Duncan Pritchard

Epistemic Luck

Duncan Pritchard, Epistemic Luck, Oxford University Press, 2005, 304pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 019928038X.

Reviewed by Adam Leite, Indiana University

Pritchard's wide-ranging book discusses a number of central topics in contemporary epistemology: the internalism/externalism distinction, epistemic closure, safety vs. sensitivity accounts of knowledge, contextualist semantics for 'knows', external world skepticism, virtue epistemology, and the notion of epistemic luck. The core of his discussion is a useful defense of an externalist account of knowledge based on a "safety" requirement. Pritchard argues that this account is superior to contextualism, sensitivity accounts, and virtue-theoretic analyses, and that it deals satisfyingly with the issues about epistemic luck raised by the Gettier problem. What is most distinctive about Pritchard's discussion, however, is the larger framework within which he places this account of knowledge. Pritchard maintains that external-world skepticism is correct, so far as internalist notions of knowledge and justification are concerned. He thinks that there is a form of epistemic luck to which our beliefs consequently remain vulnerable, and for this reason he acknowledges that the externalist, safety-based account of knowledge will never be fully satisfying. However, he places this contention within a neo-Wittgensteinian account of "hinge propositions" according to which we have a great deal of (externalist) knowledge which we cannot properly claim, including knowledge of such matters as that we have two hands and that we are not brains in vats. These beliefs function as background presuppositions of our ordinary practices of claiming knowledge and justifying our beliefs, and given these presuppositions -- which we cannot epistemically justify -- we can have something which approximates what an internalist wants. Moreover, engaging in a practice with this structure is pragmatically rational, or so Pritchard contends. This combination of a safety-based account of knowledge with a neo-Wittgensteinian account of our practices is intriguing and novel, and Pritchard is to be commended for managing to bring Wittgenstein's work in epistemology into contact with the contemporary discussion.

The book has many virtues. Chief among these is its discussion of skepticism and the major externalist alternatives. The first four chapters in particular provide an especially useful overview of some of the major debates of the last 30 years. In contrast with those who see skepticism as arising from closure principles about knowledge or justification, Pritchard convincingly argues that skepticism arises from an underdetermination problem concerning our evidence for our beliefs about the world.

Unfortunately, the book also suffers from several significant argumentative gaps. Perhaps most importantly, Pritchard provides little detailed defense of the claim that skepticism is correct with regard to "internalist" notions of knowledge and justification. Much of the work is consigned to cursory footnotes, at least one of which (the discussion of James Pryor's work (p. 63, fn. 11)) suffers from a serious misunderstanding.[1] In the most general terms, we could say that Pritchard uncritically buys into a traditional foundationalist way of setting up the skeptical problem but doesn't seriously consider contemporary foundationalist responses to it. In addition, his overall argument is structured around "internalist" demands that are never adequately motivated or defended. In what follows, I will focus on the latter aspect of the book. I will begin, however, with a few comments about Pritchard's defense of a safety requirement as a necessary condition for knowledge. The two topics are linked by a methodological difficulty that recurs throughout the book: in both cases Pritchard's discussion hovers uncomfortably between unexplained technical terminology and ordinary language.

Pritchard's version of the safety requirement is formulated in the terminology of possible worlds:

Safety III: For all agents, ø, if an agent knows a contingent proposition ø, then, in nearly all (if not all) nearby possible worlds in which she forms her belief about ø in the same way as she forms her belief in the actual world, that agent only believes that ø when ø is true (p. 163).

Unfortunately, Pritchard does not provide an ordinary-language formulation of the requirement he means to be capturing, nor does he provide a developed theory that fixes what the relevant possible worlds are for any given case. As a result, his talk of "nearby possible worlds" isn't given any clear content; it isn't at all obvious how one is to determine whether or not the requirement is met in particular cases. This makes it difficult to evaluate his claim that the safety requirement satisfactorily handles a great many of the examples familiar from the literature on the Gettier problem.

