2006.08.20

Raymond W. Gibbs, Jr.

Embodiment and Cognitive Science

Raymond W. Gibbs, Jr., Embodiment and Cognitive Science, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 337pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521010497.

Reviewed by Robert D. Rupert, University of Colorado, Boulder


In Embodiment and Cognitive Science (ECS), Raymond Gibbs, Jr., surveys the wide range of experimental and theoretical results that he takes to support the embodied view of cognition. The embodied view holds that the particular forms and patterns of physical activity in cognitive systems (e.g., human organisms) shape central aspects of those systems' cognitive profiles; and on Gibbs's version of the embodied approach, the subject's conscious experience of her own physical activities plays an especially important role in structuring her cognitive processing. The scope of ECS is impressive. Gibbs includes chapters or substantial sections addressing many of the most important areas of study in cognitive science: perception, concepts, language-use, cognitive development, consciousness, and more. Gibbs thus provides a valuable, up-to-date resource for advanced students and professional academics; even those readers actively engaged in research under the embodied rubric will likely find stimulating reports of work outside their own specialized areas. As a survey of a broad field -- and also insofar as Gibbs intends to generate enthusiasm for the embodied program -- ECS succeeds marvelously.

The purpose of ECS, however, is not merely to review a body of connected results or to motivate future research; rather, Gibbs offers ECS as an extended argument in support of the embodied approach. Gibbs intends to claim for the embodied perspective its "rightful place" (p. 276) of prominence in cognitive science, according to which no disembodied view of a phenomenon should be accepted unless efforts to formulate a specifically embodied theory of that phenomenon have failed (ibid.). In this regard, I think ECS meets with less success. Partly because of the scope and variety of the work surveyed, the reader encounters what is, on balance, a diffuse argument for a vaguely put position. Gibbs holds that orthodox cognitive science has, to its great detriment, ignored embodiment (p. 3) and that the shift to an embodied perspective carries sweeping ramifications concerning our general understanding of the mind. To make an effective case for such claims, Gibbs must show that there is a definite view, the embodied view, that has novel substance and clearly wins out over competing views in the field (cf. Vera and Simon, 1993, Newell and Simon, 1976/1997, p. 95), at least in a significant range of cases. Instead, Gibbs frequently presents experimental results in support of an embodied view without making clear (1) precisely what conclusion the results are meant to support, (2) the logic of said support, (3) the contrast with a genuinely held view (not a straw man) that makes conflicting predictions, and (4) how advocates of the embodied thesis handle obvious or extant criticisms. Thus, while ECS convinced me that the embodied perspective, understood broadly, has produced many provocative experimental results, I rarely got the sense that weighty evidence was being presented on the side of a well-delimited and innovative view of cognition.

Embodiment and Cognitive Science also includes too little discussion of theoretical issues, and this exacerbates the problems described above. Granted, the sweeping scope of Gibbs's project precludes lengthy discussion of detailed views of the nature of, e.g., representation, computation, or consciousness. Yet, the theoretical stakes are so high and many of Gibbs's comparative claims so pointed, that Gibbs owes the reader fairly precise working conceptions of the orthodox views that he thinks the embodied approach should displace. For instance, Gibbs frequently takes as his target the view that mental representations are disembodied and abstract. His arguments are, to my mind, very hard to evaluate, though; for Gibbs does not clearly characterize the fundamental theoretical conceptions in play.

Consider first the issue of representation. Talk about representations permeates ECS; I marked approximately fifty locations in the text where representations took center stage, and I doubt that my count is exhaustive. Thus, it is fair to expect some explicit characterization of what it is for one thing to represent another. Moreover, insofar as ECS runs against the mainstream, sometimes flirting with anti-representationalist views (e.g., pp. 72-73, 282), the notion of representation taken to task should be widely held and influential. Instead, the reader finds little in the way of theoretical characterization, and what is offered seems off the mark:

Many cognitive scientists embrace this idea [that human bodies are separate from the external world] by assuming that individuals learn to know the world by re-presenting it to their minds (p. 16; also see p. 29, for the assumption that traditional theorists are concerned with a system's "presenting the world to the mind").

