Andreas Blank

Leibniz: Metaphilosophy and Metaphysics 1666-1686,

Andreas Blank, Leibniz: Metaphilosophy and Metaphysics 1666-1686, Philosophia Verlag GmbH, 2005, 207pp, € 78 (hbk), ISBN 3884050893.

Reviewed by Richard T.W. Arthur, McMaster University

This book consists of eight connected essays on Leibniz's early metaphilosophy and metaphysics, all centered on the theme that Leibniz's metaphysics should be seen as "descriptive" rather than "revisionary". This alludes to Strawson's distinction in his influential book, Individuals: while descriptive metaphysics is "content to describe the actual structure of our thought about the world, revisionary metaphysics is concerned to produce a better structure" (1959, p. 9). Blank argues that Leibniz's early metaphysics should not be interpreted as one "that replaces our ordinary world view with a different, purely hypothetical conception of reality" (p. 16). Rather, Leibniz uses a variety of descriptive strategies in "the analysis of everyday concepts, the use of comparative methods, the application of criteria of intelligibility, the application of criteria of reality, the analysis of the structure of thought, the analysis of the structure of action, and the investigation of the role of figures, models and schemata for the constitution of calculi" (p. 16). Blank proceeds to showcase how such a descriptivist perspective can throw new light on such various matters as Leibniz's Characteristica Universalis (chapter 1), Leibniz's theory of justice (chapter 2), on materialistic versus immaterialistic interpretations of the ontology of his Hypothesis Physica Nova (chapter 3), confused perceptions and the theory of corporeal substance (chapter 4), the dispute over substance monism in the metaphysics of 1675-76 (chapter 5), the relation of Leibniz's theory of mind to Spinoza's (chapter 6), the controversy over how literally to take Leibniz's theory of "striving possibles" (chapter 7), and how Leibniz's conception of rules as instruments of action bears on his notion of a calculus (chapter 8). In an appendix, this perspective is also applied to the emergence of Leibniz's logical conception of substance.

Blank begins by arguing for the influence on Leibniz's thinking of the artificial-language projects of Dalgarno and Wilkins (chapter 1). Wilkins interprets the task of philosophy as being "not the construction of metaphysical theories, but rather a description of the role these concepts play as an implicit part of everyday language" (p. 24). Comparable sentiments can be found in Dalgarno, and in similar fashion Leibniz writes in the preface of his edition of Nizolius in 1670 that "Whenever there are popular terms available that are equally comprehensive, technical terms should not be used" (p. 27). Blank attributes Leibniz's persisting interest in the work of Wilkins and Dalgarno to the fact that he shares their view "that categorial concepts belong to the conceptual framework of our ordinary way of thinking about the world" (p. 36). Metaphysical concepts, Blank claims, are conceived by him as "constituents of everyday concepts that only have to be made explicit". The large number of Leibniz's manuscripts containing derivations from definitions of metaphysical concepts (with differing standard concepts taken as basic) attests to the importance to him of this approach. In chapter 2, Blank thoroughly investigates Leibniz's early methodology in the context of his theory of justice, arguing for a distinctive Leibnizian combination of Platonic sapienta with Pauline caritas, with a neo-Hobbesian approach to the analysis of those concepts: neo-Hobbesian in that whilst Leibniz follows Hobbes's approach to the deduction of ethical and jurisprudential terms from definitions, he parts decisively with him over the construal of definition.