Another place where this issue becomes pressing is the relation between safety and epistemic closure. Pritchard urges that the safety requirement enables us to maintain a closure principle to the effect (roughly) that if one knows p and knows that p implies q, then one also knows that q (see esp. pp. 167-8). This claim is plausible enough when one considers the case of skeptical hypotheses. However, it is not at all clear that the safety requirement enables us to maintain closure in the sorts of lottery cases brought to center stage in John Hawthorne's recent work.[2] On the face of it, it is plausible (given my financial situation and that of my near relatives) that I know that I won't have the resources to afford a lavish vacation next year. That I won't have the resources for a lavish vacation entails that I won't win a major lottery, and I recognize this entailment. But it seems that I don't know that I won't win a major lottery. The problem for Pritchard is that "Safety III" can be interpreted in such a way that both of these judgments about what I know come out as correct, so it isn't clear how he is to avoid saying that closure fails in this case. On the face of it, Safety III allows that the set of worlds relevant to an evaluation of whether S knows ø may differ from the set of worlds relevant to whether S knows c, even if ø entails c. Consequently, one may satisfy the requirement for ø but not for c, in which case closure will fail. Given Pritchard's commitment to the claim that I don't know that I won't win the lottery (163), it appears that he will have to argue that my belief, that I won't have the resources for a lavish vacation, doesn't meet the safety requirement and so can't constitute knowledge. This is somewhat undesirable in itself. But it also means that Pritchard will have to provide an interpretation of the phrase "nearby possible worlds" on which the world in which I win a lottery counts as modally nearby for the purposes of evaluating my belief that I won't have significant excess financial resources next year -- even though that possibility is quite far-fetched (to use his colloquial formulation of the notion of "nearness" (70)). This isn't an insoluble problem, but until it is faced we won't be able to determine whether there is a plausible safety requirement that is able to maintain closure.

Pritchard's criticism of contextualist approaches is likewise far from decisive. He argues that the linguistic data are best explained on non-semantic, purely pragmatic grounds in a way that is consistent with a safety-based, non-contextualist semantics for "know" and its cognates. He focuses on the (supposed) fact that it is improper to assert, "I know that I am not a brain in a vat," arguing that the impropriety of this assertion is best explained in terms of false conversational implicatures generated by Gricean mechanisms. In particular, he holds that asserting this sentence will generate an implicature "that one has adequate grounds that can support this assertion" (80); but, he thinks, one can never have such grounds, hence the assertion will always be improper even if (as the safety account has it) it is true.

Unfortunately, this argument does not fully account for the contextualist's data. Contextualists such as DeRose and Cohen do not simply claim that shifts in the conversational context will lead speakers not to assert sentences that are properly asserted in other conversational contexts; rather, they offer ordinary-language examples in which a difference in conversational context makes it appropriate to deny a 'know'-attributing sentence that would appropriately be asserted in a different conversational context (the bank cases and airport cases, respectively). The Gricean machinery offered by Pritchard does nothing to explain these examples at all.

Pritchard misinterprets the dialectic at this crucial juncture. He invents (with no real defense) a new quasi-Gricean conversational principle which he calls the "Commitment Principle": "the (unqualified) assertion of a proposition will generate the conversational implicature that one is committed to that proposition and this means that one will, ceteris paribus, retain that commitment regardless of mere changes in the conversational context" (p. 81).[3] He uses this principle to argue that contextualism is in trouble because "agents should … withdraw rather than reverse their assertions of ascription sentences that involve the term 'knows' in response to mere changes in the conversational context" (p. 82). It's true that that is what agents should do, if Pritchard's new conversational principle is correct and applies fully generally. The trouble is that DeRose and Cohen take themselves to have provided examples in which people quite appropriately deny a 'know'-attributing sentence because of a difference in the conversational context (while retaining the same evidence, the same degree of certainty, etc.). So Pritchard is merely claiming on the basis of his theory that we shouldn't talk in the way that contextualists claim -- on the basis of examples -- that we do talk. Without an explanation of how the contextualists have misdescribed their examples, Pritchard's argument here carries no weight whatsoever.

In fact, Pritchard's account of proper assertion runs into deep difficulties. As we have seen, he claims that there are things we know but cannot properly claim to know.[4] His argument for this view arises from his reading of the Gricean Maxim of Quality, according to which an assertion that p requires one to possess adequate evidence for the truth of p. Pritchard treats this principle as demanding that one can properly claim to know something only if one meets what he calls an "internalist" justification condition: that is, only if one has a good reason for p[5] which is "reflectively accessible," in that it is accessible through introspection and a priori reasoning alone (plus memory of what has been yielded by these faculties) (42).

