2006.08.19

Eve Gaudet

Quine on Meaning: The Indeterminacy of Translation

Eve Gaudet, Quine on Meaning: The Indeterminacy of Translation, Continuum, 2006, 145pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826487203.

Reviewed by H.G. Callaway, University of Mainz


This is a short, generally clearly written book on a difficult, complex and much debated topic in analytic philosophy, and it is therefore deserving of some attention. It will be attractive to those who sympathize with Quine's distinctive semantic theses, centered on the claimed indeterminacy of transla­tion, and to those who view the questions in more technical and narrowly analytic terms. Still, there is a glimpse beyond the usual, technical treatments. Though "one may conclude that indeterminacy of translation has an interest that is limited to philosophical and scientific discussions," as Gaudet has it in her conclusion (p. 140), still, she stipulates that in accepting Quine's views "the ordinary conception of mind itself is importantly affected", since "saving the ordinary conceptions of meaning and of the mind requires that we postulate translation as determinate" (p. 142). Accepting Quine's physical­ism and behavior­ism, with the author, the indeterminacy follows, and this profoundly influences conceptions and norms of human nature -- a subject of broad human interest.

The book contains twelve chapters, prefaced by acknowledg­ments, and followed by a short index. It derives from the author's doctoral dissertation in philosophy at Washington University in St. Louis, and thanks are offered to committee members Robert B. Barrett, Joseph Ullian and Roger Gibson. The reader who is not inclined to review the large related literature on Quine's view of cognitive meaning and translation may also be attracted to this book for concise summaries and treatment of the Quinean view from St. Louis.

Chapter 1, the Introduction, sets out the issue to be addressed, and then proceeds with an overview of the remainder of the book. Gaudet aims to defend the Quinean orthodoxy, especially as developed by Gibson and Dagfinn Follesdal, and focuses the complex interre­lated issues through the lens of the claim that while, "the choice between empirically equivalent empirical theories is real, material," "there is no fact of the matter (reality) to the choice between empirically (behaviorally) equivalent translation manuals" (p. 5).

Chapters 2 through 6 interpret Quine on the claimed asymmetry of factuality between theory choice and translation choice, beginning in Chapters 2 and 3 with an interpre­tation of Quine on what is to count as "facts of the matter." Basically, facts are understood as physical facts of the currently best physics. In Chapters 4-6 the author offers an analysis of the indetermi­nacy of translation and its difference from underdetermination of theory by evidence. To say that there is no fact of the matter in deciding between behaviorally equivalent translations is to hold that no apparent alternative can be shown to better conform to the distribution of micro-physical states. Chapters 7 and 8 specifically address Noam Chomsky, "Chomsky's Misunderstanding," and Richard Rorty, "Rorty's Misunderstanding" on the same issue. Chapter 9 takes up the related views of Michael Friedman, "Friedman's Misunderstanding," and Chapter 10, "Follesdal and Gibson Get it Right," considers in some detail the views of Roger Gibson and Follesdal, including especially Follesdal's 1990 paper "Indeterminacy and Mental States," and criticisms of earlier views of Follesdal, where he disagreed with Gibson on the character of the indeterminacy thesis. Chapter 11 discusses and evaluates some critical perspectives arising from contemporary cognitive science -- what we might call "semantic (or intentional) realism." The final chapter states the conclusions.

There is a continuing strain of contention, running through the relevant literature, one not effectively avoided in the present book, between interpretation of Quine's thesis and evaluation of it. If we assume that the indeterminacy of translation (and meaning) simply is a matter of underdetermination by evidence (of our theory of what is meant), then this threatens to beg the question against Quine: nothing distinguishes the status of translation proposals from empirical theories or hypotheses; nothing affects translation beyond the "usual underde­ter­mination of theory by evidence;" there is nothing "additional." Still, stated as a conclusion of an argu­ment, this is one way to reject Quine's distinctive semantic theses. On the other hand, if it is emphasized that to understand Quine's thesis we must acknowledge that there is something "additional," an impor­tant difference between indeter­mi­nacy of meaning and underdetermination of theory by evidence, then this threatens to beg the question in Quine's favor, though it is also a way to state the conclusion of Quine's argu­ments.

