2006.06.08

Wayne Waxman

Kant and the Empiricists: Understanding Understanding

Wayne Waxman, Kant and the Empiricists: Understanding Understanding, Oxford University Press, 2005, 648pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195177398.

Reviewed by Thomas Vinci, Dalhousie University


Waxman's book is a good history of philosophy but it is also a good philosophical story, one that not everyone will agree with in detail, or even broad conception (although I do), but it is an exciting story, told with clarity and an enthusiasm that is catching. Like all good story tellers, Waxman is an advocate for his characters, though he does not shrink from criticism where he thinks it merited. I found that I wanted to keep turning the pages even though the limitations of attention, time and eyesight prevent one from doing so -- the book is very long, 600 large pages set in small type. Nevertheless I recommend making the effort, perhaps reserving a space of a week or so and staying with it until finished.

The leading idea of this book is that there is a project that the Empiricists -- and by this Waxman means the traditional Big Three British Empiricists -- began and that Kant finished. The leading idea of the project is that the content of ideas of cause and effect, substance and other such ideas that Kant would call "categories" is provided by an awareness ("reflexive awareness") directed to operations of the mind. The project is, thus, a project in psychology rather than epistemology or, even, metaphysics. The project contrasts with the Rationalist project -- and by this Waxman again means the traditional Big Three -- the leading idea of which is that the content of categorial ideas is given in special objects of ideas that are, in a traditional sense, innate to the mind. Waxman coordinates the distinction between these two projects thus understood to a difference in attitude to language. Whereas the Rationalists thought that linguistic understanding effectively maps metaphysical reality because the category-terms take "true" ideas (as contrasted with "materially false" ideas in the Cartesian sense) as their semantic values, and true ideas reveal reality as it is in itself, the Empiricists were, in the first instance, not engaged in a semantic project at all (in the modern sense),[1] and to the extent to which they were in the business of annexing names to ideas, since categorial names designate the most abstract of ideas, there were no ideas -- true or otherwise -- to which categorial names could be annexed.[2] The problem that Empiricists had with abstraction, problems that became more radical as one moves from Locke to Hume, gave rise to the problem of explaining where we get our categorial beliefs from in the absence of categorial ideas. Much of the book is devoted to this story as it unfolds in Berkeley and Hume. Despite these challenges, Waxman sides squarely with Empiricism against Rationalism.[3]

Of course a concern with categorial ideas is Kant's main problem too, worked out most directly in the Transcendental Deduction of the Categories in both editions of the Critique of Pure Reason. This provides a prima facie problem for Waxman's leading idea that Kant is engaged in the same, psychological, project as the Empiricists since Kant says in the introductory discussion of the TDC (in both editions) (A84-86/B116-118) that whereas Locke was engaged in a psychological deduction to show the matter of fact about the origins of our categorial ideas (quid facti ) he, Kant, is engaged in a much deeper project designed to reveal the matter of what right we have to employ them (quid juris). Waxman is aware that he is swimming against the stream of modern analytic interpretations. He devotes some space[4] to arguing against these interpretations, but the main task of doing so will fall to Volume II, not yet published.

In the present volume Waxman assumes that Kant is indeed engaged in a project of theorizing about actual cognitive operations and puts this theorizing to work, in Chapter 3, to show a way out of "Hume's quandary," the well-known claim that Hume makes in the Appendix to the second edition of the Treatise that two of his central doctrines are "inconsistent." The doctrines in question are that (1) there are no real connections in nature and that (2) the self is not a metaphysically basic, simple substance. Waxman eschews a detailed canvassing of the many possible readings of the quandary in the secondary literature on the topic, offering his own account, which he regards as novel,[5] with relatively little exegetical grounding. Rather, Waxman identifies a problem with Hume's psychology and thinks that there is in Kantian cognitive theory a solution, indeed, the only solution that is available to Hume within the constraints of Hume's own central doctrines.

The basic story of Hume's psychology, according to Waxman, runs as follows.[6] Sense impressions and ideas are the two main elements of the machinery Hume deploys -- both are the immediate objects of perception. The key difference between ideas and impression lies in the vivacity and force with which they present their content to the mind. Vivacity is a mark of actuality, so when it is missing we regard the object as a fiction, possibly but not actually existing. Sense impressions give rise to ideas, ideas give rise to other ideas and if certain ideas become the object of reflexive awareness they can give rise to a secondary class of impressions. (Being aware of an idea of a bear can give rise to an impression of fear.) The relation of "giving rise to" should not be understood in a metaphysical-causal sense, but marks a transition of thought: one thought occurs at one time, another follows upon the first. Sometimes the transitions are easy; when this is so there is a "facility feeling" that arises when we are reflexively aware of the ease of the transition. Ease of transitions is a function of habit which is a function of associations between ideas conforming to three general patterns: cause and effect (constant conjunction), resemblance, and spatio-temporal contiguity.