…agents who do not meet internal epistemic conditions will typically be unable to properly claim to possess knowledge, even if one grants that what the agent would be asserting in making such a claim would be true. The reason for this is that a claim to know … carries the conversational implicature that one is able to offer relevant reflectively accessible grounds in support of that claim, and this is just what agents who don't meet internal epistemic conditions … cannot do (185, cf. 90).

Pritchard maintains that this requirement holds even if knowledge itself is correctly understood along externalist, safety-based lines. This is why he claims that one cannot properly claim to know or even assert that one is not a brain in a vat: the evidence available to one through introspection and a priori reasoning alone is neutral between the possibility that one is a brain in a vat and the possibility that one is not.[6] He offers a similar argument regarding the assertion of so-called "hinge propositions," such as the claim that one has hands.

The difficulty here is to see why Pritchard hasn't purchased more than he bargained for. He claims that we can never have good internal grounds for any of our beliefs about the world; that's just what he takes the skeptical underdetermination argument to show (113). It is hard, then, to see how he escapes the conclusion that it is never proper to assert that one knows anything (or at least, that it is never proper once one has recognized the truth of the underdetermination argument). Indeed, matters may be worse than that. For it appears that he is also committed to the claim that proper assertion requires good internalist grounds.[7] If he does accept this claim, then it is hard to see why he isn't forced to say that it is never proper to assert anything about the world at all.

Pritchard never directly addresses this issue. However, his text contains hints as to how he might do so. At times, he suggests that the sort of evidential grounding one must be able to provide will vary with the conversational context (85). It is natural to construe this suggestion in terms of the amount of reflectively accessible evidence one must have, but this won't do, since Pritchard appears to accept the skeptic's claim "that there is an important sense in which our beliefs are not evidentially based at all" (119). If proper assertion always requires at least some reflectively accessible evidence, then on Pritchard's view, we can never properly assert anything.

The requisite contextual shifts therefore must be of some other sort. It is plausible, given Pritchard's neo-Wittgensteinian framework, that he will take these shifts to involve which background "hinge propositions" are being presupposed. The idea here would be that in an ordinary conversational context, all the regular anti-skeptical assumptions are presupposed, and relative to these presuppositions one can provide something relevantly like "internalist evidence" for one's assertions and knowledge claims. Perhaps gesturing at some such idea, he writes:

the grounds one can adduce in favour of one's beliefs come to an end with wholesale assumptions which are not themselves grounded, so the 'knowledge' that one exhibits in everyday conversational contexts is only quasi-internalistic -- it bears all the hallmarks of internalist knowledge up to, but not including, the underlying (anti-skeptical) assumptions of that context (p. 219).

So-called "skeptical" contexts would then be contexts in which these background presuppositions stand revealed as mere assumptions, and in such contexts proper assertion and knowledge claims require good "internalist" grounds simpliciter.

The trouble with this suggestion is that it renders it hard to see why it would ordinarily be improper to assert that one has hands or that one is not a brain in a vat, or even to claim to know these things. For relative to the ordinary presuppositions, I am able to back up these claims with good grounds. For instance, I can support the claim that I have hands by noting that I can see them; and I can support the claim that I am not a brain in a vat by noting that -- given the progress of science so far -- there aren't any. And there is nothing about the mere content of the assertions in question that forces one to bracket the ordinary background presuppositions or to back them with skeptic-proof grounds.

These suggestions are in keeping with our actual assertive practice, for this practice does not work in the way that Pritchard claims. As Thomson Clarke has shown, there are ordinary contexts in which it is perfectly appropriate to assert anti-skeptical "hinge propositions," even to claim to know them, and in which it would be quite odd to do otherwise. Here is one example.

Suppose a physiologist lecturing on mental abnormalities observes: Each of us who is normal knows that he is now awake, not dreaming or hallucinating, that there is a real public world outside his mind which he is now perceiving, that in this world there are three-dimensional animate and inanimate bodies of many shapes and sizes … In contrast, individuals suffering from certain mental abnormalities each believe that what we know to be the real, public world is his imaginative creation.[8]

It would be outrageous to object to the propriety of this lecturer's assertions on the grounds that he lacks good "internalist" grounds for his beliefs.

