2006.08.06

Donald Davidson

Truth & Predication

Donald Davidson, Truth & Predication, Harvard University Press, 180pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674015258.

Reviewed by Jeff Speaks, University of Notre Dame


Donald Davidson's posthumously published Truth & Predication is both his first self-contained book, and the definitive statement of his views on a number of themes which have been present in Davidson's work since the 1960's. These include, most prominently, the nature of truth and its relation to meaning and to the acts and attitudes of users of a language. But the greatest virtue of the book is that it gives Davidson's views on these topics a new and intriguing motivation: that they alone are capable of solving the problem of the unity of the proposition.

The first three chapters are occupied with the nature of truth. The first chapter argues, on familiar grounds, against a deflationary view of truth which holds that there is nothing more to be said about truth than is contained in Tarski's definitions: Tarski's work does not tell us what the truth predicates applicable to different languages have in common. Davidson does not, however, take this to show that Tarskian definitions are irrelevant to understanding the nature of truth; what it shows is that although Tarski did succeed in giving the extension of the truth predicate, he did not succeed in giving its meaning (27). The next two chapters are an attempt to supply this lack.

In the second chapter, Davidson turns to correspondence and epistemic theories of truth. Views that sentences are true in virtue of their correspondence with facts are rejected as 'unintelligible' (34), 'without content' (42), and 'incomprehensible' (47); but here the rhetoric is more powerful than the argument. The problem with correspondence theories is supposed to be that there is nothing in the world for sentences to correspond to, unless they all correspond to the same thing; but the 'slingshot argument' on which this conclusion depends is not likely to convince defenders of facts as the worldly items to which sentences correspond. Epistemic theories are rejected on the grounds that either (if truth is defined in terms of justification or assertability simpliciter) a sentence can change truth-value because of a change in the conditions of justification or assertion or (if truth is defined in terms of ideal justification or assertability) fail to make 'the intended connection with human abilities' (45).

Of more interest is Davidson's presentation of his positive view in Chapter 3, which provides a compact and lucid presentation of his thoughts on the subject. The target of this chapter is the problem posed at the end of the first chapter: the problem of going beyond Tarski in giving the meaning, as well as the extension, of the truth predicate. Davidson's solution is not -- unlike at least some versions of correspondence and epistemic theories -- a straightforward analysis of the concept of truth. Rather, it is an attempt to explain the concept by showing its connections to the facts in virtue of which sentences have the truth conditions that they do.

The truth conditions of sentences are given by the correct Tarskian truth theory for the languages of which those sentences are a part. Accordingly, the story about what it is for a sentence to have certain truth conditions will explain the facts about a language user in virtue of which the correct Tarskian truth theory for her language is correct. In outline, we begin with the agent's patterns of assent and dissent to sentences. These patterns interact with the 'principle of charity' in two ways. First, the principle of charity guarantees that an agent's observation sentences (and observational beliefs) will (modulo qualifications about explicable error) be true in the salient environmental circumstances in which the agent is disposed to assent to those sentences; this gives us truth conditions for observation sentences (64-65). Second, the principle of charity guarantees both that (modulo the same qualifications) any two sentences to which a speaker assents must be logically consistent; this gives us an interpretation of the logical constants of the language (62-63). Given these facts about logical form, we use facts about which sentences an agent 'prefers true' to which other sentences to extract, via Jeffrey's version of Bayesian decision theory, the subjective probability and 'subjective desirability' assigned to each sentence (67-73). These facts about subjective probabilities then combine with the assignment of truth conditions to observation sentences to yield an assignment of truth conditions to every sentence of the language.

Davidson Diagram

It would, of course, be very implausible to claim that the concept of truth is identical with the full set of these connections, so that 'S is true' would be synonymous with 'S is …', with the ellipsis filled in by the full story about radical interpretation, Bayesian decision theory, and the rest; and Davidson does not claim this. But it is fair to say that if the truth conditions for sentences of a language are fixed in the above way -- an enormous 'if' -- Davidson has succeeded in going beyond Tarski by specifying what it is that the various Tarskian truth theories for different languages have in common: namely, that they all assign the truth conditions to sentences which match, in the above sense, the behavioral dispositions of users of the language. It is in this sense that Davidson's story about what it is for a sentence to be true gives a kind of explanation of the concept of truth.

There is a perspective on truth from which much of the foregoing can seem perverse. One way to see this is by noting that there are many sorts of things which are true or false: not just sentences, but also beliefs, utterances, and propositions. Given this, it seems plausible that some of these should be explained in terms of others; and, once the question is put, it can seem hard to avoid the view that propositions are the primary bearers of truth. Sentences are true or false in virtue of the truth or falsehood of the proposition they express (relative to a context); acts of assertion are true or false in virtue of the truth or falsehood of the proposition they assert; beliefs are true or false in virtue of the truth or falsehood of the proposition which is their content.[1] From this perspective, the question of what it is for a sentence to be true or false -- which is the question to which Davidson addresses himself throughout chapters 1-3 -- has, in a sense, an easy answer: for a sentence to be true (relative to a context) is for it to express (relative to that context) a true proposition. On this view, the fundamental questions are about what it is for a sentence to express a given proposition, and what it is for a given proposition to be true.