It does not help a great deal that the author, trying to resolve related quandaries, repeatedly insists that we must under­stand the indeterminacy thesis as an ontological rather than an epistemological claim. For, if it is a matter of there being "no fact (or entity) of the matter," given a (specifically Quinean) naturalist, physicalist or empiri­cist-behaviorist concep­tion of what to count as facts, the opponent may still argue in the end that there are facts to the matter, otherwise conceived. In particular, in evalu­ating Chomsky's replies to Quine, it does not greatly help to be told that "Chomsky reads indeterminacy of translation as an epistemological claim" (p. 72), if we are left wondering about Chomsky's criticisms of Quine's episte­mology and methodology. Whatever the ontological character of Quine's thesis, the strain mentioned persists. The reader may wonder if there is suffi­cient focus on the evidence or argument for Quine's ontological claim.

In the present book, Quine's arguments are correctly viewed as immediately dependent on his behavior­ism. Quine's behaviorism is the implication of his version of empiricism, and the effect is much akin to verificationism in the theory of meaning or in empirical semantics. There is room to doubt the demo­tion, in which this book engages, of the role of physicalism in Quine's thinking about linguis­tic meaning, yet there is little room to doubt that Quine wants us to follow him from contem­po­rary philosophical commonplaces, as expressed in Wittgen­stein's private language argu­ment, to his sophisticated anti-realism about meanings ("beyond the level of stimulus meaning"). The rejection of meanings as entities is heavily enlisted in this book to explain indetermi­nacy (as an "ontological thesis") and the corresponding lack of "facts of the matter" regarding what it is to be right or wrong in translating. Yet Quine himself said that if we could establish meaning equivalencies on empirical grounds, then the needed enti­ties could simply be taken as equivalence classes -- say, equivalence classes of words, sentences, or thoughts. So, the problem is to establish meaning equivalences, or partial equivalences of some sort, on empiri­cal grounds. Quine’s view is that the identity conditions of meanings will be no worse off than the identity conditions of many other theoretical entities or postulates.

Formulating meanings so as to encompass the evidence of usage is the sort of thing that lexicographers do. Quine's thought experiments in radical translation make the empiri­cal character of the undertaking more vivid, since the linguist must engage with the native speakers and their environment, instead of merely collecting and collating written or spoken examples of usage. "Don't look to the meaning," Wittgenstein tells us; instead, "look to the use." Usage, in any case, must be the evidence of meaning. For, if we could not acquire an under­standing of a language on the basis of usage, there would be no way to acquire it at all. With this much we can perhaps all agree.

There are many reasons for "what we don't say" and "what we do say," which are relatively external to the meaning of the words employed, so that accounts of meaning must be somewhat theoretical and selective. Beyond that kind of point, which seems a clear upshot of many an elaborate criticism of ordinary-language philosophy, we take it for granted in intel­lectual life that an account of meaning differs significantly from a listing of the most relevant related usage. "Definers" are relatively rare and often prized for their work among the lexicog­raphers, even when they are difficult characters in the very mould of Dr. Johnson.

Can we believe, then, that there is nothing to meaning beyond usage -- understood in Quinean fashion as corre­la­tions between classes of utterances and sensory stimulation on occasion of utterance ("stimulus meaning")? The alterna­tive is to see meanings as theoretical postulates designed to explain and encompass evidence of usage; and taking this approach, one naturally avoids the reduction of the hypothesis to the evidence. We do not expect evidence to logically imply our theories or hypotheses; instead at best it is the other way around. Does this beg the question against Quine and his physicalistic behav­iorism? That depends on the acceptability of the results. However, to assume Quinean-behaviorist grounds as the only legitimate grounds for the acceptability of linguistic hypotheses will beg the question in favor of Quine.

Do we generally accept and rely upon our diction­aries, including bilingual translat­ing dictionaries, as summaries of reliable, well-supported results, or do we treat them, in Quinean fashion, as collections of arbitrary correlations of expressions, so that multiple combinatorial alternatives are assumed without hesitation -- on general theoretical and philosophical grounds -- to be equally valid, without need of specific contrary evidence? I submit that, lacking specific reasons to doubt particular results, we generally do accept the great dictionaries, except on the basis of a strongly Quinean-behaviorist proclivity regard­ing linguistic theory. They remain subject to correction, and development, on the basis of evidence of usage, but that goes without saying. We have yet to see the Quinean revolution among lexicographers.

Should we accept the dictionaries as authoritative-though-fallible? The question may plausi­bly bring us back to Quine's physicalism, as the background of his behaviorism; to the related general question of the autonomy of the special sciences and disciplines; and, strangely enough, to the question of whether we must treat each definition or explanation of meaning, outside Quine's favored vocabulary, in somewhat Hegelian style, as defective because it is partial and, unlike the envisaged Quinean (evolving) physicalistic totality of knowledge, not (to use the Hegelian term) its "own other:" The final truth would, then, have to be something which integrates directly into Quine's holistically conceived physicalistic system.