Pritchard therefore moves far too quickly in claiming that, certain cases of real doubt aside (as when one stumbles bloodily from a car wreck and there is a question as to whether one still has one's hands), we cannot properly assert or claim to know that we have hands and all the rest. There is a long tradition of engagement with Wittgenstein's claims about what we can and cannot assert, including importantly the work of Clarke, Barry Stroud, Stanley Cavell, and Charles Travis. This tradition has brought out that what matters here is not simply the sentences asserted, but rather the use to which they are put, the way in which they are offered as a response to certain philosophical problems. In this regard, it might be objected that Pritchard is not Wittgensteinian enough. He takes there to be a single "Gricean" requirement which governs assertion in such a way as to prevent one from asserting certain sentences at all (85). The problem with Moore, however, wasn't merely that he claimed that he had hands or that he wasn't dreaming; he could do that in order to make a list of things that are obviously true, perhaps as part of a game with his children. The problem was that he attempted to put these assertions to certain philosophical uses, as answers to certain questions, where the very framing of the questions precluded him from doing so. A more plausible Wittgensteinian response would do justice to this complexity.

Perhaps not surprisingly, Pritchard's difficulties regarding assertion begin with his interpretation of Grice's Maxim of Quality itself. Grice said that conversation is governed by the rule, "Don't say that for which you lack adequate evidence." By "evidence", he just meant evidence -- the sort of thing that we offer and accept all the time. Pritchard, however, gives this requirement a specific (and undefended) interpretation in terms of "internalist" demands. Nothing in our actual linguistic practice motivates this interpretation. So far as I can see, it is a construal motivated by certain philosophical preconceptions and introduced to yield the theoretical results that Pritchard seeks. It buys nothing but trouble.

Here as elsewhere, the notion of an "internalist" justification (and the contrast between "internalist" and "externalist" requirements) provides one of the orienting themes of the book. Prichard's guiding thought is that there is something desirable about meeting "internalist" justificatory demands even if doing so isn't a necessary condition for knowledge, and that there is an important notion of epistemic luck which is connected with these demands and also with the notion of epistemic responsibility. He calls this notion of epistemic luck "reflective epistemic luck."

A true belief suffers from "reflective epistemic luck" just if it is a matter of luck relative to what one can know by means of reflection alone (introspection and a priori reasoning) that the belief is true (p. 175). The notion of "luck relative to what one can know by reflection alone" is explained in terms of possible worlds; the proposal is that one's true belief is "reflectively lucky" just if (leaving aside a few details) in a wide range of nearby worlds, as ordered by similarity to what one can know of the actual world by reflection alone, one's belief gets things wrong (175). The upshot, according to Pritchard, is that since we pretty much can't know anything about the world by reflection alone, nearly all possible worlds become equally close for the purposes of this sort of evaluation, and so our beliefs about the world quite generally turn out to suffer from "reflective luck."

Pritchard claims that "it is only by proposing an epistemological theory that can eliminate reflective epistemic luck that one can adequately capture a conception of cognitive responsibility that is central to knowledge possession" (181). And it is here that he locates the appeal of "internalist" demands: "we have already granted the internalist claim that the possession of an internalist justification for one's beliefs is epistemically desirable -- where this epistemic desirability is reflected in how one is able to take cognitive responsibility for one's belief in a fuller sense than would be possible if such justification were lacking" (p. 199). The idea, then, is that if one's belief is formed in a way that is vulnerable to reflective epistemic luck -- that is, if one's belief is formed in such a way that if it is true, then its truth counts as "lucky" in this sense -- then one's belief was not formed in a way that was fully cognitively responsible. And that is why internalist justificatory demands are appealing.

Pritchard tries to establish the link between the demands of cognitive responsibility and the absence of reflective epistemic luck by diagnosing the way in which one might be left "feeling very uneasy" by a fully externalist, safety-based theory of knowledge. To illustrate this sense of unease, he uses the example of the "chicken-sexer":

[A]n agent who has a highly reliable ability to determine the sex of chicks but who has false beliefs about how this ability works and, let us stipulate, even lacks evidence which would indicate that this 'ability' she has is reliable. The problem is that our chicken-sexer's beliefs, whilst clearly lacking in something epistemically important, will meet the safety principle … the point is often made that the chicken-sexer's beliefs are still in some substantive and troubling way lucky (p. 174).

