Julian Young


Julian Young, Schopenhauer, Routledge, 2005, 271 pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-415-33347-4

Reviewed by William R. Schroeder, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign

Julian Young has written an accessible, thoughtful, penetrating critical introduction to Schopenhauer that elucidates and examines the main claims of his masterwork, The World as Will and Representation. Young does not discuss Schopenhauer’s more popular, accessible writings[1] or his earlier dissertation[2], but the depth of his discussion of the central text compensates for this. I will begin by describing the book’s main strengths; then I will summarize some of Young’s important interpretive and critical points, and finally I will offer some modest questions about Young’s criticisms and some reflections on Schopenhauer’s significance.

The book is exceptionally clear and concise. Young does not waste any words. He divides each chapter into manageable sections, each of which contributes something important. Each chapter raises serious objections and offers a useful summary of the main points. Some philosophers might regard Schopenhauer’s system as a curiosity rather than as the work of a serious thinker--a strange fallback to Kant after Hegel’s heroic efforts to overcome Kant’s dualisms. But Young’s book demonstrates that Schopenhauer should be taken seriously, both because of a systematic vision that integrates his insights into ethics, human nature, art, science, and asceticism and because he offers challenging arguments for his unusual vision. Young clarifies Schopenhauer’s fundamental concerns and motivates respect for his achievements, even when he finds them flawed. Where Young’s interpretations might be controversial, he indicates alternative readings and clearly states the rationale for his own without getting mired in tangential discussions of other secondary texts. He concludes with a useful appreciation of Schopenhauer’s legacy. The book’s greatest strengths, however, are its clear analysis of Schopenhauer’s arguments and its thorough examination of them. The book offers an excellent introduction for those new to Schopenhauer and a significant challenge to his apologists.

Schopenhauer’s system integrates elements of Kant, Plato, and Eastern religious asceticism. Very briefly, he thinks garden-variety perceptual objects are illusory appearances that mask a deeper, underlying reality (the thing-in-itself) that he seems to identify with Will. He thinks humans can intuitively comprehend this Will via insight into their own wills. When manifest in appearances, the Will becomes an endless, fruitless struggle for satisfaction and survival, but Schopenhauer thinks it is a single Whole (all individual wills and all phenomena are merely its instantiations). Because the Will is purposeless striving, and is even “evil” in that it binds humans to an endless wheel of desire, he thinks salvation requires turning away from the Will entirely through asceticism. An initial step toward transcending the Will can be taken through contemplating great art because it reveals the essences of phenomena that are masked by interested, practical life. Similar to Platonic forms, these essences are direct embodiments of the Will, which are then further instantiated by everyday appearances. Schopenhauer believes that individual wills are entirely determined, but holds that the source of ethical responsiveness is the realization that all wills are identical, a realization that should produce compassion for others’ suffering. Like the contemplation and creation of art, however, ethical compassion is only a stage on the way toward complete asceticism, which permits whatever salvation is possible for human beings.

Some exemplary interpretive questions Young addresses include: Does Schopenhauer actually solve his signature problem of articulating the thing-in-itself, and to what extent does his mature position abandon the claim that it is identical to the Will? Does Schopenhauer’s insistence that great art must be disinterested mean that art cannot provide emotional insight and education? Does Schopenhauer’s claim that character is determined mean that people cannot transform themselves--first by appreciating art, and second by withdrawing from the Will via asceticism--in order to achieve salvation? What are the central arguments supporting Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision of life? I will consider Young’s contributions to these issues in turn.

Though the youthful Schopenhauer seemed to believe that the Will is the thing-in-itself and that humans can have a kind of access to it through experiencing their own acts of will (89-92), Young notes (and Schopenhauer later realized) that acts of will (whether human or primordial) are temporal events and that the thing-in-itself is atemporal (beyond time) (94). If the Will really is identical to all individual wills, to Platonic essences, and ultimately to appearances, some way of clarifying how an atemporal unity becomes temporal and differentiated is needed. Moreover, identifying the Will as the thing-in-itself makes the claim that unifying with the thing-in-itself via self-denial is the path to salvation incoherent because the Will itself is blind, irrational, absurd, and even “evil”. Thus, there must be something more basic than the Will with which to unify to achieve salvation (98-101). Young argues that the Will plays an intermediate role in Schopenhauer’s mature system: it integrates the various forces postulated by science (e.g., gravity, magnetism, nutrition, and reproduction) and thus completes the scientific task of comprehending reality (56-60), and it accounts for the way character determines actions (thus explaining human predictability) (66-8). Schopenhauer’s Will, however, is only an interpretation of the thing-in-itself that accounts for human experience broadly conceived; in-itself it can only be grasped via mystic insight and complete dissociation from human willing (94-8). Human salvation thus requires abdicating the Will for something deeper than cannot be described (101-2). Though this analysis may still not account for the way a single, atemporal thing-in-itself breaks into a plurality of temporal acts of will and a multitude of Platonic essences, it does provide an important philosophical role for the universal Will, even if the nature of the thing-in-itself remains mysterious. This is how Young reads Schopenhauer’s crucial Chapters 17 and 18 of Volume II.