An example of how Blank fills out the detail of this perspective and puts it to work is provided by his analysis of the Hypothesis Physica Nova in chapter 3. Again, he concedes that there is a hypothetical-deductive structure to the HPN, but denies that the hypotheses are in any way arbitrary: they are items of implicit knowledge, winnowed out from a thorough philosophical analysis of everyday concepts. This approach enables Blank to give a nuanced reading of Leibniz's ontology, which he counterposes to Christia Mercer's Neoplatonist construal (2001). She reads Leibniz in 1670-71 as re-interpreting the Stoics' pneuma as an immaterial vital power emanating from God, and as advocating a reduction of bodies to immaterial minds. Blank concedes that the Neoplatonic emanation scheme Leibniz sets out in On Transubstantiation, when taken together with his well known claim in the Theoria Motus Abstracti that "every body is a momentary mind", may well give that impression. But Blank finds convincing evidence in texts (and especially in the correspondence with Oldenburg and de Carcavy) that Leibniz's ether is material, a spirit in Digby's sense of subtle matter. Leibniz's strategy should not be understood as an attempt to spiritualize matter, but rather "to analyze concepts traditionally denoting properties of immaterial substances in mechanistic terms, and thus assign a common, rational content to a variety of ancient theories about the constitution of matter." (p. 63) Likewise the resistance of minds to dissipation by the surrounding matter, and the distinction of minds from bodies on the grounds that two opposed conatus cannot remain in a body beyond an instant without constituting an indestructible mind, might suggest a materialization of minds. But Blank argues that there is another side to Leibniz's treatment of mind, where he derives properties of it not only as consequences of geometrical axioms but also as the outcome of an analysis of mental experiences that are descriptively accessible and known through introspection. Again, immaterial entities are introduced because they are conditions for the individuation of material objects (p. 70), while an analysis of our everyday conception of body reveals that extension and impenetrability are essential to it, and that the existence of immaterial principles of motion is a necessary condition for the intelligibility of the motion and cohesion of bodies. Leibniz's appeal to such criteria of intelligibility and reality, Blank maintains, explains both "why he introduces composite substances constituted by an organic body and an active, mind-like entity", and also "why his early philosophy should not be characterized merely as a form of conciliatory eclecticism" (p. 17). Leibniz's principles -- for example, those which he takes as "predemonstrable" in the Theory of Abstract Motion -- are not conventional stipulations, but rather "the outcome of a method of analysis that transforms implicit knowledge about the nature of matter and mind into explicit knowledge" (p. 81): the descriptive approach complements the hypothetico­­­-deductive, Blank argues, in contrast to the reading of Leibniz's early method by Hannequin, Robinet, Beeley and Busche, as pure hypothetico­­­-deductivism.

In chapter 4 Blank extends this kind of analysis to the issues of confused conception, corporeal substances, and the union of soul and body. He places Leibniz's early views on the connection between soul and body in the context of the thought of Scaliger, Sennert and Boyle, arguing (as I have also independently argued in Arthur 2006) that Leibniz's views about the soul being co-extensive with the body in only an analogical sense are conformable with those of Scaliger and Sennert, and that Boyle's re-interpretation of the alchemical idea of a "flower of substance" along materialist lines is corrected by Leibniz only to the extent that he insists that the soul must be implanted in this flower of substance. This interdependence of soul and organic body is crucial in the theory of confused perceptions, where "bodily traces play a constitutive role for the soul's activity" (p. 18), thus accounting not only for the multiplicity and imperfection of the material world, but also the necessity of an organic body to substances: if they did not possess an organic body, "immaterial substances would not display confused perception" (p. 100).

In the remaining chapters, Blank defends the compatibility of Leibniz's early substance pluralism (where substances are active, but not causally independent of God) with his substance monism (where God is the only causally independent being), argues that Leibniz's analytically derived ideas about mental activity and reflection help illuminate his reaction to Spinoza in 1676-1678, finesses the tension between literal and metaphorical interpretations of Leibniz's doctrine of "striving possibles", and provides an interesting take on rules as instruments of action.

Blank is careful to restrict his claims to the period of his title, 1666-1686. But his analysis naturally raises the question of how much of this earlier orientation carries over into Leibniz's mature thought. There is no indication that Leibniz later radically changed his attitude toward philosophical method: the derivations from definitions continue into his mature philosophy, as does the conciliatory approach to rival philosophical positions, and the tendency to rework his views from different axiomatic starting points. This suggests that perhaps some of the radical shifts in his mature views attributed to Leibniz on the basis of such different starting axioms should rather be reinterpreted as continued conciliatory attempts to derive a metaphysical foundation for views characteristic of opposed positions, in accord with posited criteria of reality and intelligibility. A case in point might be the famous passage in his letter to De Volder in June of 1704, where Leibniz claims that "there is nothing in the world except simple substances and, in them, perception and appetite" and that matter and motion are not substances but "the phenomena of percipient beings" -- claims which shocked De Volder, and have led commentators such as Garber (1985) and Wilson (1989) to see Leibniz as turning in 1704 to an idealistic metaphysics, where body is reduced to a mere agreement among perceptions of purely immaterial entities. Given Blank's reading of Leibniz, however, perhaps the whole passage is better seen as an attempt by Leibniz to spell out his long-held criterion of the reality of phenomena as agreement of perceptions of different substances, and as a denial of the substantiality of material bodies rather than a denial of their reality. In support of this, Leibniz never relinquishes his earlier view that no created substance is without a body, nor is there any sign that he later sees the organs of sense as any less necessary to a created monad's having perceptions, nor do the confused perceptions appear to lose their role of mediating between the body and the soul or substantial form. Thus even though Blank does not argue here for any interpretation of Leibniz's mature metaphysics, the implication of his analysis of Leibniz's early metaphysics certainly throws doubt on the usual idealist interpretation of his later views, in keeping with the detailed arguments to that effect of Pauline Phemister in her recent book (2005).