On Pritchard's view, what is wrong here is precisely that the chicken-sexer has no "internalist" grounds for her beliefs about the sex of chicks; she can't justify these beliefs by appealing to what's available to her merely through introspection and a priori reasoning.

This diagnosis is overkill. The chicken-sexer doesn't just lack "internalist" grounds for the beliefs in question; she can't provide any reasons in defense of them at all. A perfectly adequate diagnosis of our "uneasiness" about the chicken-sexer is to attribute it to precisely this latter shortcoming. In fact, Pritchard himself unwittingly offers just this diagnosis, rightly commenting that "for all the chicken-sexer can tell, it is a matter of luck that her belief is true" (p. 175). The notion of "telling" here is just an ordinary one: the notion of "telling" that is in play when someone reaches a judgment on the basis of consciously considering the evidence. Pritchard, however, interprets this thought in terms of a distinctive, philosophical notion of telling as being able to tell on the basis of nothing but the resources available through introspection and a priori reasoning. We don't need to interpret it in that way in order to explain our "uneasiness." Even if one thought that it was perfectly unexceptionable for our beliefs to be vulnerable to "reflective luck," one might still feel uneasy about the chicken-sexer's beliefs.[9]

Once we see this, we can also see that there is a notion of "epistemic luck" that is distinct from Pritchard's "reflective luck" but still concerns how matters look from the agent's perspective. The chicken-sexer's belief is "lucky" in the sense that given the evidence that she can make use of in consciously reasoning or in attempting to justify her belief, there is no reason for her to think that her belief is true. From that perspective, the belief just looks like a guess. And for that reason, one might well be inclined to judge that there is a respect in which her belief is irresponsible. So far as I can see, then, the most Pritchard has shown is that we care not to have beliefs that are epistemically lucky in this latter sense. That is the sense of "epistemic luck" that directly connects with our ordinary notions of epistemic responsibility and also connects -- via Grice's Conversational Principles -- with our practices of assertion. But none of this shows that there is anything desirable about avoiding Pritchard's "reflective epistemic luck" at all.

In fact, Pritchard's guiding dichotomy between "internalism" and "externalism" is not itself well motivated. For one thing, there is considerable conceptual space between the demands of "internalism", as he characterizes it, and paradigm externalist views, such as the view that one has knowledge if one has a true belief that meets the safety requirement. The latter views do not impose any requirement regarding the agent's abilities to cite reasons for her beliefs. But one might well want to impose such a requirement without demanding, with Pritchard's "internalist," that the relevant reasons be available when one brackets all of one's beliefs about the world and relies only upon the resources of introspection and a priori reasoning. Moreover, Pritchard's initial discussion of internalism misses precisely such options. He attempts to provide an "intuitive" motivation for internalism, commenting "If one has no good reflectively accessible reason available for believing what one does, then, intuitively, one's belief is unjustified …" (p. 42). There are several ways of taking the phrase "reflectively accessible reason." On one natural reading, a "reflectively accessible reason" is just a reason that is available to you when you pause to reflect on the question, "What reason do I have to hold this belief?" It is a reason that you are in a position to cite. One might well think that someone who lacks such reasons is in a sub-optimal epistemic position. But one doesn't have to accept full-fledged "internalism," as Pritchard understands it, in order to think that. One might think, for instance, that other empirical considerations about the world could suffice.

The interpretation of the phrase "reflectively accessible reason" that Pritchard has in mind is one that is bound up with a certain traditional epistemological project. A "reflectively accessible reason", in Pritchard's hands, is a reason that is available when we bracket all of our beliefs about the world and rely only upon the resources of introspection and a priori reasoning. This is a reason, then, which would answer to the traditional attempt to justify our beliefs about the world without ineliminably presupposing any claims about the world. However, it is quite unclear what the relationship is between that project and the statuses such as knowledge, justified belief, and responsible belief that concern us in ordinary life. Why think that someone holds his beliefs in an epistemically irresponsible way merely because he can't succeed in that project? Another option here would be to accept that we can't succeed in this project -- that sensory experience is neutral between the truth of our ordinary beliefs and of alternative skeptical hypotheses, and that a priori reasoning can't add anything useful in this regard -- but to hold that our beliefs about the world can be responsibly held nonetheless.