Orthodox views in cognitive science do not claim or presuppose that representational structures present anything to a mind: the gist of the mainstream proposal is that, speaking broadly, thought processes are computations over representations, where computation is characterized in terms of the transitions among various abstractly characterized states, not as something any separate agent does. Similarly, representations play a certain functional role in causing behavior and bear some privileged relation to the entities they represent (which need not be beyond the boundary of the organism). The idea that representations present something to a separate agent or mind plays no important role in the models or theoretical discourse of leading orthodox cognitive scientists (e.g., Marr, Newell, Simon, Chomsky, Fodor, J. R. Anderson).

Gibbs's view about the content of representations also suggests that he has not tapped the mainstream he means to attack. Gibbs complains that traditional views largely ignore the 'symbol grounding problem' (p. 159). Theoreticians working within a traditional framework have decidedly not ignored the problem of how representations, linguistic or mental, are grounded; there is an enormous body of literature on just this issue (Stampe, 1977, Fodor 1987, 1990, Gallistel, 1990, Dretske, 1981, 1988, Millikan, 1984, Papineau, 1984, Cummins, 1996, Prinz, 2002, Rupert, 1998, 1999). We face an embarrassment of riches, so far as I can tell, but Gibbs cites none of this literature.

Gibbs's discussion of the "traditional view of concepts" (pp. 80ff) brings ECS closer to mainstream discussions of mental representation. Even here, though, Gibbs attacks the program without making a convincing case that the aspects of the program under attack are central to the view being criticized. The traditional view of concepts -- most often the target is prototype theory, in particular -- takes concepts to be composed of (or in some other important way related to) structured sets of feature-representations (see Smith and Medin, 1981, for the classic review). Gibbs argues against this view on the basis of its commitment to amodal, context-independent, language-independent representations that refer to objective properties in the world. I found these arguments provocative but unconvincing, largely because Gibbs did not explain why the prototype view is committed to representations with the various features Gibbs finds objectionable, why those features are in fact objectionable, or why prototype theory predicts results at odds with the experimental work Gibbs describes.

For example, I wonder why the prototype view of concepts should be committed to amodal representations. Gibbs holds that a mental representation's being amodal amounts to its not being directly tied, historically or physiologically, to the operation of a particular sensory apparatus. Presumably, though, prototype theorists believe that concepts and feature-representations take physical form somewhere in the human body. Why not in a part of the cortex associated with a particular sensory system? And why couldn't the physical realizer of a feature-representation have originally taken shape through the operation of that sensory system? (For that matter it is not clear why prototype theory holds that there must be a single representing unit for each feature or concept; nothing in the standard view of representation requires that each cognitive system have no more than one representation of a given property.) Prototype theory demands that a given feature-representing unit in fact represent what it is supposed to and play the appropriate role in processing. Beyond those entailments, however, prototype theory makes no commitment regarding the particular physiological location of the representing unit or regarding the historical genesis of the feature-representing unit; neither does the prototype theory proscribe associative links (or belief-based links) to motor or sensory processes.

Here, as in Gibbs's discussion of context-dependence and the objectivity of what is represented, the failure to provide a suitable theoretical account of representation confounds the critical discussion of traditional views of concepts; so does the omission of any account of the standard architectures employed by orthodox cognitive scientists. Gibbs should have offered at least a brief and even-handed account of what representation is, on the orthodox view, what it is for an atomic unit to represent a feature, which features of the world are independently available to be represented, how the representing units combine to give a concept a definite representational value, how the manner of the combination -- together with subjects' standing beliefs -- might give rise to behavior, and how the cognitive architecture influences these processes. Orthodox models are almost certain to account for context-dependent behavior -- say, the listing on different occasions of different features as being central to a concept (p. 84) -- by appealing to the ways in which the factors I have listed interact in keeping with the basic operations available, their speed of operation, and other features of the system's architecture. Absent discussion of these various factors, the reader has no idea whether an orthodox view handles the experimental work more effectively than, less effectively than, or just as well as an embodied view.