Schopenhauer privileges the aesthetic state (inhabited by artists and approximated by contemplative audiences) because it provides access to essences in a way that everyday practical consciousness cannot. Everyday consciousness is interested, grasping only those properties that are necessary for survival. But in aesthetic contemplation, consciousness loses itself in the object, abandons its own purposes, and discovers the essence of the object (108-13). It thus apprehends appearances in a new way. Great art transcends both passions and appetites, transforming its creator and audience into will-less, timeless subjects of knowledge. Young notes that this view implies that art can neither illuminate the emotions nor embody great passions, a claim he takes to be patently mistaken (114-15). On the basis of interpretations of Schopenhauer’s theories of the sublime and the lyric, Young concludes that Schopenhauer allows art to illuminate emotions only as long as they remain dissociated from the person. In the experience of the sublime we simultaneously experience awesome threats and yet remain above these threats--able to contemplate them from a cosmic perspective. Thus we undergo a split in which one side experiences strong passion (e.g., fear or humility) while the other side remains aloof and dissociated from that passion (115-20). Similarly in the richest lyric, we experience not primarily a personal expression of feeling but a universal emotion, an emotion that transcends our individual, egoistic viewpoint (120-4). Young concludes that, for Schopenhauer, art can explore emotions as long as it distances audiences from them and provides contemplation of them, much as representational art invites contemplation of the Platonic essences of nature. Young’s reading at least makes Schopenhauer’s theory of art capable of illuminating emotional life.

Young notes that although Schopenhauer believes that philosophy can have no beneficial effect on a person’s character because it is fixed and immutable, he nonetheless wants to explain the common human experience of responsibility (158-60; 163-4). Young claims that, for Schopenhauer, persons make a fundamental choice that attaches them to their character, which thereafter remains entirely determined (163). But since that fundamental choice is uncaused, it can induce a sense of freedom that accounts for the sense of responsibility. Moreover, this choice constitutes an organizing principle that informs all the person’s actions, explaining their predictability (162-4). Young wonders how such a choice is possible (since it is a temporal event) within an atemporal domain (the thing-in-itself); he also argues that the mature Schopenhauer has no right to adopt this solution because he believes that this atemporal realm is strictly unknowable (164). Young also suggests that in salvation character is not so much transformed as suppressed, and the individual does not determine whether such suppression succeeds. Still, Young argues that this ability to consciously suppress character abandons the deterministic picture Schopenhauer defends in Book II (192-4).

Young suggests that Schopenhauer’s pessimism consists of a descriptive claim (that all life is suffering) and an consequent evaluative claim (that life ought not to be) (206). The main support for the descriptive claim is that life oscillates between the suffering that follows from the inability to satisfy incessant desires and the boredom that follows from temporary satisfactions. Though suffering is burdensome, Young believes that Schopenhauer’s major contribution is the analysis of boredom, which typically produces dissociation, indifference, and even cruelty. The desperate inability to will that boredom produces is nothing like the disinterestedness and openness of aesthetic contemplation. Thus, boredom offers no release from the suffering endemic to willing. Everyday life is merely a pendulum that swings between dissatisfaction and boredom, neither of which yield genuine happiness (209-14). To this descriptive claim Young objects that even if striving produces only rare satisfactions, this does not mean it always produces dissatisfaction. There is a distinctive joy in progressing toward a goal, even if its achievement remains distant. The experience of challenge can be stimulating even if the goal is never fully reached (217-18). The evaluative claim supporting Schopenhauer’s pessimism is also flawed because, oddly, it presupposes that only pleasure can give life any value. In fact, many other values that are not reducible to pleasure are equally compelling--vitality, self-development, and spiritual strength (218-19).

As should be evident, Young maintains a tenacious and challenging critical dialogue with Schopenhauer even as he strives to provide coherent interpretations of his claims. Here I can only summarize a few of his many interesting criticisms: Though Schopenhauer effectively uses the empiricist criterion of meaning to challenge Hegel’s and Fichte’s theories of the Absolute, this same criterion may render his own theories of the Will and the thing-in-itself problematic. Even Schopenhauer’s philosophical goal of clarifying ultimate reality may be unintelligible given this criterion of meaning. So the sword he uses to impale his enemies may deal a deathblow to the meaningfulness of his own position (46-52).