The most important of these elements is facility feeling. It is both a "universal attractor", establishing relations between ideas when facility feeling occurs in transitions, and a "universal conduit," transmitting the manner in which the first is perceived to the second.[7] Of special importance to Hume's metaphysical program is the transmission of vivacity.

The conductive effects of facility feeling make it possible for Hume to explain the entire economy of the mind -- the order and unity of understanding, the passions, and their interaction -- by focusing on a single associative quality among distinct perceptions. In particular, he had only to discover which facilitating relations exhibit the greatest and most far reaching conductive power…in order to discover the 'permanent, irresistible, and universal' principles of association…These principles resolve… into just three: resemblance, contiguity and cause and effect.[8]

Waxman then builds on this account an explanation of the natural-relation definition of cause in Hume (the second definition). The customary conjunction between one event and another characteristic of causes becomes a habit which then produces facility in subsequent transitions between cause and effect. We notice this facility and this reflexive awareness comprises a secondary impression of facility-feeling that, in the case of constant conjunction, takes on the character of a feeling of necessity in the transition. This impression is not part of the original transition but is a kind of "emergent" perception endowed with vivacity. This vivacious necessity-feeling is then projected onto events in the objective world (projection being another case of facile idea-transition), thus explaining our (false) belief that in the objective world there is an actual necessary relation between objective events.

With this account on the table, Waxman then proceeds to describe Hume's quandary:

In my view…his quandry concerning personal identity did not result from anything in that account as such, but rather from something it presupposes: the unity of consciousness whereby successive perceptions are united in our thought in the first place. At the core of Hume's associationism are facile transitions from one perception to a perception that succeeds it…Such transitions consequently presuppose the compresence in consciousness of non-simultaneous perceptions…in order for associative imagination to become conscious, and a fortiori to feel the facility, of the transitions between these non-simultaneous perceptions, they must already be united in one and the same transition-feeling consciousness. Some further principle, antecedent to association, is therefore required…[9]

The "further principle" is Kant's doctrine of the a priori intuition of time. Waxman provides his interpretation of this doctrine and then shows how it solves the quandary, all in Chapter 3.

Waxman's is a long book, over 600 pages in length, and it contains 20 chapters. Much happens after chapter 3. About half of this is devoted to an elaboration of the account of human psychology just described. I must say that this aspect of Hume's philosophy, uncomfortably reminiscent of a Rube Goldberg device, is not my favorite, but it is there, it is the heart and soul of Hume's theoretical philosophy and it deserves the thorough and sympathetic exposition that Waxman offers. Waxman also fends off some self-identified objections and deals with various other objections coming from the secondary literature. So it is obvious why these discussions are there. But about half of the remainder of the book is devoted to an account of the development of the Empiricist theory of general ideas, from its more liberal incarnation in Locke to its more austere incarnations in Berkeley and Hume. It is less obvious why this material had to be in the book.

There is, of course, much intrinsic interest in this material and Waxman has much of interest to say about it. But what is there about this material that is essential to setting up the background to the quandary? It is true that it is the psychological process of association (resemblance in particular) that provides the account of general ideas in both Berkeley and Hume, replacing Rationalist (and Lockean) accounts of generality. So some of the motivation for the associationist psychology of Berkeley and Hume emerges from an account of their handling of the generality issue.

However, more seems to be involved than just that, for Waxman's discussion of generality in all three Empiricists comes to a focus in three main issues revolving around the general idea of space. The first is whether there a single property of spatiality that the objects of various senses possess. This discussion coalesces around Locke and Berkeley's treatment of the famous Molyneaux problem. The second is where to find a source of our idea of three-dimensional space, given that the immediate objects of visual perception are either non-spatial for Berkeley or 2-D spatial for Hume. Finally, there is the question of how we are to distinguish between objective space (and objective objects in objective space) and space as an immediate object of perception given the doctrine of esse est percipi in Berkeley and in Hume.

