Nicholas Jolley


Nicholas Jolley, Leibniz, Routledge, 2005, 260pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415283388.

Reviewed by Samuel Levey, Dartmouth College

Nicholas Jolley's Leibniz is an excellent volume in the new Routledge Philosophers series. High marks are in order for its clarity, accessibility and acumen, as well as for the pace and style of its prose. One could be forgiven for doubting whether a truly introductory text could be produced on Leibniz's philosophy that covers the terrain of his thought without sacrificing the vibrancy and sharpness so distinctive of his arguments. Jolley's book puts that doubt to rest. For a novice to Leibniz it is a finely crafted introduction, and for more sophisticated readers there will be much to reflect upon as well.

Jolley offers a synoptic view of Leibniz's philosophy and its context while also taking closer looks at the joints of his reasoning in many of the classic topics: substance, body, activity, monads, ideas, God, freedom, necessity, evil, and so on, each covered in chapters of twenty to thirty pages apiece--short enough for brisk reading, but long enough for precise discussion. Less iconic elements of Leibniz's thought also get a hearing, notably his writings on ethics and politics, which provides a nice corrective to the common classroom portrait of Leibniz as narrowly concerned with metaphysics and logic. Like many studies of this sort, the work is book-ended by brief accounts of Leibniz's life and works, and of his legacy in subsequent philosophy. Jolley's treatments are lively and instructive, and he makes an intelligent selection from the multitude of the polymath's activities to relate to the philosophical career. The only real omissions of interest from the book are, perhaps, Leibniz's contributions in the philosophies of physics and mathematics (and the former is not entirely left out: cf. 84-6). But Leibniz is already in excess of 260 pages and not every topic can make the cut. Jolley draws widely from Leibniz's texts, making optimal use of the materials that will be most readily available in translation volumes; and, as one would expect, key passages are routinely set on the page to illustrate Leibniz's points--all without unduly belaboring the exegetical work. His analysis and reconstruction of the lines of reasoning are clean and efficient, telescoping the essential points without much loss. Technical concepts and terms of art are clarified in context, but unseasoned readers will not always appreciate the theory at work behind them (e.g. Jolley's remarks about counterparts and identity across worlds, 139). On any account, however, readers will come away with a fair view of both the philosophy and the philosopher.

Jolley's treatment will also be noted for its emphasis on Leibniz's embrace of the idea that each individual is a "mirror of God" that imitates divine wisdom and omnipotence as far as it can. This theme, Jolley claims, is 'a powerful tool for understanding the major areas of Leibniz's philosophy' (3). I confess to an initial skepticism about how powerful a tool it could really be outside a few obvious applications. I worried also about reducing Leibniz to a caricature of himself, a fate hard enough to avoid in introductory texts and one that Leibniz has suffered in a variety of forms through the years. But the results are persuasive, as many nice points and new connections come to light in the course of Jolley's essay. As he notes, the idea that individuals are mirrors of God is not itself exactly a philosophical doctrine. It is rather, for Leibniz, a suggestive image and one that influences his philosophy, if from a point somewhat outside the space of reasons. Early on, Jolley says his book will present Leibniz as a 'philosopher whose thought is dominated by a large theme deriving from the Neoplatonic tradition' (9). Here I think the advertising slightly exceeds the facts, both in the history and in the book. Although Jolley plays the mirrors-of-God card in several places, he does not quite present Leibniz as 'dominated' by that theme; and in fact I think he does not overplay his hand. No doubt 'mirrors of God' would be a far better slogan for the total arc of Leibniz's philosophy than, say, 'nothing but monads going confusedly to infinity' or 'the best of all possible worlds', but in any case Jolley's book is not really in the slogan business. He has produced a balanced, sensitive and sophisticated discussion of the elements of Leibniz's philosophical thought--and offered a single connecting thread, if you should wish for it.