Now consider the notion of an abstract representation. Sometimes a representation's being abstract is part and parcel of what Gibbs takes to be the traditional, misguided view, which he contrasts with the embodied view (pp. 142, 143, 151, 158, 165, 174, 205, 207). Other times, however, abstract representations appear as part of Gibbs's positive, embodied view -- either as data to be explained by an embodied view or as part of an embodied account of cognition (pp. 88, 96, 139, 141, 154, 162, 164-65, 195, 230, 238, 277). Granted, 'abstract' may not be used in a single sense throughout all of these passages, but it is very hard systematically to sort this out; and besides, it should not be left to the reader to do the sorting. In some cases (e.g., pp. 195, 165), Gibbs's endorsement of abstract representation can easily be read as an endorsement of the representation of abstract properties: on this view, embodied structures represent abstract properties -- topographical properties, for instance -- although the representing units themselves need not be abstract. Such a view does not conflict with the many cases where Gibbs speaks against abstract representations, so long as one is willing to understand the latter talk as being about the representations themselves -- i.e., about the nature of the units doing the representing as opposed to the nature of what is so represented. This makes sense of one especially strange case (p. 165) where Gibbs seems to be endorsing and criticizing abstract representations in the same paragraph; there we might best interpret him as endorsing the representation of abstract properties and as taking a stand concerning which abstract properties are represented. Frequently, however, Gibbs's endorsement of abstract mental representations comes amid discussion of psychological particulars, not of their content. Image schemas, for example, play a fundamental role in Gibbs's embodied view (over thirty entries in the index, spanning the central chapters), and he often describes the image schemas themselves -- i.e., the enduring mental representations -- as abstract:

Image schemas are presumably more abstract than ordinary images and consist of dynamic spatial patterns that underlie the spatial relations and movement found in actual concrete images. (p. 139)

I cannot square this with Gibbs's repeated, antagonistic remarks about abstract representations (qua their abstract-ness); if the embodied view needs abstract representations (i.e., as representing units), he should not be railing against abstract representations as they are employed in orthodox models.

In the end, if our goal is to measure the novelty of the embodied view, then on neither meaning of 'abstract' does the embodied view contrast substantially with the orthodox view. Take the first measure, the abstractness of what is represented. It should be clear from what was said above that both the orthodox and embodied views embrace equally the representation of abstract content or abstract properties -- although they might differ in respect of which ones are represented. Similarly, for the second measure: concerning the representing units themselves, both programs embrace abstraction in one sense and reject it in another. On both views, representations are repeatable units: "Mental images are traditionally viewed as temporary representations, whereas image schemas are permanent properties of embodied experience" (p. 139, and see also pp. 197, 238, 167). There are repeatable units on the embodied view, and thus abstract types (which there are on the orthodox view as well). I also take it that, on both views, no representing unit is entirely abstract, at least if it is to play a causal-explanatory role in psychology. The standard materialist line in orthodox cognitive science (see, e.g., Fodor, 1974, Newell and Simon, 1976/1997) holds that representations take some physical form or other on each occasion of their instantiation (or realization). Gibbs also emphasizes the physical form that mental representations take. So, in this sense, both kinds of theorist hold that mental representations are not abstract, since causes of particular actions, e.g., token mental representations are concrete, physical, and embodied.

Gibbs also expresses generally anti-computationalist views (pp. 9, 16, 276), a position I had trouble sorting out. First, note that Gibbs feels free to appeal to computational models when he takes them to support the embodied view (p. 147). Second, consider Gibbs's appeal to the transformation of image schemas (pp. 139, 141, 223). The use and transformation of image schemas is fundamental to the embodied story that Gibbs promotes, yet he offers only a sketchy and intuitive account of what these transformations amount to. Furthermore, when, on the basis of Gibbs's intuitive descriptions, I tried to figure out how the transformations might proceed, computational models naturally came to mind. Without some detailed theory of these transformations -- together with a plausibly mainstream account of computation -- there is no way to tell whether Gibbs's view is genuinely noncomputationalist or whether the transformation of image schemas is simply computation under a new name.