The scenario that Molyneaux drew to Locke's attention concerns a man born blind from birth, but with his tactile sense well developed, who suddenly comes to see. Would he immediately notice that a cube that he feels with his hand and one that he sees with his newly-sighted eyes embody the same specific property? Locke and Berkeley both say "no" but for different reasons, according to Waxman. Berkeley says no because there are no trans-sense common ideas, including ideas of shape, so any identification of the objects as the same must be from associationist principles of the sort Berkeley develops in A New Theory of Vision. Locke says "no" not for this reason, since he allows for trans-sense common properties, space being a prime example, but because there is a judgment-component to the phenomenology of visual experience, and this component requires learning to be activated.

Waxman bases this latter claim on an analysis of Locke's discussion of the globe at Essay II, ix, 8. In that discussion Locke maintains that the round and smooth appearance that a globe presents to sight is not what is originally, immediately perceived (an impression that is neither round nor smooth) but is somehow affected by our judgment (based on what we originally do immediately perceive) that the globe is objectively round and smooth. The question is how to read "is somehow affected": as a cause of a new impression, round and smooth rather than flat and irregular, or as a component of a perceptual state the other component of which is the original immediate perception, itself unchanged by the judgment? Locke's text seems to me to be ambiguous on this, but Waxman takes the latter reading. For Locke, visual perception is, then, an "amalgam" of two associated cognitive elements. Waxman calls the process that leads to the amalgam "synthesis," an obvious reference to Kantian themes to come in Volume II. But Waxman also thinks that the amalgam-theory he finds in Locke carries over as a solution to the other two problems: Berkeley finds an idea of 3-D visual space in an amalgam of immediate objects of vision and specifically associated objects of touch -- Hume more or less follows Berkeley's lead here; and Berkeley finds the idea of an objective world-order in an extension of the kind of amalgamation of ideas that figures in the account of 3-D perception -- again, Hume follows suit.

What, specifically, does this have to do with the Kantian solution to Hume's quandary? Recall that the general nature of the solution has to do with Kant's theory of time solving a problem in Hume's requirement of a succession of ideas comprising the transition from cause-idea to effect-idea. But nowhere is essential reference to space made in Waxman's account of the Kantian solution to Hume's quandary. So what does the former have to do with the latter? I am not certain what Waxman's answer to this would be, but I think that Kant's answer would be that our ability to represent a temporal sequence requires a spatial representation. I now propose, first, to develop Waxman's Kantian solution to Hume's quandary in more detail; second, to uncover a problem with it; and third, to provide a Kantian solution to the problem employing Kant's theory, as I read it, of pure spatial intuition.

The problem that Waxman identifies for Hume stems from the requirement that for any secondary impression (like the impression of necessity) to arise from a succession of ideas, the transition as a whole must be the object of reflexive consciousness at an instant of time: "For unless their succession is consciously considered as one -- the act of taking the manifold perceptions together and representing them as a manifold -- how could we represent them as forming a succession at all, rather than being, for us, an absolute beginning and end in its own isolated instant."[10] The only way in which this could happen, Waxman maintains, is

if, instead of brute datum, the succession of perceptions in consciousness was, in part, the product of an act of imagination antecedent to association….Such an explication would provide an exit from Hume's quandary since, in eliminating the succession of perceptions he supposed to exist prior to and independently of imagination, the problem of explaining how that succession comes to be united in our consciousness would be eliminated as well. For, by contrast with a preimaginatively real succession, we would [not] be…inclined to look to metaphysics for a substantial substrate or real connections to explain how an ideal, purely imaginary succession of perceptions come to be united in our thought or consciousness…[11]

Waxman then identifies five Kantian doctrines that together fit the requirements of this solution, of which the following three are chief:

(1) The perception (empirical consciousness) of succession and simultaneity presupposes a time that is nothing else than a pure intuition of sensibility

(3) Pure time is a product of the imagination

(5) …the pure time intuition exemplifies the formal unity of consciousness characteristic of pure apperception.[12]

