2006.05.09

R.G. Collingwood

An Essay on Philosophical Method; The Philosophy of Enchantment, Studies in Folktale, Cultural Criticism, and Anthropology

R.G. Collingwood, An Essay on Philosophical Method, New Edition, with an Introduction and additional material edited by James Connelly and Giuseppina D'Oro, Oxford University Press, 2005, 496pp, $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199280878.

R.G. Collingwood, The Philosophy of Enchantment, Studies in Folktale, Cultural Criticism, and Anthropology, edited by David Boucher, Wendy James and Philip Smallwood, Oxford University Press, 2005, 400pp, $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199262535.

Reviewed by Peter Johnson, University of Southampton


An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933) is often considered to be Collingwood's best book both in terms of content and style. This is certainly what Collingwood himself thought. Collingwood thought that the Essay was the only book he completed to his own satisfaction rather than perpetually writing against the clock or the pressure of events. That it was the long illness that Collingwood suffered in 1932 which gave him the uninterrupted opportunity to write it may be taken as a happy coincidence since there is little sign of unwanted urgency or hurry in Collingwood's prose.

T.M. Knox, (Collingwood's pupil, longstanding friend, and editor of The Idea of Nature (1945) and The Idea of History (1946)), of course, shared Collingwood's view. Knox expressed his high opinion of Collingwood's Essay on many occasions and often to the detraction of other works, but, perhaps, nowhere more poignantly than in the copy of the first edition of the Essay which Collingwood inscribed to him. There Collingwood wrote, "To T. Malcolm Knox with thanks for help and criticism from R.G. Collingwood." (Collingwood had earlier presented Knox with an inscribed copy of Speculum Mentis (1924) in which he wrote "TMK in gratitude for services rendered in preparation of this book. The Writer"). Knox carefully annotated his copy of the Essay by marking the few misprints it contained and identifying a number of quotations (from Hegel) which Collingwood had omitted to acknowledge in the text. However, it is a comment that Knox makes in the margin of the book which excites most interest. Alongside the passage on p. 211(in the first edition of 1933 and in the new edition) in which Collingwood expresses his opposition to what he terms "bombast" in philosophy Knox has penciled "if only RGC had kept true to this." It was an opinion that Knox never conceded. It is also one that has provoked a great deal of disagreement. Knox's critics argue that the value of Collingwood's philosophical work does not necessarily depend on his seamless prose. The Essay may well reveal Collingwood writing at the top of his form, so the anti-Knox argument might run, but it is in the works urgently written to put his ideas on paper that Collingwood's creativity in philosophy is best displayed (perhaps because it is in these works that the strains in his thought are most apparent).

Whatever the balance of argument is here, the publication of this new edition of Collingwood's Essay is indisputably good news. The editors, James Connelly and Guiseppina D'Oro, have done a meticulous job in their selection of a number of Collingwood's previously unpublished manuscripts for inclusion alongside the Essay itself. Thus, Collingwood's essays "The Metaphysics of F H Bradley" (1933) and "Method and Metaphysics" (1935) are published for the first time, as is his fascinating correspondence (1935) with Gilbert Ryle, at least in a scholarly and easily accessible format. The editors show us the great variety of ways in which the new material in the volume exhibits important affinities with the Essay and with Collingwood's later work, most obviously An Essay on Metaphysics, but also The Principles of Art and The New Leviathan. A detailed introduction sets Collingwood's Essay in its historical context and outlines its main themes. The place of the newly published material in the development of Collingwood's thought is fully investigated. There is a useful and up to date bibliography. This new edition of An Essay on Philosophical Method continues the practice of republishing Collingwood's philosophical books in tandem with the manuscripts that most strongly overlap with them, either because they share a common subject matter or derive from the same historical period in his thought. Thus, with the exception of Collingwood's aesthetics, not so far treated in this exact way, the works on which Collingwood's reputation largely rests -- those on history, metaphysics and politics -- are now supplemented by his book on philosophical method. Philosophers who find Collingwood's thinking essential for the development of their own cannot but owe all the editors of these volumes a very real debt.

