2006.08.10

James K. A. Smith

Jacques Derrida: Live Theory

James K. A. Smith, Jacques Derrida: Live Theory, Continuum, 2005, 157pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826462812.

Reviewed by Samir Haddad, Northwestern University


Writing an introductory text focused on a difficult and prolific thinker is no easy task. It should be accessible yet accurate, comprehensive and at the same time entice the reader to read more on her own. James K. A. Smith's Jacques Derrida: Live Theory is extremely accessible -- it is very well-written in a clear and attractive prose, moving smoothly across many different topics at a good pace. The text is also hard to fault with respect to the range of these topics. With his target audience being the "engaged undergraduate" and "the fabled 'general reader'" (x), Smith must necessarily be selective, but his choice of themes offers a good representation of the main dimensions of Derrida's thought. Thus, in terms of its accessibility and comprehensiveness, the book performs well. Its main weakness, however, follows from the choice Smith makes in order to sell Derrida to his reader. Derrida is presented as a supremely ethical and political thinker, with ethics understood in a Levinasian sense -- an openness to the Other -- and politics never quite defined. As a consequence, Jacques Derrida: Live Theory is somewhat unsatisfying. Certainly, Smith takes the reader on an engaging and very lucid tour of Derrida's oeuvre. But somehow Derrida always ends up being ethically and politically right, and the standard for judging this seems beyond all question. What is wrong with such a picture is not just that, to my mind, it is an inaccurate representation of Derrida's work, but also that it is achieved by denying the reader access to some of the most challenging and interesting dimensions of this work, dimensions that precisely call into question accepted presuppositions concerning the meaning of ethics and politics. Jacques Derrida: Live Theory thus introduces its reader to a Derrida who is in the end rather tame and predictable, a result which, given the quality and appeal of Smith's writing, is a little disappointing.

The book contains five chapters. The first three traverse the length of Derrida's corpus, from his early writings on Husserl to his most recent work discussing ethical and political themes. Chapter 1 is the strongest. Here Smith focuses on Derrida's relationship to phenomenology, and presents detailed and illuminating readings of Derrida's Edmund Husserl's 'Origin of Geometry': An Introduction and Speech and Phenomena. This chapter closes with a discussion of some of the key points made in Of Grammatology concerning writing, violence, and the nature of the text. Chapter 2 turns to literature. Smith does not discuss Derrida's readings of literary works, a choice perhaps motivated by his general suspicion of Derrida's reception in literary theory. Instead, he outlines the ways in which some of Derrida's texts, in particular Glas and The Post Card, perform the contamination between philosophy and literature that he theorizes elsewhere. This chapter also has brief accounts of Derrida's claims concerning metaphor, the relationship between literature and politics, and reference and interpretation. Chapter 3 concludes the explication of Derrida's writings by examining his more recent statements regarding justice, hospitality, forgiveness, the decision, and the enlightenment. These are discussed through primary reference to Levinas and Kierkegaard. Having run through the oeuvre, in Chapter 4 Smith then offers very brief descriptions of Derrida's relationship to others not yet discussed -- Plato, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Freud -- and of his reception in American literary studies, German critical theory, analytic philosophy, and thinkers coming "after postmodernism." Many of the judgments Smith makes here would be more persuasive if they were given justification, but since he describes this chapter as "a kind of expanded, annotated bibliography" (15), this is perhaps to be expected. Finally, Chapter 5 is constituted by what is labeled an "interview" with Derrida. This, I take it, is a key element that distinguishes books in the "Live Theory" series from other introductory texts. It seems that Derrida's final illness prevented any such interview being conducted. In its place, Smith himself writes an interview using his own words and extensive citations from Derrida. I did not find this chapter compelling, and it was unclear to me how it achieves Smith's aim to "creatively deconstruct the axiomatics and ritual of the interview" (104). But this is a minor complaint, and it is hard to see what else Smith could have done given his situation.