The problem is to explain how the distinct elements of the succession come to be grasped at an instant even though they occur over a temporal interval. The only solution, thinks Waxman, is Kant's: the succession has to be unified in a conscious act. This happens because a succession always occurs in time, time is a unity and the unity in question is a consciousness-unity. This is thesis (5) and Waxman sees it following from (3). Waxman devotes some space to defending this reading of Kant, though, again, most of the heavy lifting remains to be done in volume II, but one can discern the basic outline of the argument.[13] Time, says Kant in the Aesthetic, is a singular entity and he gives the impression there that it is something given to us as the form of intuition, not constructed by an act of synthesis of the understanding as is the case with judgment. Yet in a critical footnote to section 26 of the B-edition, (B 160) Kant dispels part of this impression by saying that time (and space) are after all constructed unities, it is just that the synthesis that constructs them is not a category-governed synthesis: it is "pre-discursive" as Waxman puts it. The locus for constructing syntheses of this kind is the imagination. So the imagination constructs unified time. This much seems right to me. Waxman goes on to identify the kind of unity that time acquires in virtue of the constructive activity of the imagination with the kind of unity that is present in the unity of apperception, and this in turn with the kind of unity that the self possesses. This too seems right to me. But even with this granted I do not see that there is here a solution to the problem: how can a temporally extended multiplicity be grasped at an instant in a unified intuition? The kind of unity that is at issue in the singularity thesis is topological unity: each instant of time is temporally connected to each other instant. This much is certainly necessary for a series of distinct perceptions to be part of a unified representation, but it is not sufficient: something more is needed to explain how that unified temporal entity gets to be represented at an instant.

Kant himself was aware of this problem, and stated it in so many words in the A-edition deduction section on the synthesis of reproduction: "But if I were always to lose the preceding representations (the first parts of the line, the preceding parts of time, or the successively represented units) from my thought and not reproduce them when I proceed to the following ones, then no whole representation…could ever arise." (A102)[14] Kant's specific solution, the part about reproduction, is unfortunately not entirely clear but the parameters of a satisfactory solution are clear: we cannot "lose" the representations of the past event from the present. For this parameter to be satisfied, each successive perception in an event E must leave a series of permanent traces, that is, a series of traces which exist simultaneously at each time when E as a whole is consciously grasped in an intuitional representation. Moreover, these traces must represent the topological structure of the events thus grasped. Drawing a line composed of permanent traces corresponding to moments of elapsed time, or recording permanent physical traces of events we perceive in the mind, would serve as this kind of representation. In either case, the representation is permanent and spatial.

I do not see Kant specifically offering this solution[15] but in the B-edition TDC, he does say that the representation of time can be accomplished by drawing a line. (B 154) Suppose, then, that we accept as Kantian the solution to Hume's quandary just proposed. But because of the requirement of permanence-of-trace, there is a conflict with Hume's doctrine that each perception is a fleeting and transitory event. To fix this would require either dropping the atomism about perceptions or accepting the notion of a force that keeps transitory entities in being self-identically over time. This latter would require a species of objective causality, a real connection in nature, and would be an instance of something that exists unperceived. Of course both of these alternatives are inconsistent with Humean doctrine. And so the quandary remains.

In both cases (of force and of an object that exists independently of perception) the reason that Hume denies that there can be any such things is that we cannot have an idea of any such things, and we cannot have an idea of such things because we lack an impression of such things. I now will argue that the reason Hume is able to maintain this is because, following Berkeley, he maintains that we do not have an impression of three-dimensional space.

Hume explicitly links the possible impression of three dimensional space to the impression of an object's distinctness from ourselves in Treatise I, (ii): Of Skepticism with regard to the senses. One (of three) objections to taking the senses to provide us with the notion of external existence derives from the fact that, "Even our sight informs us not of distance or outness (so to speak) immediately and without a certain reasoning and experience, as is acknowledged by the most rational philosophers."[16] It is not clear how far a restoration of 3-D perception to the category of impression (object of immediate perception) would take us in the direction of establishing that we have an impression of things external to us but it would at least strengthen the case. Within Kant's philosophical system, of course, the existence of three dimensional space is the ground of our ability to represent things as distinct from ourselves;[17] and within Kant's philosophical system our experience of objects distinct from us (objects in space) is immediate.[18]

But, perhaps even more important, an impression of 3-D space would strengthen the case that bodily-resistance sensations comprise impressions of force. Hume himself considers this possibility:

It may be pretended that the resistance which we meet with in our bodies, obliging us frequently to exert our force and call up all our power, this gives us the idea of force or power. It is this nisus or strong endeavor of which we are conscious that is the original impression from which this idea is copied.[19]

(The suggestion I am making is that the force that we feel coming from outside of us, as much as the force we generate coming from inside our bodies, is the impression from which we get the idea of force.) Hume offers two objections to this pretense. The first is that we think that there are other sources of power than just resistance of this kind; the second is that

This sentiment of an endeavor to overcome resistance has no known connection with any event. What follows it, we know by experience, but could not know it a priori.

