A. P. Martinich


A. P. Martinich, Hobbes, Routledge, 2005, 261 pages, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415283280.

Reviewed by Doug Jesseph, North Carolina State University

This book does a fine job of introducing students to Hobbes's philosophy, which is the intended purpose of the Routledge Philosophers series. The seven chapters open with a brief but reasonably thorough account of Hobbes's life and work. From there, Martinich devotes a chapter to Hobbes's metaphysics and philosophy of mind, one to his moral philosophy, and another to Hobbesian political philosophy. Chapter five is given over to Hobbes's account of language, logic, and science, while the sixth takes up the thorny issue of Hobbes and religion. The final chapter is a summary and overview of the main trends in Hobbes scholarship, outlining most of the topics and interpretations that can be found in the voluminous secondary literature on Hobbes.

Because the book is intended to introduce students and non-specialists to the philosophy of Hobbes, Martinich's emphasis is on the exposition of central parts of the Hobbesian system rather than on a comprehensive interpretation of Hobbes's philosophy and its relationship to its broader intellectual context. This means that where controversial elements are discussed (such as Hobbes's account of the origin of obligation, or his views on religion), Martinich is constrained to mention the range of differing interpretations and indicate his preferred alternative, but without engaging in the sort of detailed argument that would be of use to specialists. Given the aim of the book, this is hardly a grave drawback but it does mean that the contribution to current scholarly debates is rather thin.

To take one example of this sort of difficulty, Martinich's account of Hobbes's "reply to the Foole" is too compressed and schematic to be convincing. The famous problem of the fool is set out in chapter 15 of Leviathan, where Hobbes considers an argument intended to show that breaking covenants might be rational on at least some occasions, so that justice could then be deemed contrary to reason whenever violating the dictates of justice offers the prospect of greater gain than adhering to them. Hobbes scholarship is unanimous in seeing Hobbes as rejecting the reasoning of the fool and offering an argument to show that it is never rational to break one's covenants, irrespective of the gains that might be had by doing so. There is considerably less agreement among scholars about just what sort of counter-argument Hobbes thought was decisive against the fool's reasoning. Martinich summarizes some of the difficulties (pp. 102-103) and indicates the broad outlines of the interpretations that have been pursued (pp. 221-223). He also indicates his preferred solution to the problem:

I think that Hobbes's answer to the fool can be made more explicit in terms of the conditions required for proving that something is rational. Hobbes is giving a science of morality and politics and, according to this understanding, science consists of necessarily true propositions, and necessarily true propositions are either definitions or follow from definitions. These necessarily true propositions are not statements of what experience teaches. So, the fool cannot justify his position on the basis of what consequences are likely to follow, as shown by experience. He needs to provide a justification that consists of propositions that are necessarily true. And it is this that he cannot provide and does not even try to provide. (pp. 103-04)

This is an interesting suggestion, and certainly one worth considering. Yet it does seem at odds with a fair amount of what Hobbes took himself to be doing. If rationality requires certainty of outcomes, then a Hobbesian rational agent must never gamble on the outcome of a coin toss -- regardless of the odds he might be offered -- because he cannot know with certainty that he will win rather than lose. But if that is the standard of rationality operative in Hobbes's justifications for the laws of nature, a lot more needs to be said about how Hobbes conceived of rationality and the connection between his account of demonstration and his science of politics. It is prima facie plausible that a very large part of rationality involves reasoning about "what consequences are likely to follow," and Hobbes's political theory is typically taken to be an account of how rational agents will reason their way out of a state of nature and into a commonwealth. If, as Martinich suggests, Hobbes's approach to rationality makes it impossible to reason correctly under conditions of uncertainty, then the contributions of the philosopher from Malmesbury have been seriously overestimated.