The danger of discussing such a wide range of topics is a loss of continuity across the text, but Smith avoids this by taking alterity as the lens through which he views Derrida's writings. This is a good idea -- one of Derrida's most consistent strategies of reading was to highlight the interruption of difference and otherness within what is taken by others to be a stable identity. However, problems follow from Smith's interpretation of the meaning of alterity for Derrida. Fundamentally, Smith takes Derrida to be Levinasian, assuming that alterity in Derrida's work is of a primarily ethical significance. In addition, Smith seems to understand this alterity as being human. This latter point is never discussed at length, but it is implied in repeated references to intersubjectivity and community, and in more explicit statements such as the claim that Derrida's reading of Husserl's work "opens it up to the essential relationality of being-human" (30), and that "arché-writing is another way of naming the fundamental and primordial relationality, even communality which constitutes being human -- being in relation to others and obligated to others" (45). The guiding thread of Smith's presentation is thus based on an understanding of alterity in Derrida's writings that makes these writings ethical, where ethics is a question of inter-human relations.

This determination of the meaning of alterity for Derrida results in at least three problems with the text. First, Smith never explains why taking alterity into account is enough to make Derrida's writings ethical in the first place. Claiming a Levinasian heritage is not enough, for in Levinas this association needs explanation, especially in an introductory work. Further confusion arises in Smith's linking of politics to alterity in a similar manner, for example, when he claims that "deconstruction is an affirmative response to the call of the other, and thus is an inherently ethical and political vocation in response to the other" (13). No discussion of any difference that might be said to hold between ethics and politics is given, with the two often used interchangeably. It is thus assumed that a concern for the other is enough to make a philosophy ethical and political, but the plausibility or even sense of this assumption is far from apparent.

Second, this interpretation can only be sustained by ignoring many of Derrida's most interesting claims. Neither Derrida's writings on animality and technology, nor his explicit avoidance of and arguments against the term "community", are mentioned. These aspects of Derrida's work, among others, are enough to cast doubt on the belief that he is fundamentally concerned with theorizing what it is to be human and to live in a human community. Also, Smith makes no reference to the penetrating critique of Levinas that takes place in 'Violence and Metaphysics,' an essay he describes in passing as "perhaps Derrida's finest piece of work" (47). Given this critique, it is hard to accept, for example, that Speech and Phenomena is "a kind of Levinasian meditation on the originary relation to the Other" (30), or more broadly that "Derrida's most rigorous early works are governed by a certain (albeit submerged) Levinasian agenda" (76). Such claims ignore the fact that one of the most rigorous of these early works argues that Levinas too relies on a metaphysics of presence, just as do Husserl, Heidegger, Freud, Lévi-Strauss, Rousseau, and others. Further, Derrida charges that this occurs precisely in what Smith assumes he preserves from Levinas -- the latter's theorization of the relation to the Other. Taking this into account complicates the claim that deconstruction has a "fundamentally Levinasian orientation" (76).[1]

Third, Smith's understanding of alterity in Derrida's work produces some confusions in his account. In addition to equating it with "politics", the term "ethics" is also used synonymously with "the conditions of ethics," as when, for example, Smith writes that with "arché-writing" or "differance" "what's really at stake here is ethics, or better, the conditions of ethics -- the nature of intersubjective relations" (45). Which is it? Ethics or its conditions? The difference matters. Indeed, Smith immediately cites Derrida from Of Grammatology claiming that "Arché-writing is the origin of morality as of immorality. The nonethical opening of ethics. A violent opening." This citation shows that Derrida's analysis of arché-writing is an analysis of the conditions of ethics, which are themselves described as nonethical. And for this very reason this analysis is not itself inherently ethical. Relatedly, Smith's reading of Derrida as a theorist in favor of community is in tension with other claims made in the text, such as when he rightly asserts that "the view of writing as violence and contamination … produces a deeply anti-communal account of intersubjectivity which sees any relation to the other as always already violent" (40). This view of writing is surely Derrida's, as Smith acknowledges in stating that Derrida sees intersubjectivity as "always already violent" (41). But this would imply, contrary to Smith's overall presentation, that Derrida is a deeply anti-communal thinker.