Neither objection is to the point. Re 1, even if there are other types of forces and powers, if there is at least this type and we have an impression of it, then that is what is required. Re 2, so what if we do not know a priori what will happen when a force is applied to something? If it really is a force and we have an impression of it, then that is what is required. But is not Hume's underlying objection that what we are calling a perception of a force of resistance is really just a qualitative characterization of a sensation -- a resistance-sensation? It is here that I think the issue of the dimensionality of the objects of immediate perception comes in. A force is a spatial something with intrinsic directionality. If we are feeling a force then we are feeling it either operating at some angle (in or out) to our bodies, hence in 3-D space. If the only spatial entities of which we can have immediate perception are 2-D entities, then we cannot have immediate perception of forces, hence no impression of forces. I suspect that it is this reasoning that ultimately underlies Hume's rejection of the possibility that we have an impression of force. But if the assumption that the immediate objects of perception are restricted to 2-D objects is removed, then so is the chief obstacle to reading our force-sensations as impressions of force.

In short, if only we allowed that we have 3-D sense impressions, then the arguments for both of the major tenets of Hume's nihilistic empiricism -- no impressions of objects distinct from us, no impressions of objective causal necessity -- would be seriously weakened, if they remain standing at all. We now need to see why Hume thought that the objects of immediate perception are not 3-D.

Hume thought this because Berkeley thought this, and in the main, Hume accepted Berkeley's theory of space. (Berkeley is the "rational philosopher" of the quotation from the Treatise, above.) There is an important connection between Berkeley's doctrine of space and his theory of abstraction, nicely brought out by Waxman. Berkeley endorses the principle that what is not separable in perception is not separable in thought, the "Separability Principle" as Waxman calls it.[20] Not separable in thought means not even something that can be considered separately. For example, if I cannot separate extension in general from a particular perception of colour, then I cannot separate extension in general in thought, and thus cannot have an abstract idea of it that I can apply to a different domain of objects. Berkeley maintains in his principal work on perception, the New Theory of Vision, that touch is a spatial sense: the objects of touch are extended objects. Since I cannot imagine having tactile sensations that are not extended, I cannot separate the notion of extension-in-general in thought from its application in the domain of tactile objects. So extension-in-general is not a common element in particular extended things. What of particular forms of extension? Here Waxman sees Berkeley taking a similar line arguing that we cannot imagine perceiving a red and square object without its particular colour and shape, hence particular colour and shape are also things that we cannot separate in thought. (At least I think that this is Waxman's view -- he does not focus on this example.) So all red things of a particular shade of red and a particular shape do not share anything in common. Of course we apply the term "square", "red", "extended" to a multitude of things, so these words have generality in some sense. They do so because they signify general ideas, which derive their generality from being used to "indifferently denote" a class of ideas. Waxman maintains that the notion of indifferent denotation is to be explained in terms of resemblance between the denoting idea and the indifferently denoted ideas.[21] So, although a red square and a red circle have literally nothing in common, they do have a resemblance to one another and to an arbitrarily selected representative idea to which we have attached the word "red."

Although in some places Berkeley seems to say that colour and extension are inseparable from one another in perception, thus inseparable in thought, in the New Theory of Vision Berkeley maintains that extension is only present in the immediate objects of tactile perception -- the immediate objects of vision are confined to colour and light. But why should this be? Even in the domain of tactile perception, the most that one can say is that they are extended because the term "extension" indifferently denotes them. But why should this term not also indifferently denote the immediate objects of visual perception? According to Waxman[22] this is because of Berkeley's conviction that Molyneaux's newly-sighted blind man would not immediately note a resemblance between the seen cube and the felt cube, thus there is no resemblance and so the immediate objects of visual perception are not included in the indifferent denotation of the general term "extension." (Of course the reliance on a primitive notion of resemblance-recognition by Berkeley raises in general many questions and problems, some of which Waxman attends to in Chapters 10 and 18.[23])

Yet, of course, we do say that we "see" spatially extended objects. Berkeley's story, nicely developed by Waxman in Chapter 14, is that this is so because of associations that are set up between the array of light-color points that comprise the immediate objects of vision for Berkeley (the "formal multiplicity of vision" in Waxman's terminology) and tactile sensations and proprioceptive sensations comprising the feeling of bodily motions like walking. It is in these correlations, if at all, that the idea of depth in the objects of our visual perception arises. For example, we experience a certain characteristic pattern of color and light and correlate this with the feeling of taking the number of steps needed to make tactile contact with the object represented by this pattern. Thus the idea of a 3-D world emerges -- it is an amalgam of tactile, proprioceptive and visual sensations.