For historians of twentieth-century philosophy wanting to understand the origins of analytical philosophy more fully this new edition should prove invaluable. Not only is Collingwood's engagement with his past -- with Plato, Kant, and Hegel -- clearly on display, but also covered are his conversations with his contemporaries -- with Croce and, of course, with Ryle. The publication of the correspondence with Ryle is especially worthwhile since it enables historians of philosophy to see how Collingwood tried to keep his position separate both from empiricism and the new analytical school as it was developing in his time.

However, the republication of Collingwood's Essay is not just of historical interest. It is topical in the sense that many, even though not all, of its themes resonate with our own preoccupations. This highly Collingwoodian thought may be explored a little further. Collingwood's Essay is not only the embodiment of style in philosophy, it is also a work about style in philosophy. How philosophers express what they want to say is as important as what they want to say. And how what they want to say is expressed is itself a subject for philosophical investigation. The methods of philosophy, Collingwood insists, are not those of science. Does this mean that the language of philosophy must be closer to literature? And does this mean, in turn, that in Collingwood's understanding, method in philosophy is less an analytical tool and more a form of investigation whose knowledge producing capacities stem uniquely from its mode of expression?

We might say, therefore, that one of the most notable features of the Essay is the fact that Collingwood pursues these challenging questions in it. Thus, Collingwood's discussion in Section X of the book, entitled Philosophy as a Branch of Literature, predates Brand Blanshard's On Philosophical Style (1954) by over twenty years. In his examination of such topics as the nature of prose and poetry, the differences between philosophical and scientific prose, the affinities between philosophy and poetry and the reader's relation to the writer, Collingwood provides one of the best discussions I know of what it means to be a philosophical writer and a reader of philosophical writing. Indeed, Collingwood might be said to anticipate the interest of literary theory in these questions, but, more significantly, he gives us a clear account of what he takes philosophical writing to be -- neither technical nor didactic, but a confessional, possibly therapeutic mode in which readers are inextricably engaged both as critics and friends.

When we turn to R G Collingwood, The Philosophy of Enchantment, what faces us is not a book like the Essay which was reprinted a number of times during Collingwood's lifetime and after and is familiar to philosophers. What we are looking at first and foremost is a work by Collingwood that is published here for the first time. The appearance in print in a scholarly and scrupulously edited form of Collingwood's folktale manuscript is very much to be welcomed as something of an event in Collingwood studies. The editors have done a superb job in presenting the folktale manuscript in a highly accessible form and in linking it with a number of other previously unpublished manuscripts and papers on broadly connected themes. Three substantial introductory essays by the editors offer guidance both to new readers of Collingwood and to experienced ones by setting the texts in context and by providing authoritative notes on the sometimes now obscure figures that populate them. Contemporary philosophers are not always expert in the development of British anthropology in the inter-war period, so the information that is given on this subject is relevant and useful. This is most obviously the case with the folktale manuscript itself. Here the detailed references to the fairy tales that Collingwood investigates are an essential aid to the reader in getting to grips with what Collingwood is saying. The book also contains a valuable bibliography of relevant material. Collingwood's writing in the mid-1930s is pivotal in the story of his thought. So the publication of material from this period is bound to encourage more informed study of his life and work, especially in relating what he says about magic in the work on folktales to his detailed discussion of magic and art in his major work on aesthetics, The Principles of Art.