In addition, Schopenhauer often asserts that the Will is blind and dumb, but he nonetheless evaluates it morally. So it must have some capacity for self-direction and some goal in expressing itself in phenomena (83). Also, human motives require some knowledge before they can issue in action; the agent must realize that the goal will satisfy the will’s demand, and in this way too human willing depends on knowledge (83-5). It cannot be entirely blind. Here Schopenhauer might reply that although he does evaluate the Will he need not assume purposiveness or the Will’s capacity to do otherwise to do this. He may be “evaluating” the Will in the same way humans typically evaluate natural disasters--as something to be avoided whenever possible--without presupposing that they could have not occurred or that they exhibit purposiveness. He need not anthropomorphize the Will to evaluate it.

Further, though great art can certainly reveal universal essences, Young argues that it can also illuminate the uniqueness of particular objects and events, a task requiring similar attentiveness and self-transcendence. To support this Young cites the examples of Constable’s Suffolk landscapes and Japanese flower painting (149). Beyond this, Schopenhauer believes that the transformation of the artistic object into Platonic idea and the transformation of the aesthetic subject into a will-less, contemplative, “pure” knower are simultaneous and correlative. But grasping the perceived object as an exemplar of some universal differs from seeing the object stripped of the additions and subtractions of practical demands. The latter attempts to achieve pure receptivity, to restore a richer experience of the object. But the former must go further, seeing beyond what is given to an embodied form. Both can be achieved through art, but they are not necessarily concomitant; they are better conceived as independent reasons for appreciating great art (145-50). I would add another question about Schopenhauer’s much-admired theory of art, which concerns the artistic process itself. Is the object’s essence discovered as the artwork is created? Then some form of artistic purposiveness would seem necessary. But if the essence is grasped prior to artistic creation, then the artwork becomes superfluous for artists; it merely allows them to communicate these essences. And the audience must then adopt a purposive stance to divine the essence, which is not the disinterested stance Schopenhauer posits.

Finally, Young argues that Schopenhauer’s ethics fails to transcend egoism because one’s care for others is only an extension of one’s care for oneself. At the deepest level, self and others are not distinct; thus, Schopenhauer’s view provides no respect for others as such (182-4). Schopenhauer might reply that standard conceptions of ethics presuppose the principle of individuation that he rejects. Schopenhauer is trying to show how ethical responsiveness is possible given his metaphysics, even if he rejects the classical presuppositions of ethics.

To Young’s core objection that Schopenhauer never succeeds in showing how the atemporal thing-in-itself becomes temporal, some interpreters might reply by emphasizing his “double-aspect” theory of the Will. (The universal atemporal Will is one aspect while the individual temporal instantiations of the Will is its other aspect.) Though Young acknowledges the double-aspect theory (60-1; 78-9), he notes that this does not render any more intelligible how an atemporal entity and temporal ones can be mirror-aspects of each other.

Elaborating several of Young’s criticisms, I would argue that Schopenhauer never did render his empiricist aspirations coherent with his metaphysical goals. Also, I would suggest that a single fundamental choice that would bind persons to their characters is insufficient to explain the continued experience of responsibility most people feel for their specific faults or failures. Would they even have any consciousness of such a basic choice? I agree with Young that Schopenhauer simply failed to see the potentially stimulating effects of suffering; it can certainly be taken as a challenge to greater efforts and more intense self-development. This is one of Nietzsche’s many departures from Schopenhauer, and it allows Nietzsche to adopt a life-affirming orientation toward life that sharply contrasts with Schopenhauer’s life-negation. Nietzsche retained Schopenhauer’s goal of a kind of Dionysian, mystical merging with ultimate reality, but he believed that the this-worldly life-process constituted that ultimate reality. Schopenhauer’s salvation allegedly helps individuals transcend death, but all that “survives” is the atemporal Will (or the more basic thing-in-itself); nothing of individuality survives. Nietzsche took similar solace in the eternity of the this-worldly life-process, but at least individuals might contribute to--and even reshape--that process, and its existence is far more certain.

Schopenhauer is an extreme example of one path within philosophy--accepting a transcendent reality and construing freedom or salvation as dissociation from the perceived world and any interest in it. A quite different path takes the perceived world to be primary, rejecting any escape to some alternate, hidden reality; it also insists that freedom requires a sense of being expressed by this-worldly actions. Withdrawal from and indifference to the world of human affairs, from this perspective, seems like a desperate form of egoism. Moreover, it fails to achieve the peace Schopenhauer valued because denying the will to live can only lead to endless internal conflict and strife. Suffering and strife thus penetrate the most refined efforts to achieve salvation[3]. Schopenhauer’s metaphysics seems to undermine, rather than reinforce, his aim of achieving peace. Young’s book acknowledges the grandeur of Schopenhauer’s effort, but it also demonstrates the many ways it remains inadequate.

[1] Parerga and Paralipomena, trans. E.F.J. Payne, 2 Vols. (Oxford: Clarenden Press, 1974).

[2] The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, trans. E.F.J. Payne (La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1974).

[3] Robert Wicks makes this important objection in his article on Schopenhauer in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (on-line; article copyright 2003).