There is, however, a difficulty for Berkeley in maintaining that there is not a component of extension in the immediate objects of vision, since the array of light-color points that are associated with the other sensations is, surely, somehow an extended array since the multiplicity is a simultaneous multiplicity with a 2-dimensional structure. How else can we fit Berkeley's proposal to the manifest phenomenology of our visual perception? It is here, I think, that the Kantian notion of space as a form of receptivity would well serve Berkeley's purpose. The immediate objects of receptivity are indeed not extended things, just color-light points as Berkeley requires. But the structure of their array is nevertheless real, and is contributed by the fact that they are received and arrayed in a spatial container existing prior to the reception of the sensations. This is space as the form of sensible intuition. On this reading, pure intuition is a container with a spatial structure and it contributes that structure to the objects arrayed in it.[24] Now this conception of spatial intuition is not Waxman's[25] but it is one that fits some of the key texts[26] and solves the problem for Berkeley.

Even if we accept this Kantian revision to Berkeley's doctrine of vision, the immediate objects of vision will still be 2-D spatial arrays of light-colors points. Three dimensionality is still a secondary visual object, something suggested by associations with tactile and proprioceptive sensations. But even this might be saying too much, for can we say that this set of associations amounts to an idea of three dimensionality? In Humean terms, no, for there is no impression of three dimensionality. Can we even explain why we believe that we live in a 3-D world in Hume's terms? This would require an error-theory embodied in explanations of the kind he offered for our belief in body and our belief in necessary natural connections. Notice that in each case the error consists of confounding an idea that actually does exist (and is based on an impression that actually exists) with an idea that does not exist. In the case of the idea of body there is an actual idea of strict identity at an instant (and an impression of same) with which we confuse a (non-existent) notion of strict identity over time; and in the case of causation there is the actual idea of necessity as an attribute of our feelings (and impressions of same) with which we confuse a (non-existent) idea of natural necessity in objects outside our ideas. What corresponds to the actual idea and the actual impression in the case of our belief in a 3-D world? What would an error theory corresponding to these others look like? Neither Hume nor Waxman give any indication.

Alternatively, we might regard the idea of a 3-D space as an idea defined in terms of other ideas -- a complex idea. Perhaps the thought is that we can simply define a perception of a three dimensional space in terms of relations among perceptions of two dimensional space. Suppose we accept that the sensation of a hand touching a surface comprises a perception of a 2-D plane, as Berkeley maintained. We imagine a sequence of associated perceptions of our hand moving over a surface in one plane, and then encountering a plane orthogonal to the first plane and moving over its surface. This is what it is to perceive a three dimensional object. The problem is with the notion of orthogonality: this just means moving in a dimension additional to those in the initial plane, that is, moving in a third dimension. But then we need to already understand what 3-D space is in order to understand the definiens, and that makes the definition useless for present purposes. If we simply take the description "orthogonal-to-a-given 2-D plane" as a qualitative description of a certain feeling we get when we move our hand as described, and then say that perceiving a three dimensional object is perceiving like that, then the problem is to distinguish between the case where the three planes exist simultaneously -- as is required for a three dimensional object -- from the case where two 2-D planes are perceived sequentially -- not sufficient for three-dimensionality. In both cases we are "perceiving like that."

So far we have been unable to see how, within the Berkeley-Hume program of radical empiricism, we can have a simple idea of 3-D space, a defined idea of 3-D space or, even, an error theory that explains why the vulgar (mistakenly) think there is 3-D space. One last possibility remains: to give an account of the phenomenology of the perception of ordinary, three dimensional objects. This is the possibility that Waxman explores in Chapter 14, maintaining that Berkeley's theory of vision gives adequate treatment to the phenomenology of the seeing of ordinary objects in 3-D space. Is this the case?

First, a definition of the phenomenology of experience. When, for example, in a dream I cannot tell by introspective means whether I am dreaming or awake, this is so, I propose, because there is a common experiential content to the dreaming and the waking state. In general, experiential content is what is common to introspectively indistinguishable experiences. Phenomenology is the theory of experiential content, and part of its theoretical objectives will be the devising of equivalence conditions on experiential content. The question before us is whether the tactile and proprioceptive sensations suggested ("signified") by visual color-light points (or regions of points) are needed to explain the phenomenology of vision in this sense or whether an array of the immediate objects of perception, color-light points in a 2-D map, will suffice. Waxman's answer on behalf of Berkeley endorses the first alternative.