It is clear that Davidson thinks that this is not the right thing to say about truth; indeed, somewhat surprisingly, this sort of view doesn't even qualify to be among the competing views that he argues against.[2] But, at the end of this first part of the book, it is not easy to see why. It is not because he doesn't think that there are such things as propositions; he refers to them freely. It is not because he identifies propositions with sentences; he criticizes Ramsey for not distinguishing clearly enough between them (11). It can't be that he thinks that whatever story one tells about the truth of sentences will also apply to propositions; propositions have their truth conditions essentially, and so are not the sort of things on which an agent can confer truth conditions via dispositions to 'prefer true' one to another.

So the puzzle we are left with at the end of Chapter 3 is: why is an account of what it is for a sentence to be true not to be given in terms of an explanatorily prior account of what it is for a proposition to be true? This distrust of propositions, or 'meanings as entities' as Davidson put it in "Truth and Meaning," has long been a feature of Davidson's work.[3] The final four chapters of the book go a long way towards explaining why.

In the fourth chapter, Davidson turns from his discussion of truth to a historical introduction to the 'problem of predication.' The problem of predication (in one of its forms) is the problem of explaining what makes some collections of words, but not others, capable of being true or false (86). It is so-called because the principal challenge faced by any answer to this problem is the problem of explaining the distinctive contribution made by predicates to the truth or falsity of sentences. This is best brought out by Davidson's discussion of Plato's explanation of predication in terms of universals:

The sentence 'Theaetetus sits' has a word that refers to, or names, Theaetetus, and a word whose function is somehow explained by mentioning the property (or form or universal) of Sitting. But the sentence says that Theaetetus has this property. If the semantics of the sentence were exhausted by referring to the two entities Theaetetus and the property of Sitting, it would be just a string of names; we would ask where the verb was. The verb, we understand, expresses the relation of instantiation. Our policy, however, is to explain verbs by relating them to properties and relations. But this cannot be the end of the matter, since we now have three entities, a person, a property, and a relation, but no verb. When we supply the appropriate verb, we will be forced to the next step, and so on. (85-6)

The solution to the problem of predication which Davidson criticizes here is the view that (i) meaningful expressions correspond to entities which are their contents, (ii) names and verbs differ in the kinds of entities which are their contents (objects in the first case, universals in the second), and (iii) we can give an explanation of why sentences can be true or false solely in terms of the contents of their parts. The above argument shows that the conjunction of (i)-(iii) is false: not any collection of entities is the sort of thing that can be true or false. A related way of making this point is that for any sentence which can be true or false -- e.g., 'Theaetetus sits' -- we can find another collection of words which correspond to the same contents -- e.g., 'Theaetetus the property of sitting' or 'Theatetus the relation of exemplification the property of sitting' -- which is 'just a string of names' and is therefore not the sort of thing which can be true or false.

What follows is a guided tour through other responses to the problem of predication: Aristotle's view of predication as ascription of universals dependent on the substances which instantiate them, Russell's and Strawson's Platonic theories of propositions, Russell's later multiple relation theory of judgement; the nominalism of Sellars and Quine; and, finally, Frege's view of predicates as incomplete expressions. Some of these theories of predication (the early Russell and Strawson) are rejected via the argument directed above at Plato. Others (Aristotle and Frege) are rejected on the grounds that the argument cannot be blocked by insisting on the distinctive character of the entities which are claimed to correspond to predicates. As Davidson nicely puts the point,

if …predicates refer to entities, and this fact exhausts their semantic role, it does not matter how odd or permeable some of the entities are, for we can still raise the question of how these entities are related to those other entities, objects. (145)

Still others (Quine and Sellars) are praised for avoiding the pitfall of explaining predication by associating predicates with entities to serve as their contents, but ultimately found wanting for their failure to provide an adequate positive account of the role of predicates in fixing the truth conditions of sentences.

The problem of predication is a version of the traditional problem of the unity of the proposition. But the foregoing helps to explain why Davidson prefers to call it the 'problem of predication.' To call it 'the problem of the unity of the proposition' would be to seem to endorse a particular kind of solution to the problem of predication -- namely, that some collections of words are capable of being true or false because they express propositions, and that we can explain the truth aptitude of these collections of words by identifying the metaphysical facts which 'unify' propositions. But Davidson does not think that the problem of predication can be solved by ascending to the level of propositions, any more than he thinks that we can give a satisfactory explanation of what it is for a sentence to be true in terms of an account of what makes the propositions expressed by those sentences true.