Pritchard himself argues that even though all of our beliefs about the world are vulnerable to reflective luck (and so aren't held in a way that is fully responsible), it is nonetheless fine for us to proceed as we do, because a pragmatic vindication is available for the epistemically ungrounded assumptions that we are not BIV's, have two hands, and all the rest. The argument has two steps: (1) without accepting these assumptions, we cannot engage in the practices of evaluating (epistemic) reasons for or against beliefs about the world at all; but (2) since there are good pragmatic reasons for engaging in such practices, there are good pragmatic reasons for accepting these assumptions.

The first step of this argument is taken over without much discussion or defense from Pritchard's reading of Wittgenstein's On Certainty. The idea is that these propositions have a special status, in that one can neither offer grounds in their support nor reasons for doubting them, since in both cases the only grounds one could offer would be more questionable than the propositions themselves. This claim is not obviously correct. A lot will turn on what is meant by the phrase "reason for doubt." If the mere fact that one's evidence does not favor a proposition over its competitors is a reason for doubt, then there is reason to doubt these propositions, on Pritchard's own account. Presumably he thinks that such considerations do not constitute a reason for doubt, but he never says anything either way, nor does he explain what he thinks a reason for doubt is; he simply doesn't seem to see the issue. It also isn't clear why if one of these special propositions isn't actually in doubt, one couldn't support it by appealing to other propositions in the same class, a possibility that, again, doesn't come up for discussion. These issues aside, Pritchard moves without discussion from the idea that some propositions have this special status to the claim that these propositions must be accepted in order for one to be able to evaluate reasons for beliefs about the world at all. This is a considerable step and needs extensive defense. For instance, many philosophers from Descartes to Chisholm, BonJour, and Fumerton have thought that one could have a priori knowledge of evidential principles relating to empirical beliefs. If that were so, then one wouldn't need to accept these special "groundless" empirical propositions in order to evaluate reasons for beliefs about the world. Perhaps there are interesting Wittgensteinian moves to be made in response to such views. If so, it would be nice to see them brought into the open and discussed.

Pritchard's "pragmatic" move is to claim that "whilst we lack epistemic grounds for believing the antiskeptical assumption, such a belief is clearly practically rational, given the alternatives" (245). The antiskeptical assumption is practically rational, we are told, because it is only by accepting it (along with other 'hinge propositions') that we can engage in practices of evaluating reasons for and against beliefs about the world -- and there is a good practical reason for engaging in such practices. What is this reason? If we don't take a risk and engage in these practices, then we are guaranteed not to get true beliefs. By contrast, if we do take the risk, then so far as we can tell there is a chance that we will get things right. Given the choice between possible success and certain failure, one should opt for the possibility of success.

This argument is not intended to provide an epistemic justification for proceeding as we do; Pritchard draws a sharp distinction here between epistemic and practical justification. Understood in this way, the argument has some appeal. At the same time, however, it is not satisfying as a response to the problem that supposedly generated the need for it. We were supposed to imagine that we took seriously the problem of "reflective luck." We sought good reasons of a certain kind for our beliefs about the world, reasons that could be discovered and utilized given only the resources of introspection and reflection and without initially assuming anything about the world. We discovered that no such reasons are available; the skeptical underdetermination argument thwarted us from taking our perceptual evidence as indicating anything at all about how the world is. Pritchard claims that at this point, a distinctive problem about luck arises: if our beliefs about the world are correct, that appears -- from this vantage point -- to be mere luck. And that is supposed to be troubling, because it is supposed to show that we aren't proceeding responsibly, or perhaps can't claim responsibility for hitting on the truth. But if this is troubling, it won't do any good to be told, "Go ahead, take the risk. For all you know, it might pan out." We were troubled that we might only be hitting the truth by luck, and now we are told that our worry will be assuaged by the possibility that we might get lucky. If Pritchard is right that what fuels concern about skepticism is a concern about reflective luck, then his "pragmatic vindication" is powerless to remove the concern. It just rubs salt on the wound.