Similar problems arise in connection with Gibbs's pejorative uses of 'disembodied' (pp. 9, 12, 81, 84, 86, 111, 121, 142, 157, 159, 276). Early in the book, then again in closing, Gibbs states his "embodiment premise" (pp. 9, 276). (Although the embodiment premise is an amalgam of claims, it is the closest Gibbs comes to stating concisely the overarching position ECS is meant to support.) The embodiment premise includes the claim that

[w]e must not assume cognition to be purely internal, symbolic, computational, and disembodied, but seek out the gross and detailed ways that language and thought are inextricably shaped by embodied action. (pp. 9, 276)

Gibbs has in mind a stark contrast between the embodied program and orthodox, rules-and-representations-based cognitive science. To make good on this claim, Gibbs should offer a clear sense in which embodiment is inimical to orthodox cognitive science. I had trouble identifying the real nature of this contrast, though, for the following reasons.

First, notice that many of the points made above in connection with prototype theory apply more generally to orthodox cognitive science. Orthodox cognitive scientists accept that rules and representations are physically realized, and orthodox views are consistent with many ways of filling in the details regarding the form, location, and history of the realizer-states; furthermore, the claim of multiple realization (standard fare in philosophy of cognitive science -- see, e.g., Fodor, 1974) allows for much flexibility in this regard.

Second, notice that some of the explicit claims Gibbs makes about embodiment and orthodox cognitive science simply do not jibe with the facts. For example, when Gibbs criticizes orthodox, disembodied theories of modularity, he claims,

Of course, it is not surprising that modularity scholars miss embodied regularities in cognitive performance, because they never look for mind-body correspondences in their empirical and theoretical endeavors. (p. 280)

This kind of claim alienates those who have not yet converted to the embodied view, and perpetuates misimpressions among those who have. David Marr is one of the founding modularity theorists, perhaps the first to employ the idea in building a specific (and highly influential) orthodox model of a cognitive process (vision). Marr emphasizes the importance of the implementation-level (Marr, 1982, pp. 24-27) and, perhaps more importantly, goes out of his way to explain how his fundamental theoretical construct -- the detection of zero-crossings -- could be implemented by on-center and off-center retinal and geniculate cells (ibid., 64-66); clearly he looked for and found "mind-body correspondences in… [his] empirical and theoretical endeavors."

Modularity theorists aside, connections between bodily substance and cognitive processing have loomed large in the work of many other prominent cognitive scientists. John Anderson's research program has for some time been keyed to concerns about neural implementation of the ACT-R architecture (see Anderson et al., 2004 for summary and references). William Calvin and Derek Bickerton (2000) also look for quite a bit of orthodox cognitive scientific enlightenment (regarding syntax, for example) in facts about neural, bodily, and social context.

More generally, computationalists and modularity theorists make it clear that the elements of their favored cognitive architecture take physical form (Newell and Simon 1976/1997, Fodor, 1974) and, what is more, that these elements are substantially affected in important ways by physical development (Pylyshyn, 1984, p. 259; 1989, p. 61; Rupert, 1998, 2001). This should come as no surprise given that (a) all going models of cognition are abstract -- whether they be computational, dynamical, connectionist, or image-schema-based -- and that (b) no abstract model explains any particular human behavior (thus any data collected) unless it is instantiated or realized -- i.e., unless its abstractly described states take physical form at the time of their causal influence. Gibbs should also consider the possibility that knowledge of human embodiment motivates many of the choices made by orthodox cognitive scientists, including choices concerning how to analyze the tasks at issue and choices of which models not to consider. As models of human cognition, those that are patently inconsistent with our physical capacities -- including our sensory capacities -- simply get thrown out in the initial stages.