In sum, I believe Andreas Blank mounts a powerful case for a rethinking of the usual view of Leibniz as an eclectic philosopher who tried to derive the phenomenal world along idealistic lines by hypothesizing its construction out of immaterial entities. Blank has shown that there is a significant aspect of Leibniz's method that relies on analysis of received views to arrive at principles that will serve as foundations for these views; and that, since these views often stem from otherwise opposed philosophical traditions, their re-interpretation in terms of these principles serves an important conciliatory purpose. I am not sure, however, that this is best described under the Strawsonian rubric that Blank adopts. To analyze Cartesian or Aristotelian conceptions of body, for example, is hardly to engage in a "descriptive" project, nor is it to analyze "everyday" concepts of "our ordinary world view", whatever that might be. Moreover, the principles Leibniz reaches through such analysis are certainly intended by him to enable the construction of a better picture of the world, rather than leaving it as it was. It would be hard to deny that Leibniz's monadology is not "revisionary" in an important sense, and to the extent that we can see this later metaphysics prefigured in the early metaphysical writings, where he insists on the need for immaterial active principles to underpin the mechanical philosophy, this appears to apply to his earlier metaphysics too. His method might be better characterized à la Bachelard as a "recasting" of received metaphysical views into a coherent new system, rather than either a descriptive metaphysics "content to describe the actual structure of our thought about the world", or a conciliatory eclecticism.

Finally a comment on translation: one useful feature of the book is the appearance of a number of passages in English translation which are not available elsewhere. Generally speaking, these translations are good, but they would have benefited from the attention of an English-language editor: some sentences -- e.g., "A Substance is whose individual cannot be said about another" (p. 35), "To think is being the reason of change, or to change itself" (p. 72) -- are simply not correct English. For translations from unpublished manuscripts that Leibniz wrote for himself in note form, Blank has chosen to preserve the fragmentary style, although sometimes, one feels, at the expense of intelligibility. Too often the absence of a main verb hinders comprehension, as does a lack of appreciation of the English subjunctive. A case in point is the passage Blank gives (pp. 94-95) from How the Soul Acts on the Body (January 1677-January 1678):

Such as God on the world: that is not by means of miracles, but by means of mechanical laws. Hence, if -- what is impossible -- all minds would be taken away, and the laws of nature would remain, the same things would happen as if there were minds …

which might be better translated as:

[The soul acts on the body] as God does on the world: that is, not by means of miracles, but by means of mechanical laws. Hence, if -- even though this is impossible -- all minds were taken away, and the laws of nature remained, the same things would happen as if there were minds …

These reservations, however, are slight indeed, and directed more to the editors than the author. Blank has produced an original and persuasive book, which I earnestly recommend to all those interested in Leibniz's philosophy.


Arthur, R. T. W. (2006). "Animal Generation and Substance in Sennert and Leibniz", chapter 7 in The Problem of Animal Generation in Modern Philosophy, ed. Justin E. H. Smith. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.

Garber, Daniel (1985). "Leibniz and the Foundations of Physics: the Middle Years", pp. 27-130 in K. Okruhlik and J. R. Brown, The Natural Philosophy of Leibniz. Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Wilson, Catherine (1989). Leibniz's Metaphysics: a historical and comparative study. Manchester: Manchester University Press.

Mercer, Christia (2001). Leibniz's Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Phemister, Pauline (2005). Leibniz and the Natural World. Dordrecht: Springer.

Strawson, Peter (1959). Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. London: Methuen.