This problem is distinct from the "cold comfort" Pritchard attributes to his pragmatic argument in the section entitled "Epistemic Angst." The point of that section is to highlight that once we have seen the truth of skepticism, there is no going back: we cannot suddenly cease to recognize that our beliefs about the world are ultimately ungrounded. That would be true even if the pragmatic vindication completely succeeded. The present point, however, is that on Pritchard's own terms, the pragmatic vindication doesn't succeed, because it doesn't answer to the problem it is meant to solve.

It seems to me that a better approach -- and one more in the spirit of Pritchard's evocation of Wittgenstein -- would be to attempt to undercut the traditional epistemological project that aims to justify our beliefs about the world without ineliminably depending upon any beliefs about the world. If we can't succeed in that project, perhaps that shows not that there is something lacking in our epistemic position vis a vis the world, but rather that there is something wrong with the question.[10]

[1] On Pritchard's reading, Pryor's claim in "The Skeptic and The Dogmatist" (Nous, vol. 34, 2000, pp. 517 -- 49) is that certain perceptually-based beliefs about the world, such as "Here is a hand," are accorded a "default" epistemic status. Pritchard takes this claim to be in tension with the internalist aspect of Pryor's view. However, Pryor does not claim that these beliefs have a "default" status. Instead, he claims that one is prima facie justified in believing that p if one has a perceptual experience which presents it as being the case that p; such beliefs are therefore immediately (though defeasibly) justified in virtue of one's perceptual experience. That view is perfectly consistent with the internalistic aspects of Pryor's position. (It should be noted that Pryor is not a full-blooded internalist by Pritchard's lights, since he holds that one can be justified even if the facts in virtue of which one is justified are not all accessible through introspection and a priori reasoning. Perhaps Pritchard is mistaken about this aspect of Pryor's view as well.)

[2] Hawthorne, John. 2004. Knowledge and Lotteries, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[3] For the purposes of this argument, Pritchard must mean "sentence" by "proposition"; otherwise, the principle is simply beside the point.

[4] This view appears to be motivated primarily by Prichard's desire to explain away the contextualist's data (as discussed above), but it also dovetails nicely with his neo-Wittgensteinian story about ungrounded "hinge propositions" on which our epistemic practices rest.

[5] Or for the belief that one knows that p. Pritchard is never entirely clear about this issue.

[6] This claim is central to Pritchard's argument that there is an important truth in the skeptical underdetermination argument.

[7] There are two reasons for this. The first arises from Prichard's interpretation of the Gricean Maxim of Quality in "internalist" terms. The second arises from his contention that in general, the assertion that p conveys that one knows that p, and so also generates the implicatures of an explicit knowledge claim. (This is implicit in sections 3.2 through 3.4).

[8] Clarke, Thompson. "The Legacy of Skepticism," The Journal of Philosophy, vol. 69, 1972, p. 756, italics in original.

[9] We can see this mistake operating in Pritchard's interpretation of a comment from Zagzebski which Pritchard cites regarding the chicken-sexer example. Zagzebski writes:

The value of the truth obtained by a reliable process in the absence of any conscious awareness of a connection between the behavior of the agent and the truth he thereby acquires is no better than the value of the lucky guess (Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind, Cambridge, England: Cambridge University Press, p. 304, quoted on p. 174).

Pritchard takes this criticism to be simply equivalent to the charge that the agent cannot tell, from the limited materials available through introspection and a priori reasoning, that her beliefs are true. But whatever Zagzebski may have intended, Pritchard's interpretation is an over-reading. Taken literally, Zagzebski's complaint here is merely that the chicken-sexer lacks "conscious awareness" of the reliability of the process by which she forms the relevant beliefs -- that is to say, she lacks a (conscious) belief with a positive epistemic status regarding the adequacy of her belief-forming method. One could make this complaint even if one thought it was just fine to form beliefs in a way that is vulnerable to "reflective luck."

[10] For a recent attempt to develop part of an adequate response along such lines, see my "Epistemological Externalism and the Project of Traditional Epistemology," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, vol. 70, 2005, pp. 505 – 533.