As Gibbs sometimes develops the embodied view, I think it has the potential to be genuinely innovative. Nevertheless, I did not find Gibbs's empirical arguments for the view convincing. He repeatedly claims, upon summarizing some experimental results, that a disembodied approach conflicts with those results but that, in contrast, the embodied view predicts them. In many of these cases, though, it was immediately apparent to me how one might formulate a rules-and-representations-based model of the data in question. In what follows I discuss a case of special import, where the empirical work is meant to show that cognition proceeds by perceptual simulation -- a kind of embodied processing seemingly inimical to orthodox views. Here Gibbs appeals to results of Solomon and Barsalou (2001), describing them thusly:

One participant, for example, first verified the concept-property pair "PONY-mane," and later either "HORSE-mane" or "LION-mane." If people perceptually simulate the concept to verify the property, then they should be faster to verify the "HORSE-mane" sequence than the "LION-mane" sequence, because horse manes are more similar to pony manes than are lion manes. This is exactly what happened… . These findings demonstrate how people performing verification tasks perceptually simulate a concept, and do not simply activate its abstract features. (p. 88)

Consider an alternative explanation that, it seems to me, should jump to the mind of anyone familiar with orthodox, computational cognitive science. The concept "PONY" has a stronger semantic association to the concept "HORSE" than does the concept "LION". Thus, the experimental results have nothing to do with manes, their shapes, or perceptual simulations of them. Given the facts about semantic associations alone, one would expect the sort of priming effect produced in the experiment. Of course subjects verify "HORSE-mane" more quickly than they verify "LION-mane"; what one verifies is a function of an activation threshold, which is reached more quickly in the former case as a result of the priming effects of PONY on HORSE and, indirectly, on all of the feature-representations that are constituents of HORSE (or are part of the knowledge-structure associated with HORSE). This is not ad hoc; a pony is a kind of horse, and spreading activation through categorical hierarchies, as a source of priming, is a staple of orthodox models. Furthermore, if HORSE is either constituted by or closely semantically associated with a set of feature-representations, then those feature-representations will be primed accordingly by any stimulus that primes HORSE. (An alternative orthodox approach might appeal to shared micro-featural-representations of the manes' shapes and to the priming effects that result. Assume that the concepts PONY, HORSE, and LION are partly constituted by, or closely semantically linked to, representations of the particular shapes of the various manes in question. This does not require perceptual simulation or modality-specific representations. Representations of the specific mane-shapes might then play a priming role in accordance with a measure of geometrical similarity, itself a function of the extent to which the various mane-representations associated with different concepts overlap in their constituent geometrical sub-features.)[1]

In some cases, a problem of this kind arises because Gibbs explicitly takes a straw position as foil. For example, in introducing his review of the literature on change and inattentional blindness, Gibbs says, "One implication of sensorimotor contingency theory is that people should not generally be aware of all aspects of the environment before them" (p. 66). My initial reaction is to ask, "What theory holds otherwise?" Does David Marr (1982) or Stephen Palmer (1999) claim that people should generally be visually aware of all aspects of the environment before them? I would like to see that spelled out, with references and a convincing argument. So far as I can tell, standard computational models allow information from the immediate environment to be lost in visual processing: the Gaussian filters of Marr's theory sample at different grains (op. cit., pp. 56-61, 68-71); if a bit of information at one grain does not correspond to what is yielded by the application of the filter with a different sampling grain, that information is lost -- even if it is veridical. Also, there is no reason why a full-scale model, even if it were created, would have to persist for very long. If the models are fleeting, then it is no wonder we sometimes do not notice changes in the environment.

Furthermore, to tie in this worry to one of my opening remarks -- point (2), in particular -- Gibbs does not explain why the sensorimotor view makes the prediction he attributes to it. Let us say that perception is simply a matter of skillful interaction with the world (Noë, 2004). It is not implausible that, generally speaking, people are highly skilled at the visual reidentification of others over short intervals of time. So, why is it a prediction of the sensorimotor view that many subjects, when asked for directions, fail to reidentify, after brief occlusion, the person asking for directions? Why shouldn't we expect the subjects' cognitive routines to yield a negative answer ("that's not the same person") when, after brief occlusion, the subjects apply their ability to reidentify others? A skill-based view, applied in advance of the experimental work, would likely make a false prediction: humans are highly skilled at re-identifying other humans, so nearly all subjects should notice the substitution of one person for another. Thus, so far as I can tell, the research in question neither provides support for the embodied view nor evidence against the leading competitors. Neither view predicts the results in question; both views can accommodate them post hoc.