Quine's holism has long pointed critics toward doubts of this kind. Is the finite and somewhat detached part of knowledge or science already clearly defec­tive in light of the majesty of the envisaged (evolving) holistic-physicalistic system of knowledge? (Consider contemporary philosophical "anti-essentialism.") In contrast to this, the more general tendency is to accept the common-sense and scien­tific view that serious criticism of accepted results in any science or scholarly disci­pline requires, that we produce something specific -- new evidence and arguments -- rather than merely relying on general philoso­phical criticism. Turning the present book on its head, we may argue that if there is no physicalistic-behavioristic fact of the matter in translation to accommodate the accepted accounts of linguistic meaning, then so much the worse for the physicalistic-behav­ioristic account of factuality.

The present book perhaps most closely approaches this issue in the discussion of cognitive science and its claims to support an ontology of mental states (Chapter 11). Why can't we treat the postulation of mental states (perhaps of a kind involved in understanding a definition as contrasted with an alternative, co-extensional definition) as a legitimate and acceptable result of special sciences? (Think of Mendel's genes, postulated without a hint of a physical mechanism.) More generally, the mere fact that we have a diversity of special sciences and disciplines suggests the need of them. (Even suppos­ing that there is no genuine change in the phenomena of the special sciences without a physical change, the special sciences may still be relied on to tell us when such a change has occurred.) Not only do we in fact recognize and accept results of the special sciences and disciplines beyond physics (including chemistry, biology, psychology, sociology, history, philology, etc., etc.,) but we also do not always or exactly understand the relationships that obtain between the distinctive results of such fields of study -- relationships that often come to depend upon specific, and unforeseeable, empirical-theoretical devel­opments. The actual sciences and scholarly disciplines do not form a completely unified or integrated totality of knowledge. Nor do we know that they ever will.

Part of the value of the special sciences and disciplines is that they can proceed and develop without the need to integrate them into physics, and even if we have no idea of how such integration might possibly come about. But our author is skeptical of this empirical, contingent, and factual autonomy of the special sciences and disciplines:

The simple slogan "to be real is to be admitted by an accepted theory" is too liberal to justify the introduction of theoretical entities unless supplemented by other considerations. In addition to that slogan, a specifiable further consideration must be satisfied. Given an appropriately holistic view of science, an ontological commitment made by an admitted theory in a given field might well be rejected if it leads us in the direction of a less unified global conceptual scheme. (p. 108)

Now, we do not expect to find the Quineans saying, in so many words, that the physicalis­tic postulates of our unified "holistic view of science" represent the really real, while all other developments tempting us in the direction of "a less unified global conceptual scheme" are to be treated as so many doubtful supplicants before the imperial court of holisti­cally conceived physi­calism. Still, it does sound here, a bit, as if some postulates or commit­ments are more equal than others and that the lesser are to be regarded as doubtful, whatever their explanatory, predictive or organizing power within their own domain, simply for want of integration with Quine's physicalistic and mathe­matical ontology. While the discovery of underlying physical (or chemical, or biologi­cal, psychological, etc.) mechanisms of a given phenomenon may be enlightening, and the search is not to be discouraged, that is quite different from holding that a physicalistic theory is always and everywhere to be preferred, regardless of the degree of success to be found among theories formulated in the distinctive vocabulary (and ontology) of specialized fields of inquiry.

This reader senses that the quasi-positivistic owl of Quine's physical­istic-behavioristic reduction of meaning to stimulus meaning always flies at dusk -- after the semantic work of science has established new concepts and meanings along with new theories. Similarly, Quine's totalizing and holistic physicalistic system is found to sleep eternally, remaining, so far as we know, ever incomplete. Again, we may mystify instead of clarify the concept of meaning by exclusively seeking an integrative, physicalistic paraphrase, consis­tent with contemporary physics, of statements we seek to understand.

The present book, in view of its clarity and conciseness, and its assembly of relevant quota­tions, may contribute to the contempo­rary evaluation of Quine's philosophy, his physi­calism, and his behavioristic view of meaning and translation. That could be a signifi­cant contribution. But contrary to this book, America's high, Cold-War era, holistic physicalism arguably stands in need of a therapy conceived in light of the intellectual standing of the humble pluralism of the sciences, and that would obviate the temptation to think, in the para­doxical words of the cover description of the book that "there is no objective answer to the question of what someone means by any given sentence."