In twelve chapters and some preliminary remarks, Hans Jörg Sandkühler has drawn together his own contributions with those of thirteen other authors to produce a collection on what is often characterized as the most important period in German philosophy. The other authors are Matteo d'Alfonso, Félix Duque, Gian Franco Frigo, Bärbel Frischmann, Piero Giordanetti, Jan-François Kervégan, Lothar Knatz, Georg Mohr, Brian O'Connor, Detlev Pätzold, Maciej Potępa, Michael Rosen and Henriikka Tavi. The work is particularly remarkable in taking on the challenge of organizing its material thematically, rather than producing a pat collection of essays on the four great German idealists Kant, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel. The result is that even though the work is a handbook, not primarily aimed at the specialist in this field, it nonetheless produces valuable reflections on the history of German Idealism, not least of which is the final chapter's "Reception of German Idealism in Europe," a first for the discipline.
Sandkühler intentionally permits the book to revolve around the four key figures of German idealism, so as to keep the project within the limits of an introductory text. Nonetheless there are repeated acknowledgements of more recent scholarship that situate these four philosophers within extraordinarily vigorous philosophical discussions that included many important interlocutors who are now almost forgotten. Hence the ideas of other figures are drawn on in more than mere asides.
The individual chapters are the work of multiple authors. The editor has apparently made every effort to round out individual chapters and to be as balanced as possible by seeking contributions that complement each other. Thus there is consistency in structure and content throughout the entire handbook. In the spirit of a handbook introducing its subject to non-specialists, there is also ample use of sometimes extended quotes in order to convey discrete matters of substance along with the tone and flavor of the primary works under consideration.
Sandkühler's first chapter provides a valuable discussion of the term German Idealism. From this discussion we learn that the term German Idealism did not gain currency until the 1840's and that Hegel legitimates his own position in his Lectures on the History of Philosophy by positioning his work as the dialectical culmination of a teleological process that goes back to Kant. Richard Kroner's Von Kant bis Hegel (1921/24) finally makes "this supposed 'line' into a topos, a legend." Such a historical perspective as this plays a recurrently significant role throughout this book in showing the development of positions. For example, this first chapter places German Idealism in the broader historical context of materialism, as it appeared in the correspondence between Samuel Clark and Gottfried Leibniz of the early eighteenth century, which is contrasted with Christian Wolff's idealism. The discussion is extended to include Moses Mendelssohn and even alludes to Karl Marx and Friedrich Engels as belonging to a line of responses that in fact does not terminate with Hegel.
Chapter two on "Reason and the Absolute" argues that German Idealism is founded on a reaction to the metaphysics of scholasticism as well as to Spinoza, Leibniz, Descartes, Plato and Neo-Platonism. Most notably the chapter examines Fichte's development especially in the phase 1801-1812 in which he no longer merely characterized knowledge of self and the world as absolute but now conceived of knowledge also as a reflection of a prior godly absolute. Hegel is cited as famously responding disparagingly to Schelling's absolute identity as the "night in which all cows are black." To Hegel the absolute is less important as an independent philosophical category, as is evident from his striking it from abbreviated Logic in the first part of the Encyclopedia.
German Idealism is presented as a more radical form of rationalism in Chapter three on "System and Method," again contextualizing German Idealism historically more broadly. Philosophy is systematic for German Idealists and only method can lead to this system. Knowledge is systematic and scientific for Fichte, which leads him to reject the Romantic form of fragmentary knowledge as presented in Friedrich Schlegel's literary aphorisms, whereas nature is the system for Schelling. Hegel argues that Kant has set up a subjective order for knowledge. By articulating his own philosophy inferentially, Hegel sees his system as superior to Kant's because it is necessary and not merely based on a privileged premise.
Th title of the fourth chapter, "Erkenntnis und Wissen", presents a perennial problem for the reader of German Idealist texts in translation as these terms have not always been consistently distinguished, but "Cognition and Knowledge" offers the best contrast between the terms. This chapter shows the struggle with Kant's theory of knowledge, with Schelling taking up the most strongly affirmative position and Hegel placing much more faith in his own teleological system of philosophy than in a separate theory of knowledge. Quotes from Schelling and Hegel are extensive in this chapter.