I turn now to an issue of special interest to philosophers, the role of conscious experience in cognitive science. The embodiment premise begins with the claim, "People's subjective, felt experiences of their bodies in action provide part of the fundamental grounding for language and thought" (pp. 9, 276) (and it is clear from Gibbs's later description of subjective experience -- at p. 40 -- that he has in mind the standard philosophical conception of qualia as intrinsic, qualitative characteristics of experience). Among the studies Gibbs surveys, though, I had a hard time finding many that clearly diagnosed the role of subjective experience. For instance, the fact that certain stimuli cause certain priming effects has nothing particularly to do with subjective experience. In priming experiments, subjects react very quickly and the priming relations being probed seem hidden from subjects' conscious experience. To be fair, Gibbs distinguishes "levels" of embodiment: the phenomenal, cognitive but unconscious, and neural levels (p. 40), and perhaps Gibbs thinks that some of the experimental results pertain to one level of embodiment without being relevant to another. If so, though, Gibbs should inform the reader on a case-by-case basis which level of embodiment is at issue in the discussion of each set of experimental results and why that set speaks in favor of embodiment at that level. Furthermore, to make good on Gibbs's phenomenological claim, he must show how the results pertaining to the conscious level take priority over those pertaining to the cognitive level.

Sometimes, though, Gibbs focuses specifically on phenomenal experience when doing so seems out of place. In a paragraph on conscious experience, Gibbs claims, "Infants come to realize that different parts of their bodies are capable of specific movement" (p. 28). This is reasonably plausible if what is meant is that the infant becomes cognitively sensitive to certain contingencies -- perhaps mental structures come to represent these contingencies. What reason, though, is there to think that the baby has phenomenal consciousness of any of this? Furthermore, what reason is there to think that phenomenal consciousness of self somehow drives or takes priority over the cognitive representation of self? Similar concerns apply to Gibbs's discussion of the infant's developing understanding of causality and agency (pp. 222, 224); Gibbs explicitly claims a phenomenological interpretation of data that can naturally be interpreted as evidence of subconscious cognitive processes.

One might worry that developmental psychology presents a special problem in this regard, so consider a second kind of example. After an extended discussion of the way patterns of bodily movement or perception can form the basis (in some underspecified way) of other concepts, Gibbs states,

Most generally, this examination of metaphor and linguistic action reveals how people use their intuitive phenomenological sense of their bodies to make sense of, and structure, more abstract conceptual domains. (p. 104)

Now, I found fascinating much of what Gibbs says prior to this passage, but what made it fascinating to me are the surprising ways in which we extend our representations of the properties of physical structures (including the human body) to talk about other, not especially physical domains. These results surprised me because I had not previously been consciously aware of these relations. Furthermore, I will never be -- and quite likely could not be -- consciously aware of many of the processes of most interest to Gibbs, the processes that in fact initially extended the conceptual structures in question from one domain to the next or by which I first made that extension. So far as I know, the initial generation of, e.g., the phrase "she jumped down his throat" proceeded by some fast, subconscious process of metaphorical extension, which the subject in question was not, and probably could not have been (nomologically speaking), aware of. At the very least, one should expect Gibbs to offer some kind of argument showing that the phenomenal, as opposed to the cognitive-level, processes were operative in the development of the various conceptual structures that serve as the foci of his discussion. (Cf. 166, where Gibbs makes a claim about fundamental grounding that has nothing to do with phenomenology and again would seem to involve a process that is largely inaccessible to consciousness.) Admittedly, a couple of experiments (out of the scores Gibbs discusses) are designed specifically to probe the phenomenological component; but even here it does not seem very hard to generate a plausible explanation of the data that makes no special reference to the subjects' phenomenological experiences (see, e.g., 175-76). Moreover, Gibbs sometimes presents data that explicitly conflict with the view that cognition is fundamentally grounded in conscious experience (p. 190; and cf. p. 220, where Gibbs offers an approving description of image schemas as "not usually conscious").

