2006.09.09

Miguel de Beistegui

The New Heidegger

Miguel de Beistegui, The New Heidegger, Continuum Press, 2005, 210 pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826470610.

Reviewed by Iain Thomson, University of New Mexico


The New Heidegger is Miguel de Beistegui's fourth book on Heidegger in a decade and is, like his earlier work, engaging and packed with ideas, often poetically written and philosophically provocative.[1] The bold title is probably best heard as an homage to The New Nietzsche (MIT, 1977, D. Allison, ed.), a volume that introduced English speaking audiences to a variety of French, post-Heideggerian readings of Nietzsche (from the likes of Deleuze, Derrida, and Klossowski). That allusion, at any rate, is apt: Just as The New Nietzsche tended to read Nietzsche back through the lens of Heidegger, so The New Heidegger tends to read Heidegger back through the lenses of these post-Heideggerian French philosophers (especially Deleuze and Derrida, but also Badiou).

It is a bit misleading to present the result as a general "introduction" to Heidegger, but The New Heidegger will nicely serve that function for anyone who has spent enough time reading those post-Heideggerian French philosophers without having tackled that "underground king" of 20th century German philosophy who so profoundly influenced them all. Such readers of continental philosophy yet to discover the "Heideggerian continent" (2) will also most appreciate de Beistegui's style, finding a presentation of Heidegger that presupposes rather than explains Deleuze's vocabulary of "the fold," "zones of intensity," and "lines of flight," Derrida's "condition of possibility as the condition of impossibility," Badiou's "truth event" (and so on) illuminating and suggestive, and not just a hermeneutic leap from the frying pan into the fire.

A creative thinker, de Beistegui is an inspired writer of introductions, and begins here by explaining Heidegger's ever more difficult philosophical style, "the increasingly radical and demanding evolution of his thought" (2), in terms of Deleuze's idea that

every great thinker is an inventor -- an inventor of concepts… . [For, t]he great thinker thinks precisely at the limit of what has been thought up until then, and so at the limit of conceptual language itself. (1)

This is also, I think, an oblique apologia for de Beistegui's own frequent flights of philosophical imagination, and I find it convincing as far as it goes, so long as we also suggest that these philosophical explorers, as they come back down to earth to consolidate their insights, should try to explain themselves more clearly. De Beistegui would agree, I hope, since his own work, at its best, shows that clarity and depth are synergistic virtues.

While focusing primarily on works by Heidegger that have been translated into English, The New Heidegger also draws insightfully on a number of recent volumes from Heidegger's Gesamtausgabe (or Complete Works), scheduled to fill more than 100 volumes -- some 70 of which were already published when de Beistegui began writing his book. Recognizing that this immense "Heideggerian continent is still being charted" (2), de Beistegui presents his own cartography using the "thematic approach" (3) familiar to readers of contemporary French philosophy, rather than the more systematic or chronological approaches typically favored by German and Anglo-American philosophers. Successive chapters thus explicate Heidegger's thinking on six major themes -- life, truth, space and time, technology, art, and Nazism -- and so provide a series of overlapping portraits of Heidegger's thought. The guiding idea here is that the book should be able to be read in any order, or dipped in and out of freely by those looking for guidance on a particular theme, without being inhospitable to a more old-fashioned, linear reading -- a compromise the book negotiates quite successfully.

The endeavor to write an expert introduction to Heidegger requires other competing demands to be balanced as well. Perhaps most importantly: How should one navigate between the need for clarity and simplicity and the obligation to do justice to Heidegger's often difficult and complex ideas? De Beistegui's strategy seems to be to begin each chapter clearly and simply and then slowly but progressively complicate matters, both philosophically and stylistically, with the result that several chapters crescendo at a level of intricacy and abstraction only the brightest introductory readers will be able to follow. Still, more advanced readers will find these chapters increasingly stimulating and provocative, and the book ends with seven brief appendices (2-3 pp. each) to assist anyone lost along the way, including a nice biographical sketch of Heidegger and an insightful mini-essay on Heidegger's reading of the Greeks, three good little entries on Heidegger's relation to hermeneutics, architecture, and deconstruction, and two promising but undeveloped excurses on Heidegger's influence on psychotherapy and, via Dreyfus, on artificial intelligence. That appendix on Dreyfus's famous critique of artificial intelligence is, unfortunately, de Beistegui's sole point of contact with analytically-informed approaches to Heidegger (a problem to which I return at the end).