Berkeley would no doubt distinguish between the phenomenology of seeing a two-dimensional likeness of some things (say, a photograph) and seeing the things themselves. Intuitively we say that the difference is one of perceived-depth, but this does not mean that we cannot distinguish in principle between the two cases by means of a 2-D array of color/light points. Perhaps the difference between the two perceptions is that, although the color distribution is the same, there is a different distribution of brightness. In any case, either the 2-D color/light-point criterion is sufficient to define phenomenological equivalence or it is not.

Suppose that it is sufficient. In this case proprioceptive and tactile sensations are not needed to explain the phenomenology of vision. What is needed is an explanation of why, given that the immediate objects of perception are given in 2-D, we think, in the case of 3-D phenomenology, that the objects are located at a distance in a third dimension from us. Here Berkeley's theory provides a plausible answer: because the pattern of color/light points immediately perceived is empirically associated with, and thus suggests to us, certain proprioceptive and tactile sensations that do immediately represent a certain distance traversed. This is the view that I think Berkeley intended.

Suppose that it is not sufficient. That is, suppose that there are two phenomenologically discernible perceptions, P1 and P2, such that the 2-D array of color/light points of P1 is identical with the array of P2. For example, suppose that P1 is a perception of a photograph of a scene and P2 is the perception of the scene itself. These are, ex hypothesi, phenomenologically discernible, and yet the criterion-arrays are indiscernible. So we have to appeal to something else to explain the difference. In Berkeley's case, according to Waxman, we appeal to the tactile and proprioceptive sensations signified by the arrays of color/light points. Now Waxman's thesis is that there is a tight isomorphism between particular color/light arrays and the occurrence of a particular set of suggested tactile and propriocepotive sensations -- that is why spatial language is so naturally applied to the objects of vision, even though, strictly speaking, the immediate objects of vision are not spatial at all.[27] This account of the phenomenology of vision is a version of the "amalgam" theory first introduced by Locke (though in a different form). But no sooner is this stated than we see the problem with it: if the causes of the suggested proprioceptive and tactile sensations are 2-D arrays of color/light points and these are identical in P1 and P2, as we are supposing them to be, then how could there be different effects? And if there cannot be different effects, then there cannot be different proprioceptive and tactile sensations suggested. In this case there is no difference in the explanans where there is a difference in the explanandum. Hence, even when the immediate objects of perception are supplemented by suggested tactile and proprioceptive sensations, no adequate account of the phenomenology of vision emerges on Waxman's reading of Berkeley's theory of vision. I conclude that the amalgam theory of perception, at least in the form Waxman proposes, fails as an interpretation of Berkeley's theory of the phenomenology of visual experience. The right reading, I believe, is given in the first alternative.

I now take myself to have shown, regarding 3-D space, that the Berkeley-Hume theory as interpreted by Waxman can neither (1) show how we can have a sense impression of it, nor (2) show how we can have an idea of it, nor (3) show how we can even believe in its existence, nor (4) give an adequate account of the phenomenology of our perception of it. A more complete failure of radical empiricist perception theory in its own terms could scarcely be imagined.

My project here, as Waxman's, is to show how Kant solves problems for the empiricists. The first step to solving the problem is to replace the empiricist notion of an idea -- the immediate object of perception -- with the Kantian notion of an intuition; the second is to understand an intuition as an element in a representational system that represents by isomorphism: a representational system is a model in which the intrinsic properties of the model are transferred to its objects. The model is constructed in a temporally sequential way within a spatial container that gives its intrinsic structure to the objects within it. In this sense it is a form-space in Kitcher's sense,[28] a priori and pure.

On the interpretation I am proposing, a good intuitive analogy for a Kantian representational system is an ordinary geographical map. Additional steps include, third, introducing rules coordinating distinct maps and, fourth, the descriptive apparatus of concepts.