Part of the problem is that, although Gibbs asserts the interdependence of the levels of embodiment, he offers no clear framework relating the levels, one that would allow us to make a prediction about what obtains at one level based on our knowledge of what has occurred at another. In particular, Gibbs offers no clear idea how phenomenological experiences could be fundamental to the sorts of fast, subconscious cognitive processes that are at work in most of the studies ECS describes. The closest Gibbs comes to offering an account of how the phenomenological level might be fundamental comes in the course of his discussions of dynamical systems theory. Here Gibbs endorses a kind of top-down causation (pp. 137, 271), and he might deploy such a view in support of his priority claim. Top-down causation in a deterministic dynamical system is, however, mysterious, and what little Gibbs says about it does nothing to dispel the mystery. Simply asserting that global dynamics constrain the local causal processes is not helpful. In a deterministic dynamical system, the local interactions account for everything else in the system, including the higher-level patterns that emerge; this is part of their beauty from a mathematical perspective. But, if all states of the system at a given time are determined by local values at that time and if the local values are determined by local rules, then there has to be some very special sense in which global states causally affect local dynamics. Gibbs does not explain that sense. Granted, he cannot be expected to explain everything, but if top-down causation in a dynamical system is the foundation of his priority claim for phenomenal consciousness, this is one he should have explained -- especially given its contentious status. Admittedly, Gibbs's embodiment premise says only that part of cognition is fundamentally grounded in subjective experience of embodiment, but by the end of the book I was left wondering which part, and how so.

Of special interest to many philosophers of mind will be Gibbs's claim to have made headway on the explanatory gap (pp. 263, 270, 272). Gibbs means to take the hard problem of consciousness seriously, directly quoting Chalmers's claim that "[t]he facts about consciousness do not just fall out of facts about the structure and firing of neural processes" (Gibbs, 263). Gibbs goes on to assert a structural match between certain aspects of dynamical systems and certain aspects of conscious experience. But if explanation requires a priori deduction, as Chalmers holds, Gibbs has made no headway on the explanatory gap. My conscious states might have temporal dynamics, but Gibbs offers no reason to think that the qualitative feel of temporally extended conscious experience (i.e., the what-it-is-like to have temporally extended conscious experiences) can be derived from the dynamics of a physical system.

To this point I have not addressed Gibbs's apparent endorsement of what is referred to alternatively as the 'extended', 'trans-cranial', or 'distributed' nature of cognition and mind (Adams and Aizawa, 2001, Hutchins, 1995, Clark and Chalmers, 1998, Rupert 2004 -- and for other labels, see Wilson, 2004, Hurley, 1998, Rowlands, 1999). Gibbs avoids this sort of talk; instead, as part of the embodiment premise, he asserts, "Cognition is what occurs when the body engages the physical, cultural world and must be studied in terms of the dynamical interactions between people and the environment" (pp. 9, 276), and throughout the remainder of the book, he lumps together "brain, body, and world" (pp. 24, 41, 49, 272, 282, with varied inflections) and "brain, body, and environment" (pp. 25, 53, likewise) as the important system of study. At one point, Gibbs offers some standard considerations in support of the extended view of the cognitive system (pp. 152-154). His discussion is not persuasive, though, partly because he does not engage with extant criticisms of these arguments (Segal, 1997, Adams and Aizawa, 2001, Grush, 2003, Rupert, 2004).

Gibbs emphasizes the importance of the brain-body-world system in two kinds of context: (a) after presenting research that involves subjects in some kind of interaction with the world and (b) upon discussing dynamical-systems-based approaches to the study of cognition. In cases of type (a), the results can just as easily be modeled in terms of organisms' cognitive capacities to interact with the environment. There is nothing surprising about the emphasis on such interaction. Orthodox cognitive science has always attended to the agent's relation to the external world, at least to some degree: analysis of the task environment and the ways in which an agent could feasibly interact with aspects of that environment constrain the models developed to explain the cognitive abilities exercised in that environment. Gibbs seems impressed by what I have elsewhere called an argument from 'epistemological dependence' (see pp. 9, 49, 225, 276 for Gibbs's endorsement of this reasoning; see Rupert, 2004, pp. 395-97, for critical discussion): we must attend to the environment in order to understand cognition, and thus the environment is part of the cognitive system. Regardless of the merits of such arguments, my primary point is the lack of innovation about Gibbs's suggestion: no one thinks we can understand cognition without paying attention to the environment in which cognitive tasks are carried out; but of course the amount of emphasis on environmental interaction varies depending on the task in question (more emphasis in the case of Shakey the Robot's block-moving task, less emphasis in the case of Deep Blue's chess-playing ability).