Davidson's argument in these chapters is at its most convincing when it most closely parallels the argument against a theory which aims to explain predication fully via the view that predicates correspond to universals; it is at its least convincing in its attempt to generalize this argument to refute any view which aims to explain predication partly in terms of entities, like universals, which are claimed to be expressed by predicates. Davidson's elaboration of the Platonic problem of the unity of the proposition makes a convincing case that what makes some collections of words but not others susceptible of truth or falsity cannot be wholly explained by a theory which associates predicates with entities of any kind, whether they be universals or 'unsaturated' Fregean senses. One natural way to react to this point is to conclude that the wanted explanation should make use, not just of the entities which the relevant semantics associates with predicates, but also of something else -- perhaps the syntax of the relevant sentence.[4] But Davidson seems to move from the fact that universals et. al. can't be the whole story about predication to the conclusion that they can't be part of it either. In the absence of supplementary argument, this looks like an overreaction.

In the final chapter, Davidson presents his positive view of the problem of predication. The key negative aspect of the view is his rejection of the idea that predication can be explained via a theory of a class of entities associated with predicates; the key positive idea is that predication is to be explained in terms of truth. We begin with a Tarskian truth theory for a language, which specifies the conditions under which predicates are true of objects, and then explain the unity of sentences in terms of their possession of truth conditions:

How does Tarski's methodology solve the problem? The first thing I claimed that we could learn from the history of failures was how central the concept of truth is to any solution… . The importance of the connection is this: if we can show that our account of the role of predicates is part of an explanation of the fact that sentences containing a given predicate are true or false, then we have incorporated our account of predicates into an explanation of the most obvious sense in which sentences are unified, and so we can understand how, by using a sentence, we can make assertions and perform other speech acts. (155)

At first glance, this seems too easy. Could it really be that all that is needed to solve the problem of predication is a recognition that predicates are true of objects? And since any reasonable theory of predication will be consistent with the fact that predicates can be true of objects, does this 'solution' really tell us anything at all about predication?

This reaction is too quick. It is true that any reasonable view of predication will be compatible with the fact that predicates can be true of objects. But it is not obvious that every view of predication can explain the semantic role of predicates in terms of the truth conditions of sentences. The central question here is about the relationship between meaning and truth. Above I noted that Davidson's critical discussion of theories of truth in the first three chapters of the book seems puzzlingly to omit a plausible and widely held view: that the truth of sentences is to be explained in terms of the truth of propositions expressed by those sentences. With this rival view of truth comes a rival view of meaning: that the meanings of sentences are to be specified via a description of the propositions they express (relative to contexts) and not, as Davidson would have it, by a Tarskian truth theory meeting certain constraints. Here, at the end of the book, these omissions receive -- though not explicitly -- some justification. For, arguably, one who explains the truth conditions of sentences in terms of the truth conditions of propositions cannot endorse Davidson's Tarskian solution to the problem of predication.

The argument for this would run as follows. Suppose (for reductio) that the truth of sentences is to be explained in terms of the truth of propositions. Then the semantic contribution of any expression -- including at least whatever it contributes to the determination of the truth of sentences in which it figures -- must consist in what it contributes to the propositions expressed by such sentences. But, Davidson would argue, his discussion of the options here -- Platonic and Aristotelian universals, properties of any kind, unsaturated Fregean senses -- shows that no matter what we take predicates to contribute to the propositions expressed by sentences containing them, we will find the problem of predication intractable. So we must take the semantics of predicates to consist solely in their being true of objects under certain conditions, and not in their contribution of an entity of some sort to a proposition that is then true under certain conditions. In a sense, then, one central line of argument in Truth & Predication runs from the back of the book to the front: from the solution to the problem of predication to the elimination of the main rival to Davidson's view of truth and meaning.

It is, of course, possible to run the argument in the other direction. If one is convinced of the failure of the Davidsonian program in semantics, or is convinced that propositions are the primary bearers of truth, then one will think that there must be some other solution to the problem of predication. Davidson's discussion of this problem, while suggestive, does not succeed in showing that there is no such solution. What it does succeed in showing is that the constellation of views about meaning and truth that Davidson did so much to defend finds surprisingly powerful support in the problem of the unity of the proposition.

References

Davidson, Donald. 'Truth and Meaning', in: his Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1967/1984), pp. 17-36.

King, Jeffrey. 'Structured Propositions and Sentence Structure', Journal of Philosophical Logic, 25 (1996), pp. 495-521.

Soames, Scott. Understanding Truth, (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999).


[1] For a discussion, see Chapter 1 of Scott Soames, Understanding Truth, (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999).

[2] An unfortunate consequence is that some views of truth that are only plausible if the primary bearers of truth are propositions do not get a hearing. One example is the 'identity theory of truth' held for a time by Moore, on which a proposition is true iff it is identical with a fact. Another example is a kind of deflationary or minimalist view of truth, which takes the primary bearers of truth to be propositions. Whatever its merits or demerits, this view is not refuted by the arguments that Davidson brings to bear against deflationary theories of the truth of sentences in Chapter 1.

[3] See Donald Davidson, 'Truth and Meaning', in: his Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1967/1984).

[4] See, for example, the view of propositions presented in Jeffrey King, 'Structured Propositions and Sentence Structure', Journal of Philosophical Logic, 25 (1996).