E.J. Lowe


E.J. Lowe, Locke, Routledge, 2005, 220pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415283485.

Reviewed by Matthew Stuart, Bowdoin College

This book, which belongs to the new Routledge Philosophers Series, is intended as an introduction to Locke's philosophy for undergraduates and general readers. It also contains some material that will be of interest to graduate students and specialists. The first of this book's seven chapters is a biographical sketch and an overview of Locke's works. The next four are devoted to his epistemology, his accounts of substance and identity, his philosophy of language, and his philosophy of action, respectively. There is one chapter on Locke's political philosophy, and a short concluding chapter assesses his legacy and influence. Lowe aspires to place Locke's ideas in their historical context, but also to show their continuing relevance. He draws connections to positions held by Descartes, Berkeley, Boyle and Newton; but also to the views of such twentieth-century figures as Frege, Wittgenstein, and H. L. A. Hart. The writing in Locke is admirably clear, and its chapters are broken up into manageable-sized sections with their own titles. The book includes a five page glossary of philosophical terms, a useful index, and -- at the end of each chapter -- suggestions for further reading.

This book would be a nice choice as a supplementary text in a Descartes-to-Kant class, or in a course on the British empiricists. Indeed, its strongest competition would be either Nicholas Jolley's excellent Locke: His Philosophical Thought (Oxford, 1999), or else Lowe's own earlier effort, Locke on Human Understanding (Routledge, 1995), which is still in print. The most notable difference between Lowe's two introductory books is that the earlier contains no discussion of Locke's political philosophy. Otherwise, they cover much the same ground, and the differences are a matter of emphasis and detail. In one respect at least, Locke on Human Understanding may still be the better introductory text. Locke is marred by the fact that it occasionally strays deeper into corners of the secondary literature than a college sophomore or a general reader is likely to find helpful. At a couple of points this occurs because Lowe is responding to a review or a criticism of the earlier book. The most glaring instance comes in the chapter on agency, where he spends 19 pages discussing and criticizing the reading of Locke that Gideon Yaffe advances in Liberty Worth the Name: Locke on Free Agency (Princeton, 2000). These pages will be of interest to the specialist, but the book's primary readership -- the sort of person who needs glossary entries for 'power' and 'volition' -- is likely to find them difficult and digressive.

When it comes to some of the most disputed questions of Locke scholarship, I cannot say that I always find Lowe's readings ultimately convincing. However, neither do they strike me as being terribly far off the mark. In the remainder of this review, I will focus on his handling of three touchstones: the nature and role of ideas, secondary qualities, and substance. This choice of topics is admittedly somewhat arbitrary. Lowe has equally interesting things to say about other prominent Lockean themes, including personal identity, linguistic meaning, property rights and free action.

Ideas occupy an absolutely central place in Locke's philosophy. They are implicated in his accounts of sensation and judgment, in his reasoning about the degrees and limits of knowledge, in his views about meanings of utterances and linguistic signs, and in his critiques of scholasticism and of essentialist metaphysics. If we are to understand much of Locke's theorizing about mind, language and reality, it would seem that we must know what ideas are. Yet his own explanations -- that ideas are the immediate objects of perception and thought (2.8.8), and that they are whatever is meant by 'phantasm,' 'notion' and 'species' (1.1.8) -- leave the matter obscure. Many have suggested that Locke's ideas are mental images; others that they are acts of perception, or appearances, or intentional objects. Still others allege that he is confused -- that he waffles unwittingly between thinking of ideas as mental images and thinking of them as concepts or some other non-image-like item.