Scholars of Leibniz will, reflexively, notice fine points about which they might quibble if the context for the work were different. That is what makes them scholars. My own quibbles tend to concern how exactly to understand certain arguments, or what exactly the place of an argument was within a given dialectic. For instance, I do not agree with Jolley's suggestion that the argument Leibniz makes to Arnauld about the unity of substance which invokes the "axiom" that nothing is truly one being unless it is truly one being is intended to connect his own account of substance with Aristotle's traditional definition by showing an equivalence between a genuine unity and a subject of predication (cf. 41). I think rather Leibniz is in those lines reducing to absurdity Arnauld's "Augustinian" proposal that there might be substances without there being any one thing that is itself a unity--to establish, that is, that "there is no multitude without true unities" (G II,97.ln.6). The connection between the Aristotelian definition of substance and Leibniz's unity requirement would seem instead to belong to a different strand of argument concluded in the lines immediately preceding (G II,96-97.ln.5). Or so I would argue.

But these are subtleties on which there is much room for reasonable disagreement. Also, to address such alternative readings more than very selectively would bog things down, and Jolley is right not to make too many sacrifices to potential opponents. The point of the book, of course, is not to defend interpretations but to introduce the philosophy, and this it does very responsibly. Even given the wider latitude available to pronounce upon the subject, Jolley's readings are persistently fair, nuanced and defensible, and indeed the presentation is often a marvel of sensibility, if not quite neutrality, on controversial topics. To take another example, a point of current scholarly controversy is the question of "corporeal substances" in Leibniz's metaphysics: Does Leibniz genuinely accept the existence of bodily substances--composite, corporeal beings that are true unities, one per se--in some or any of his mature writings? Jolley offers a tempered answer: Yes, for a period, though partly due to Leibniz's remaining unclear or undecided whether the strict criteria for substance can be satisfied by organisms or instead by entities on the order of spirits; and eventually a decisive move is made to an idealism in the form of the monadology (cf. 61f., 64f.). But the specific answer matters less than the prior questions in terms of which the issue is framed: What is it for something to be a substance, on Leibniz's view? What are the demands of unity? Jolley lays the stress where it belongs: on the principles at work in Leibniz's reasoning, about which one can achieve a fairly high degree of clarity, rather than on the particular outcomes, which often enough remain somewhat opaque. This is only to privilege the reasons over the conclusions, and that is precisely as it should be for an exposition of Leibniz's philosophy, introductory or otherwise.

So it is, in my view, a fine book, one that succeeds remarkably well as an accessible yet sophisticated study in philosophy and as an introduction to Leibniz's thought. It is hard to see how it could have been better carried out. Still, it is not too hard to wonder about its intended audience and purpose. Jolley's book belongs to the current wave of "companion" volumes in academic publishing--as does the Routledge Philosophers series itself--and as such its educational role is somewhat unclear. Leibniz is of course excellent as starter material for someone constructing a course including a substantial treatment of Leibniz. I expect to crib from it myself. (For academic publishers, I suppose, the population of course crafters is not automatically just an ancillary market.) Would I assign it as a textbook for a class on Leibniz? Probably not. As an instructor I would want my students to bear down more forcefully on individual texts and the exact details of the arguments than Jolley can afford to do in any single case. Conceivably the book might be offered as a companion text for a survey class that included Leibniz's philosophy but could not take the time to explore it in detail--say, the classic Descartes-to-Kant course. But now to imagine adding comparable texts, if and when they exist, for each philosopher in the lineup yields a fantasy course that only the most Adderall-fueled undergraduate would finish. Precisely because of its sophistication, Leibniz is much more than a 'primer'.

Perhaps its ideal place in a curriculum would be as a companion text for a general course on "Enlightenment Rationalism" in which one wanted to add more philosophical sizzle than lecture time allowed. For this seems to be approximately the target audience: readers who know enough of philosophy to be able to follow the nimble turns and lines of thought in Jolley's discussion, who have a reason to be reading Leibniz, but whose own work in reading would not be to pore over the primary texts in the role of apprentice historians of philosophy. Who are the students of "Enlightenment Rationalism"? Not exactly history-of-philosophy students. Perhaps philosophy or history minors, or possibly-matriculated, might-have-been-philosophy-majors now looking for an intellectual challenge. Perhaps readers of the New York Review of Books, or the Times Literary Supplement ready to take the plunge into early modern rationalist philosophy. Yet one might equally ask: Who with an interest in the canon of Western philosophy is not a student of Enlightenment Rationalism? So perhaps Jolley's Leibniz is not properly a course book after all. It is, rather, a serious, freestanding study of the philosopher for the non-specialist and a stimulating, enjoyable read for the specialist--in a word, recommended reading. And highly recommended at that.