My main worry regarding Jacques Derrida: Live Theory is thus that the choice to interpret Derrida as a primarily ethical thinker gives rise to distortions and confusions. How serious is this? Every interpretation must necessarily distort -- and the danger is no doubt amplified in an introductory text -- and the occasional confusion is hardly the worst of sins. I would argue, however, that the rhetoric with which the text is framed invites such a response. One reads in the Introduction that there exists a "Derrida-monster" and "Derrida myth" created, in the first instance, by the enlistment of "the terms of deconstruction and the name of Jacques Derrida for some of the most silly -- or conversely, most traditional and hegemonic -- cultural projects." Such uses of Derrida are proclaimed "mis-appropriations," as are "many academic appropriations of deconstruction" (1), and Smith suggests on several occasions that they result from a failure to actually read Derrida's work. This mythology established, Smith argues that it was then picked up by Derrida's critics, who portrayed deconstruction "as the enemy of truth, justice, and yes, the American way" (2). Against both Derrida's enemies and admirers, Smith's goal is thus "to 'demythologize' this pervasive myth of 'Derrida'… [it] is not to domesticate deconstruction or to eliminate its monstrosity, but rather to properly understand its monstrosity" (3). Smith seeks to reveal a more accurate Derrida, who would remain a monster, by doing what others do not -- by reading him.[2]

While I agree with Smith as to the importance of maintaining Derrida's monstrosity, the Derrida he presents, in my opinion, is not altogether accurate, and certainly not particularly monstrous. Such an eminently ethical and political thinker might threaten "those who would identify given configurations of law or given institutions as just" (67), or "the comfortable religiosity that secures middle class existence" (143), but in doing so he shows himself to be a tame creature indeed. Now Smith is not alone in his choice of emphasis -- it seems that in much of contemporary continental philosophy the highest accolade that can be accorded a thinker is to be proclaimed ethical or political (and it's better to be both). This being the rule, it is perhaps an effective way to promote someone's work. But is it the best way? Is it not yet another strategy of domestication, yet another avoidance of monstrosity? In Jacques Derrida: Live Theory Smith replaces one monster with another, but his beast has too little bite. Derrida is monstrous not only because he resists the easy ascriptions of "ethical" and "political," but also because in reading him one might be led to question the desire to provide them in the first place. Even engaged undergraduates and the fabled general reader stand to benefit from this lesson.


[1] Seeing deconstruction as fundamentally Levinasian is, of course, one well-established position among others in current Derrida scholarship, developed most influentially by Simon Critchley in his The Ethics of Deconstruction: Derrida and Levinas, Oxford: Blackwell, 1992. It is perhaps obvious that I do not share this position, but my criticism is not due just to a difference of opinion. Rather, my point is that Smith does not present any of those very forceful currents within Derrida's writings that at the very least might lead one to question this straightforward identification of Derrida with Levinas. For a very good recent essay that critiques Levinasian interpretations of Derrida's work, see Martin Hägglund, "The Necessity of Discrimination: Disjoining Derrida and Levinas", Diacritics, 34.1 (Spring 2004): 40-71.

[2] The running theme of mythology and monstrosity is, on the whole, a helpful one. However, it has one aspect that I find a little troubling. As just stated, Smith blames the myth on both Derrida's aggressive critics and his enthusiastic admirers. To the former, the reader is given at least some exposure, since the text contains discussions of the Cambridge and New York Review of Books controversies. Of the latter, virtually nothing illuminating is said, except that they are "assistant professors of English" (3-4, 99; they are promoted to "professors of English" on 65), have no schooling or interest in phenomenology (4, 99, 135), have "an apolitical aestheticism" in their hearts (65), and are "not willing to labour in difficult texts (or in French)" (99). Works are not cited, names are not named. Such a caricature is common in "philosophical" discussions of Derrida. But it is extremely regrettable. Why defend Derrida against his ill-informed critics by agreeing with their charge but merely locating it elsewhere? Why create yet another monster (the "assistant professor of English") using precisely the same means (a failure to read) and for precisely the same ends (self-legitimation) as those of the "Derrida-monster" that Smith rightly finds offensive?