Lowe responds to the charge that Locke waffles in his thinking about ideas. "It would be unfair simply to accuse Locke of a confusion between percepts and concepts," he says, "because it is part of Locke's very project in the Essay to forge a link between our conceptual resources and features of our perceptual experience" (33). He is right that it will not do simply to accuse Locke of confusing percepts and concepts, but there is more behind the charge of conflation. Locke holds that every idea is either simple or complex, and that the complex ones are wholly composed of the simple ones. There are places where he seems to be thinking of simplicity as phenomenal uniformity, as when he offers ideas of colors as examples of simple ideas, and says that simple ideas contain "nothing but one uniform appearance" in the mind (2. 2.1). There are other places where he seems to be thinking of simplicity as logical simplicity, as when he reckons the ideas of space and time as among the simple ideas (2.15.9), and characterizes simple ideas as indefinable (3.4.7). It is hard to see how any one item could be both phenomenally uniform and logically basic. Even if some item could be both, it is hard to see why phenomenal uniformity and logical simplicity could never come apart. A plausible explanation of what is going on is that Locke is sometimes thinking of simple ideas as phenomenally uniform percepts, and other times thinking of them as logically basic concepts.

What does Lowe say that Locke's ideas are? He says that "Locke's theory is…open to more than one interpretation" (36). Rather than defending one interpretation against others, he tries to defend Locke by arguing on the one hand that imagist theories are not "as blatantly untenable and confused as some of their present-day critics have claimed" (37), and on the other that Locke "need not necessarily be interpreted as regarding ideas as images" (34). Despite the hedging, it seems plain that Lowe would like to read Locke as something other than an imagist, in part because he would like to avoid ascribing indirect realism to him and he sees these as connected. Lowe proposes two non-imagist readings of Locke. On the first, the "ideas" involved in sense perception are "ways in which physical objects affect us sensorily" (43). This is compatible with direct realism: what we directly perceive are the objects rather than the ways they affect us. Lowe concedes that to talk of "ways we are affected" is somewhat obscure, and for this reason he allows that this first reading may be compatible with a second that he has in mind. On the second, "to talk about the 'ideas' I have of a given object when I perceive it is to talk about what sort of thing I perceive the object as being and what properties I perceive it as possessing" (44). To have an idea of sensation is, on this reading, to see an object of sense under some guise or aspect.

One problem is that it is not clear how to integrate Lowe's proposals with the rest of what Locke says about ideas. Can talk of simple and complex ideas, and of some ideas being parts of others, be translated into talk about "ways of being sensorily affected" or "guises under which things appear"? Does any of this help us to understand what it means to have ideas of things when we are not sensing those things? Lowe does not explore these issues. Indeed, he suggests that his own proposals may already be more specific than anything the author of the Essay had in mind. "I am inclined to judge," he says, "that Locke himself did not clearly distinguish in his own mind between a non-imagist conception of perceptual ideas and an imagist one, much less have a specific non-imagist conception in view" (45). Lowe adds that this should not be seen as a criticism of Locke, since the relevant distinctions are ones that philosophers have only made much of in the last fifty years or so. I suspect that he is letting Locke off too easily. It is not as though talk of mental images is a twentieth-century innovation. Given all the work that ideas do in Locke's philosophy, we are owed some account of what they are. It would be anachronistic to expect that account to be couched in our terms, using our distinctions, but it seems fair to expect it to answer the question of whether or not ideas are images.

Locke has more to say about the distinction between primary and secondary qualities than he does about the nature of ideas. Moreover, what he says about secondary qualities has been much discussed, variously interpreted, and famously criticized. So it is surprising that Lowe's discussion of the topic is confined to four and a half pages. He quotes Locke's lists of primary and secondary qualities. He tells us that the primary qualities are supposed to be inseparable from bodies, and that this is "closely related" to the notion that primary qualities are intrinsic and possessed in virtue of a body's being spatially extended (48). He then quickly passes to Locke's characterization of secondary qualities as powers to produce sensations or ideas in us. Lowe says that we are naturally inclined to think of colors as surface features, not unlike smoothness or roughness. He sees Locke as "implicitly rejecting this common-sense belief that a colour property such as redness is literally 'on' the surface of an object in the way in which it visibly appears to be" (49). Locke is not denying that bodies are colored, Lowe says, just insisting that colors are powers or dispositions rather than categorical properties (51).