The key idea that provides Kant's solution to the problem of the origin of our representation of a three-dimensional space is given in the following text from the B-edition TDC: "We cannot think of a line without drawing it in thought, we cannot think of a circle without describing it, we cannot represent the three dimensions of space at all without placing three lines perpendicular to each other at the same point, and we cannot even represent time without drawing a straight line (which is to be the figurative representation of time)… " (B 154) (The last part of this passage was quoted earlier in connection with my version of Kant's solution to Hume's quandry.) In order to be able to place three lines at right angles to one another, there has to be a ground for this possibility, and the ground is a three dimensional spatial structure available to the productive imagination in which to draw the lines.

Kant does not say this here, but in the 1768 paper "Regions of Space" Kant says that the fact that one cannot get certain structural counterparts of one another (a pair of hands is his example) to rotate into one another's outline is explained by the fact that space has three dimensions in and of itself. Because of this, the three-dimensionality of space is the ground for the phenomenon of incongruous counterparts. The general point is that the ground of the possibility of engaging in certain observable operations on objects in space and time lies in the intrinsic structure of space and time themselves. This then becomes the premise for his final conclusion: that space is an absolute being.

It is true that Kant had not treated space as the form of sensible intuition in 1768 -- that move was made two years later in the Inaugural Dissertation -- and Kant does not call space an absolute being thereafter. Nevertheless the sense in which he showed space to be an absolute being in the 1768 paper and the sense in which space is a form of intuition are not incompatible. Treating space as a form-space (as a space having its own intrinsic structure that it confers on the objects in it) is not incompatible with claiming that space is a sensorium. After all, Newton claimed that absolute space (in his sense) is the sensorium of God. Why should Kant not claim that absolute space (in his sense) is the sensorium of man?

I have noted above that Waxman's reading of Kant's theory of space as the form of intuition is incompatible with treating it as a form-space. He also denies, in any case, that space as the form of intuition is intrinsically three dimensional.[29] I accept neither of these points but will have to leave a full reply to Waxman to another occasion.

One final note. Assuming space and time to be basic elements of the knowable world for Kant, the result of my reading of Kant is that we cannot have basic representations unless the representations are true -- have objects with which they are in agreement. This is the hallmark of Rationalism -- I agree with Waxman on this -- and so, I would say, the Kantian solution to the problems with Radical Empiricism is a rationalist solution -- not, indeed, in the sense of being a Cartesian doctrine of innate ideas, at least as traditionally conceived, but in Leibniz's sense. Speaking of Locke in the Preface to the New Essays Leibniz says the following:

Perhaps our able author will not entirely disagree with my opinion. For after devoting his whole first book to rejecting innate illumination, understood in a certain way, he admits, however, at the beginning of the second book and in what follows, that the ideas which do not originate in sensation come from reflection. Now, reflection is nothing other than attention to what is within us, and the senses do not give us what we already bring with us. Given this, can anyone deny that there is a great deal innate in our mind, since we are innate to ourselves, so to speak… [30]


[1] Waxman cites Hacking here: 97-99 (Ian Hacking, Why Does Language Matter to Philosophy? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975)).

[2] See esp. Chapters 6, 8 and 15 for Waxman's presentation of the debate between the Rationalists and the Empiricists.

[3] 208

[4] Esp. in chapter 2.

[5] 55, note 3.

[6] The story is given most concisely and clearly on 368-375.

[7] 372

[8] 373

[9] 54-55

[10] 55

[11] 56-57

[12] 60

[13] 60-81; 87-90

[14] Passages quoted are from Immanuel Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, translated and edited by Paul Guyer and Allen Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).

[15] Guyer suggests that a solution along these lines can be found in some of Kant's later, fragmentary writings. See Paul Guyer, "Kant's Intentions in the Refutation of Idealism," Philosophical Review 92 (1983): 329-383.

[16] David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigg,(Oxford: Clarendon, 1967), 191

[17] In the Metaphysical Exposition: A22/B37.

[18] In the B-edition Refutation of Idealism B 276-277.

[19] Both passages are from the Inquiry VII, Part I, note 15. My source is R. Ariew and E. Watkins, Modern Philosophy (Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett Publishing, 1998), 517.

[20] See Chapter 10.

[21] 264

[22] 332

[23] See especially 265 and 505 ff. respectively.

[24] Kitcher calls space conceived this way a "form-space." See Philip Kitcher, "Kant and the Foundations of Mathematics," Philosophical Review 84 (1975): 23-50, at 30, for a development of this reading.

[25] His account is given on 71-73.

[26] Some of which I discuss below.

[27] 349

[28] See note 24.

[29] 89

[30] Modern Philosophy, 376. This passage is also discussed by Waxman, 391.