Not all of the pieces that are included in The Philosophy of Enchantment are as substantial and fully worked out as the folktale manuscript (here entitled Tales of Enchantment and making up Part II of the book). Some are philosophically interesting, but tantalisingly short, for example, Collingwood's brief Observations on Language (pp. 18-20), which contains ideas on language which are developed at greater length in his published work. Others are less interesting philosophically, but biographically important, for example, 'Art and the Machine' (pp. 291-305) in which Collingwood lets off steam about gramophones and other modern devices. Others, again, are lectures telling us a great deal about Collingwood's literary life, his knowledge and love of Jane Austen (shared with Gilbert Ryle). There may well be some slight artificiality in putting disparate material together in a single volume since it encourages the temptation to see Collingwood's work as more systematic and unified than it possibly could be. Even so, two of the welcome results of this exercise are that it enables us to appreciate better just how wide-ranging Collingwood's intellectual life is and how his readers will go seriously amiss if they see his work as divided into compartments that are wholly separate from each other.

To take one example of the inter-connectedness of Collingwood's thought which is highly relevant to philosophy. What strikes this reviewer from comments by Collingwood scattered throughout this volume is just how much his thinking about the nature of language is closely linked to his discussion of the primitive. These topics are, of course, those which Wittgenstein made his own, especially the topic of the primitive in his Remarks on Frazer's "The Golden Bough". It is worth making the point that Collingwood and Wittgenstein have a great deal in common on these subjects. Both are strongly anti-rationalistic in their accounts of the origin of language. Wittgenstein says in On Certainty that "language does not emerge from reasoning." Collingwood agrees. It is a mistake to think of language as an invention of the intellect. In a manner that is similar to Wittgenstein, Collingwood rejects an over sharp distinction between the primitive and the civilised. The significance of this rejection does not stem solely from Collingwood's understanding of method in philosophy. Nor is it solely a reflection of anthropological fieldwork, although both are factors in Collingwood's thinking. Rather, the significance of the rejection comes from Collingwood's resulting recognition of the role of primitive responses in the ways a human language is learned.

Yet another inter-connection can be traced from this. Collingwood's examination of language in close conjunction with the primitive contains powerful implications for his understanding of civility. Thus, what he says in the folktale manuscript (for example, this volume, pp. 209-10) about magic and the part it plays in our understanding of social customs looks forward to the detailed investigation of civility and civilisation in The New Leviathan. But this connection is not simply significant for the tracing of the internal development of Collingwood's thought. It surely is significant for this, but there is more. For what Collingwood is saying is that we cannot understand civility in human practices at all if we leave the magical ingredient out. Hence, Collingwood's criticism of utilitarian and causal accounts of a custom such as hand-washing before meals, in the passage referred to.

Collingwood and Wittgenstein worked out their philosophical ideas independently of each other. They were not partners in a common enterprise. Even so, the affinities in their thinking are noteworthy. What the publication of the folktale manuscript should encourage is further investigation of how they came to work on such closely related lines. After all, it is hard to read Wittgenstein without quickly discovering his liking for the tales of the Brothers Grimm or the enthusiastic way he shows us the importance of ritual in human life.

In their useful Foreword to The Philosophy of Enchantment (p. xiv), the editors give T. M. Knox a rather severe telling off for his unwillingness to see Collingwood's folktale manuscript in print. There is, of course, some justification for the stance they take. Knox had his own favourites among Collingwood's works. His editing of The Idea of History is particularly unsatisfactory since for many years it led Collingwood scholars up a tortuous garden path. Knox, however, was acting according to his own lights, and in this regard Collingwood's publicly expressed dislike (An Autobiography, 1939, p. 43) of leaving decisions regarding the publication of his work in the hands of others cannot have made his position as an editor appointed by Oxford University Press any easier. In any event, Collingwood's folktale manuscript is now in the public domain where we must assume he originally wished it to be. Taken together, the two works by Collingwood under review represent a major advance in Collingwood studies. Both will be assets to those libraries which are willing to invest in them. There is a rumour that a new edition of Collingwood's An Autobiography is in the pipeline, a work to be supported, as these volumes are, by additional and related material. If this is true then lack of employment is the one thing that Collingwood scholars will not have to fear!