's problem, UG, and the language organ'), extending Smith's discussion, presents the Principles and Parameters (PP) model of UG as an answer to Plato's problem of poverty of stimulus -- How come we know so much given so little evidence? More explicitly, the problem is how to square the generality of linguistic capacity -- the fact that children can acquire any language with equal alacrity -- with the specificity of each acquired language -- the fact that languages appear to vary so much. The answer, at least in principle, if not detail, is that each specific language is the summed effect of a choice of values of a finite number of variables or parameters. Hence, the specificity of each language may be deduced from the general parameters. Lightfoot's exposition of this reasoning is suitable for the beginner, but it perhaps would have benefited from serious discussion of some of the complexities of the model (e.g., 'Are the choices hierarchically ordered?') and important new developments (e.g., Charles Yang, 2002, Natural Language and Language Learning. Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Howard Lasnik ('Grammars, levels, and biology') tackles the much misunderstood notion of 'level of representation'; in particular, he shows how recent level-free developments in the so-called 'minimalist program' hark back to Chomsky's earliest model of grammar contained in his Logical Structure of Linguistic Theory. As with Lasnik's other introductory writings, the presentation is so limpid as to make those of us who struggle with this stuff almost weep. The paper should also be compulsory reading for those philosophers who see Chomsky as embroiled in the problem of intentionality.

Chomsky, following Aristotle, often characterises language as a pairing of sound with meaning. He is also quick to point out, however, that this is inadequate, for it excludes the deaf, whose language uses a different modality. Laura-Ann Petitto ('How the brain begets language') presents some new research on the linguistic development of deaf children that shows how the language faculty adapts to available modalities in the absence of an acoustic channel. Part of this adaptation includes 'hand babbling' that is not witnessed in non-deaf children. This truly stunning research deserves to be widely known. My editorial misgivings aside, anyone interested in Chomsky will be enthralled by this work.

B. Elan Dresher ('Chomsky and Halle's revolution in phonology') presents a lucid account of the main themes of Chomsky and Halle's The Sound Pattern of English. The piece is expertly done, but will probably be somewhat inaccessible to those not already versed in such matters. Forsaking accessibility entirely, a discussion of optimality theory in the context of Chomsky and Halle's legacy would have been of interest.

As with Petitto's paper, Lila Gleitman and Cynthia Fischer ('Universal aspects of word learning') do not directly deal with Chomsky's work, but the piece should be of interest to readers of the collection. It has long been appreciated that much syntactic information, on pain of redundant duplication, is carried by individual lexical items rather than syntactic 'rules' that apply to the items. Gleitman and Fischer show that it just doesn't follow that syntax can be wholly bootstrapped from lexical acquisition; indeed, evidence from the map between theta-role and structural position indicates that lexical items are acquired by the employment of general structural constraints. The paper offers genuine support for Chomsky's long-standing views on this issue.

The collection's second part ('Chomsky on the human mind') begins with Norbert Hornstein ('Rationalism and empiricism as research strategies') situating Chomsky's views in the context of the philosophical debates of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. The paper is very fecund in its suggestions, especially as regards Chomsky's notions of 'truth' and 'reference' in relation to the 'idealism' problem for a rationalist position. Especially welcome is Hornstein's appeal to Kant, which deserves to be elaborated at greater length. To my mind, Chomsky's position is, ultimately, more Kantian than rationalist in the traditional sense (see, e.g., Chomsky, 1975, Reflections on Language, London: Fotana, chp.1).

Paul Pietroski and Stephen Crain ('Innate ideas') again take up the issue of nativism and poverty of stimulus. The ideas here are familiar. Still, the paper contains a very clear discussion of Plato's famous argument of the Meno that has of late been egregiously misunderstood; it also offers semantic considerations as opposed merely to the usual syntactic ones. This is done via a discussion of entailing environments of the arguments of quantifiers. The generalisations in this area appear to throw considerable light upon the syntactic phenomenon of the distribution of negative polarity items. The paper serves as an excellent introduction to nativist arguments.

Akeel Bilgrami and Carol Rovane ('Mind, language, and the limits of inquiry') critically engage with Chomsky's numerous discussions of the limits of inquiry and the potential for mysteries -- phenomena that fall outside of our cognitive capacity for theoretical intelligibility. On Chomsky's view, post-Newton, naturalistic inquiry has forsaken the thought that the world in general should be intelligible. That dream has given way to the narrow construction of theories focussed on very restricted phenomena that, of course, we hope to be integrated at some level. These are fascinating issues that have a deep resonance with Kant's late thought on purposiveness and the histories of Koyr, Lovejoy, and Popkin. Alas, Bilgrami and Rovane's discussion is rambling and opaque in its conclusions. That said, the paper does well to separate McGinn's work on consciousness from Chomsky's far more philosophically sophisticated conception of mystery.

It is still all too common to find those who think that Chomsky's interests are restricted to syntax at the expense of semantics. Even a cursory glance at some of Chomsky's central theoretical works will give the lie to that shibboleth. Failing such effort, one could do no better than to read the present contribution from James McGilvray ('Meaning and creativity'). McGilvray connects Chomsky's discussion of linguistic creativity with his recent remarks on lexical semantics that are pitched against the standard Fregean conceptions of truth and reference. On the view presented, meaning is a cognitive act that constructs a perspective upon an object, event, situation, etc., where it is the complex internal resources, shared across the species, that determine the character of the perspectives independent of would-be external objects as metaphysical referents for words divorced from our cognitive acts. This view jars with prevailing philosophical orthodoxy; nonetheless, it is being articulated in detail in the work of Borer, Pietroski, Pustejovsky, etc.

The volume's third and final part ('Chomsky on values and politics') starts with a general introduction to Chomsky's political/moral views by Milan Rai ('Market values and libertarian socialist values'). Rai presents Chomsky's politics as animated by libertarian values that flow from the late enlightenment and early romantic period. These are contrasted with current competitive values and the empiricist doctrine that humanity is essentially malleable and so might be rightfully submitted to 'benign' authority. The discussion is true to what Chomsky has said on these matters and would certainly be of value to one interested in the philosophical antecedents to Chomsky's politics. However, as can also be said of the remaining papers, the interested reader would be better off reading Chomsky in the raw on these matters: as Chomsky has admonished many times, these issues are accessible to anyone with an open mind.

James Wilson ('The individual, the state, and the corporation') proceeds with many of the Rai's themes, focussing on the concept of the corporation and how it has acquired a status above that of both individual and state. Again, the paper is a perfectly accurate rendition of Chomsky's views, but no light needs to be cast on that which is transparent in Chomsky's own words.

Irene Gendzier ('Noam Chomsky: the struggle continues') runs through Chomsky's voluminous writings on Vietnam through to the present situation in Iraq. Jean Bricmont ('The responsibility of the intellectual') does something similar with particular reference to Chomsky's many discussions of the role of 'Western' ideology and its intellectual servants. Both papers certainly succeed in demonstrating the breadth and power of Chomsky's critique of our current political arrangements, both social and international. But there is no substitute for Chomsky on these matters, and at times the papers descend into hagiography. Still, if they serve to dislodge the scales from even some eyes, then there can be no real complaint against their inclusion.

Relative to its profundity, Chomsky's work is nigh-on ignored within contemporary philosophy. Despite its minor quirks, we may hope that this volume's many virtues will contribute to redressing this sorry state of affairs.