A virtue of Martinich's approach to Hobbes is that it emphasizes the connection between Hobbes's scientific work (including his various mathematical endeavors) and the rest of his philosophy -- which includes metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of language, and political theory, among other subjects. Much of the secondary literature on Hobbes takes him to have been a political philosopher above all else, and his writings on non-political topics are frequently treated as something that lacks any profound or interesting connection to his political theory. Martinich rightly stresses that Hobbes's understanding of science (whether the science of politics he claimed to have invented, or the science of geometry to which he claimed to have made great contributions) sees all the sciences as unified. This approach to Hobbes explains, among other things, why his three treatises De Corpore, De Homine, and De Cive are presented as the three parts of the "elements" of philosophy. The first part ("Of Body") is intended as the foundation and sets out Hobbes's materialist metaphysics, along with his nominalistic account of language and logic, and his treatment of geometry and physics. Part two of the great Hobbesian system ("Of Man") contains the theory of human beings -- animated, rational bodies -- and offers an analysis of sensation and motivation consistent with the materialism in part one of the system. The third and final part ("Of the Citizen") delivers the political theory, describing the origin and nature of the covenants that bind humans together into a commonwealth.

As appealing as this picture of a unified Hobbesian science may appear, there is the obvious difficulty of trying to reconcile Hobbes's theory of science with his practice in setting out his philosophy. For Hobbes, all science begins with definitions. Hobbesian method demands that syllogisms are then to be constructed from these definitions, thereby establishing conclusions as firmly as the definitions themselves. Such conclusions can then serve to construct further syllogisms, with the result that ever more remote consequences of the initial definitions are established with absolute certainty. Thus, if we take Hobbes's account of scientific knowledge literally and regard all of first philosophy, natural philosophy, and civil philosophy as a unified system, we should expect that the political theory is a deductive consequence of principles that, in turn, are derived from an account of human nature, which itself is deducible from basic definitions of such concepts as body, space, and motion.

However, even on the most charitable reading of Leviathan or De Cive it is simply not credible that the substantive principles in the political theory could seriously have been intended as derivations more geometrico from the definitions that make up Hobbes's first philosophy. Hobbes certainly claimed to have developed a science of politics, which he famously boasted was no older than his treatise De Cive. But this claim is difficult to reconcile with his account of what makes something a science. Martinich is sensitive to this difficulty, which is one of the central puzzles in the interpretation of Hobbes's philosophy. It is disappointing to discover that the best conclusion he can muster is that "Because of the inconsistencies, real or imagined, in Hobbes's writings, this matter, like many others, will not be settled once and for all" (p. 174).

The exposition is for the most part very clear, although Martinich does occasionally leave the reader wondering just what he might be trying to convey. For instance, in discussing Hobbes's account of rights in the state of nature, Martinich observes that Hobbes shifts from speaking about what is objectively the case (namely, which sorts of actions will preserve a person's life) to a subjective judgment about what is the case (that is, what an individual might believe is likely to preserve his or her life). Martinich dubs this move "the slide from objectivity to subjectivity" and contends:

Hobbes uses the slide in other crucial points in his philosophy. For example, later he slides from the objective fact that the sovereign is supposed to preserve the lives of his subjects to the subjective fact that the sovereign alone should judge what preserves the lives of his subjects. I think this slide is part of a general shift from objectivity to subjectivity in modern philosophy that is easily found in Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume (p. 79).

I find this both puzzling as a reading of Hobbes and utterly baffling as a claim about the history of modern philosophy. In the first place, it is hardly clear that there is an interesting distinction between the "objective" fact that the sovereign is responsible for the lives of his subjects and the "subjective" fact that the sovereign is charged with judging what course is best suited to preserve the subjects' lives. But even if there is a stable and interesting distinction between the objective and subjective in this particular instance, I cannot see how we are enlightened by being told that the history of philosophy in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries involves some sort of "general shift from objectivity to subjectivity." Indeed, I confess that I cannot imagine what that means. Such lapses in clarity are, however, rare enough that they do no serious damage to Martinich's account of Hobbes.

On the whole, the book makes a significant contribution to the literature by offering an accessible introduction to Hobbes's philosophy. It would fit well in most undergraduate courses on early modern philosophy, and it is a fine way to acquaint students with the work of one of the key figures in the history of philosophy. The summary of the current state of scholarship is particularly welcome, as it gives a concise and evenhanded account of the main issues that have been of concern to Hobbes specialists over the years.