Is there something special, though, about cases of type (b), those involving dynamical-systems-based models? I do not see any revolution lurking here, especially if one is interested in the interface between organism and environment. Very few of the experiments Gibbs reports apply a dynamical-systems-based approach to cognitive phenomena. Furthermore, the dynamical-systems-based research program has been up and running for some time now (at least fifteen years), and thus we should be struck by its failure to produce parade models of cognitive abilities. Third, insofar as the dynamical-systems-based approach has had modest success in explaining cognitive skills, the models in question appear to recreate a standard kind of interface between the agent and the world beyond the boundary of the agent, e.g., interaction via the stimulation of "sensory" nodes (as one sees in Beer, 2003, and Schöner and Thelen, 2006).

In the end, I think research done under the heading of the embodied approach has much to offer more traditional theorists; it pushes cognitive scientists toward considerations that will enhance the traditional program, encouraging its practitioners to build more realistic models (albeit using the standard tools of representation and computation). Time-scales will be smaller. Representations might be sparser in visual processing but more numerous in our conceptual representations (in order to account for the context-dependence of some behavior). Realizations of cognitive states might appear somewhere other than in the brain, or they might appear in different parts of the brain than some theorists would have expected. The pursuit of such a program might yield a clearer picture of how the physical states realizing mental representations come to have that status. This does not, however, appear to me to constitute a paradigm shift in cognitive science, only incremental improvement on the standard approach. From this philosopher's standpoint, anyway, our understanding of the fundamental nature of human cognition remains the same even if much of what Gibbs says is correct. Then again, from the standpoint of working cognitive scientists, substantial change in the details of our best models might suffice for a scientific revolution -- or at least a significant shift in party-power.

Works cited

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[1] Note that I am addressing Soloman and Barsalou's results as Gibbs presents them. His presentation is misleading, however, in its description of both the procedure used and the main conclusion drawn. In Solomon and Barsalou's experiments, the context-stimuli (e.g., HORSE-mane and LION-mane) were varied and there was a single critical stimulus (e.g., PONY-mane) relative to each set of varied context-stimuli. Furthermore, Solomon and Barsalou explicitly distance themselves from the conclusion Gibbs draws: "In this article, our focus in not on whether knowledge is represented in classic amodal theories, perceptual symbol systems, or distributed representational systems. Instead, we focus on the more general issue of whether properties are represented globally or locally, regardless of their representational format" (Solomon and Barsalou, 2001, pp. 133-34).

All the same, orthodox possibilities along the lines of those discussed in the text would seem to undermine the strong conclusion Gibbs draws (and that, to be fair, Solomon and Barsalou suggest in closing), even when the details of the experiments are straightened out. Furthermore, these orthodox possibilities -- especially the second -- would also seem to undercut the strong localist conclusion that Solomon and Barsalou draw from their experimental results. Assume there is a single global concept, MANE, and that included as part of the knowledge-structures associated with LION and PONY are the beliefs (or belief-like states) "lions have manes" and "ponies have manes." Assume also that these knowledge-structures include the beliefs "lions' manes look like this" and "ponies' manes look like this," where in place of 'this', there is, in each case, a distinctive construction from global representations of geometrical subfeatures -- Biederman's geons, for example (Biederman, 1990). On such a view, a LION-mane judgment provides some facilitation of the PONY-mane judgment, by priming MANE. The LION-mane judgment will, however, also inhibit the PONY-mane judgment, because the particular form of a lion's mane is inconsistent with the form (as specified by global representations of geometrical subfeatures) of a pony's mane. It is no surprise, then, that the opposing contributions of the LION-mane judgment have, on balance, no significant priming effect on the PONY-mane judgment.