The philosophies of Hegel and Schelling provide the main substance of what is discussed in the fifth chapter on "Nature." From Schelling and Hegel it can be argued that German Idealism aims at an interpretation of the organic unity of the material, spirit, nature and history in process. Kant is drawn on, hardly in his own right, but rather to show how Schelling and Hegel came to their conclusions. In contrast, chapter six, examining "Freedom, Morality and Ethics", attempts and achieves a much more equitable balance between the four main figures of German Idealism. Starting out with Kant's notion of self-legislation as a principle of reason, chapter six delves into the use Fichte makes of Kant's notion of freedom which Fichte promotes to a system of freedom. This chapter displays what the book does best, by pinpointing issues of development and contrast amongst the philosophers of German Idealism and by pushing the connections. Quite possibly one can discern the hand of the editor in making this chapter more balanced; Sandkühler authors a section inserted into chapter six on Schelling, who left us no work containing a systematic discussion of ethics.
The French Revolution provides the context to bring the examination of German Idealism together on the theme of "Justice and the State" in chapter seven. Kant's tendency towards a practical philosophy places German Idealism on a firm footing to respond to the tumultuous events that shook Europe as the eighteenth century closed and the nineteenth opened. This also provides an opportunity to widen the discussion to include such figures as Georg Forster and Johann Benjamin Erhard, though the four main philosophers successfully remain the focus as this chapter charts their responses.
The net is widened significantly further in chapter eight on "History." Starting with Augustine, the discussion goes into significant detail on Herder who sees history as providential (in a traditionally Christian sense) but who also sees history as subject to the laws of reason and open to human understanding. Kant takes Herder's ideas a step further by dispensing with historical examples and looking at the underlying axioms of the providential nature of history. Schelling takes a more nuanced look at the historical agent and Hegel almost returns to Herder's notion of development with an explicit theory of development. In this kind of interplay between philosophies the book is at its most successful by reaching beyond the necessary details of summarizing the positions of the philosophers to point out the way in which German Idealism developed.
The ninth chapter on "Religion and the Concept of God" also is successful in casting the net of what constitutes German Idealism more widely. The book's thematic approach to its subject makes this broadening of the topic all the more justified under this heading. The discussion is fruitfully anchored in the Pantheism Controversy, showing once again how the debates on Spinoza form important reference points for the genesis of German Idealism. Apart from the four usual suspects, this chapter also contains lengthy discussion of Friedrich Schleiermacher. Kant's and Fichte's construals of religion as a moral issue are irksome to Schleiermacher whose conclusions remain within the limits of German Idealism insofar as his philosophical theology emphasizes consciousness and the absolute (albeit absolute dependence) in ways derived from Kant. The chapter itself cites copiously from Schleiermacher's 1799 On Religion (the second edition appeared in 1806 and one of a few typographical errors garbles this information), and makes it clear that Schleiermacher had distinct ideas about consciousness and God before the 1804 and 1806 works by Fichte cited in Sandkühler's introduction. The necessary abridgement of the argument in the introduction might leave a reader with the mistaken (but widespread) belief that Schleiermacher followed Fichte's ideas, when he was quite adamant in distancing himself from Fichte, especially on the matter of religion.
The tenth chapter on "Beauty and Art" similarly starts broadly with Baumgarten and Burke and covers essential topics such as the sublime in Kant, with attention to detail and thoughtful discussion. Similarly, Schelling and Hegel are given careful and valid consideration. Perhaps some discussion of Fichte's aesthetics could have been provided here as well. Although no systematic discussion of aesthetics was produced by Fichte, there is some concentrated discussion in his Über Geist und Buschstab in der Philosophie, an essay written in 1795 for Schiller's Horen. Although the submission was rejected by the poet and playwright, Fichte published the brief work in the Philosophisches Journal in 1798. A discussion of this material would have worked just as well as Sandkühler's addition on Schelling's ethics does in chapter ten. Another point of dissent might be that the book has no chapter on "Dialectic" although the subject is covered well as the subject index reveals. Such points are mere quibbles, however, with a project that is both bold in conception and successful and enlightening in execution.
Sandkühler manages to steer the project away from grinding out the same old broad interpretations available in standard works on the individual four main authors under discussion. The last two chapters most succinctly make the case for this new thematic approach. Chapter eleven concerns itself with "The Philosophical Contribution of German Early Romanticism and Hölderlin," and this allows discussion of some of the more recent approaches to German Idealism in the works of Karl Ameriks, Frederick Beisser, and Manfred Frank amongst others, who see German Idealism through a broader lens.
Finally, chapter twelve, "The Reception of German Idealism in Europe", provides research that goes beyond the level of its putative audience. A laudable note for the whole book is struck in Sandkühler's preliminary comments when he says that chapter twelve does not seek to exhaust the subject; in that sense the approach of this entire work is welcome and welcoming in its humility. This book is very much recommended for advanced students and those who might use it as a tool in teaching this subject. There is much of historical interest here also for the specialist in German Idealism.