In this book, Lowe makes no mention of the subjectivist reading of Locke, on which he takes secondary qualities to be wholly in our minds. Nor does he discuss the many passages that lend support to that reading, and that consequently make trouble for his own reading of Locke as a dispositionalist. These are places where Locke compares secondary qualities to pains (2.8.13, 2.8.16, 2.8.17), or suggests that secondary qualities go out of existence when unobserved (2.8.17, 2.8.19, 2.31.2). Lowe does mention some of these passages in his earlier book, where they lead him to characterize Locke as "ambivalent about these matters, and perhaps even a little confused" (Locke on Human Understanding, 52).

The topic of substance is another about which Locke is widely thought to be somewhat confused. Here Lowe comes to his defense in a limited way, suggesting that his account will not do as it stands, but that it might be modified in a way that renders it "both compatible with his empiricism and independently defensible" (67).

Locke employs the traditional ontological distinction between substance and mode. Substances are "distinct particular things subsisting by themselves" (2.12.6), and modes are "Dependences on, or Affections of Substances" (2.12.4). Most of the time, Locke seems to count ordinary physical objects -- such things as rocks and trees and men -- as substances. Lowe says that he sometimes employs a stricter conception of substance, one on which the only things that qualify as substances are atoms, aggregates of atoms, finite souls and God. On this stricter conception of substance, trees and men are modes (61). Lowe does not explain why Locke would deny that plants and animals are aggregates of atoms. Presumably the idea is that a plant is not to be identified with the aggregate that constitutes it, because the plant can survive changes in its material composition and the aggregate cannot. In drawing this distinction between Locke's strict and loose conceptions of substance and mode, Lowe is following Alston and Bennett, whose important 1988 paper "Locke on People and Substances" (Philosophical Review 97, 25-46) is recommended as further reading, but is not cited in the text.

Locke holds that each idea of a substance is a complex idea whose components include ideas of some of the substance's qualities, but also another idea -- one that he calls the idea of substance or substratum. This last idea is that of "the supposed, but unknown support of those Qualities, we find existing, which we imagine cannot subsist, sine re substante, without something to support them" (2.23.2). Lowe discusses an objection put forward by Locke's contemporary, Edward Stillingfleet, who agreed that we possess the idea of substratum but argued that Locke does not have the resources to explain how we get it. Lowe walks us through Locke's reply, but ultimately argues that the reply is vulnerable to objections that point to "the basic soundness of Stillingfleet's main charge against Locke" (67).

Locke is sometimes taken to be espousing an ontology of "bare particulars". These would be bearers of properties that lack intrinsic natures of their own. Lowe points to places where Locke suggests that a substratum might have a nature of its own, but he stops short of denying that Locke is committed to bare particulars (69). What he does instead is to suggest a conception of substrata that is definitely not Locke's, but that Locke could embrace without having to give up much. Lowe's proposal is that we retain the idea that qualities are ontologically dependent upon substrata, but identify these substrata with the ordinary objects whose qualities they are. So his substrata are not bare particulars, but ordinary things. Lowe anticipates that many will not see this as a substratum theory, but he disagrees (70). Perhaps it is not worth quibbling over who gets to use the word 'substratum'.

Lowe frequently takes the line that Locke's positions are more defensible than they have generally been taken to be. Sometimes he even sides with Locke against a current trend, as when he suggests that "Locke's account of action and the will is fundamentally correct" (128). Lowe's sympathetic reconstructions of, and amendments to, Lockean positions account for much of the appeal of this book. Rather than repeating old criticisms, he works hard to find charitable readings that evade them. Thus he bolsters the case for Locke's continued relevance, and nicely illustrates one way of thinking about the relation between philosophy and its history. For Lowe -- as for many of us -- wrestling with a canonical text such as Locke's Essay is worthwhile partly because it affords us the opportunity to do philosophy ourselves, in the company of a great thinker, with the benefit of several hundred years' hindsight.