A short review cannot examine many of the fascinating issues de Beistegui addresses, but one way to highlight a few of the book's best insights and unresolved problems is to examine a thread winding through and connecting its different themes, namely, de Beistegui's original and fascinating interpretation of Heidegger as (what I would call) a metaphysical perfectionist. The perfectionist tradition going back to Aristotle holds, first, that there is something essential or importantly distinctive about the form of life we human beings embody, some set of skills or capacities that set us apart from (and, typically, above) all the other kinds of entities with which we are familiar; and, second, that our greatest possible fulfillment or flourishing comes from the development of these significantly distinctive skills or capacities (often toward an ideal "perfection").[2]

De Beistegui rightly sees that, for Heidegger, "the good and happy life" turns on "the possibility of [Dasein, the human form of life] living according to its own essence" (44). In other words, Heidegger is a perfectionist -- but of what type? De Beistegui nicely develops the perfectionism of Heidegger's politically and philosophically problematic middle period (c. 1927-1937), what Steven Crowell characterizes as "the metaphysical decade" that begins with Being and Time and ends with the difficult but important Contributions to Philosophy: From Enowning. De Beistegui is mistaken, however, to extend this middle-period view across Heidegger's later work. Doing so covers over Heidegger's later rejection of the pro-metaphysical views he himself held during his metaphysical decade and his consequent abandonment of the distinctive form of perfectionism to which these views gave rise.

De Beistegui's presentation of Heidegger in perfectionist terms begins in the middle of his first chapter, "A Matter of Life."[3] Taking up the question of "animality," that is, the fraught issue of how we conceive of non-human animals, de Beistegui defends Heidegger's controversial claim that "the animal differs essentially from the existent being [i.e., Dasein]" in that non-human animals "are not exposed to the reality of openness as such." While suggestive, Heidegger's murky move raises more questions than it answers about whether and how a bright red line can justifiably be drawn between human beings and all other animals. Such cardinal distinctions have been a mainstay of the perfectionist tradition since Aristotle, but Darwin seemed to undermine that move, as Nietzsche already saw.[4]

One might think de Beistegui could sidestep this contentious issue, since his initial formulation of Heidegger's perfectionism emphasizes rather than denies our proximity to other forms of life. In his view, Heidegger develops a conception of "the fundamental meaning of life" (22) in which to live "the good life" means "to live philosophy" (27). (De Beistegui thus helps us understand how Heidegger entered into the orbit of the "life-philosophy" he would later reject, developing ideas from Heidegger's middle, most Nietzschean period into a suggestive proximity to Deleuze and Agamben.) Here what relevantly distinguishes humanity is "philosophy as a form of fidelity to life" (24), where life is made meaningful through a philosophical practice in which we learn to "awaken" and "intensify" life's sense of itself. As de Beistegui writes, "life is never better served, that is, understood, and so intensified, than in philosophy" (25).

To prevent this perfectionist ideal of life-intensification from collapsing into narcissistic navel-gazing or some vacuous quickening of the pulse, however, de Beistegui shows how Heidegger developed it into a metaphysical perfectionism, in which human life is distinguished by and fulfilled through our apparently unique capacity for metaphysics.[5] To learn "to live philosophy," on this view, is to experience "the most decisive and most extreme type of existence, that is, … the type of existence in which existence as such and as a whole is at issue and at stake" (27). This is precisely the perspective adopted by the metaphysician who, Heidegger thinks, steps outside entities "as such and as a whole" (in affective attunements such as awe, anxiety, and boredom) in order to try to gain a complete grasp of reality. On all of this de Beistegui is quite illuminating. Yet, what he does not seem to recognize is that Heidegger, after passing through his own metaphysical decade, did an about-face and became highly critical of this metaphysical endeavor, eventually developing his important critique of this metaphysical attempt to grasp reality "as such and as a whole" as ontotheology.[6]

In the ontotheological tradition Heidegger sees stretching from Plato to Nietzsche, the metaphysician seeks to grasp all of reality ontologically (from the inside-out) and theologically (from the outside-in) at the same time. As I have shown elsewhere, Heidegger comes to believe that an historical series of such ontotheologies structure Western humanity's shifting sense of reality. This leads Heidegger to the reductive yet revealing view that the conceptual scaffolding of our current, "technological" age is the Nietzschean ontotheology of "eternally recurring will-to-power," an understanding of all entities as mere forces coming-together and breaking-apart without any end beyond the self-perpetuating increase of these forces. Heidegger holds this Nietzschean ontotheology ultimately responsible for the technological "enframing" that reduces all entities to intrinsically meaningless "resources" (Bestand) standing by for optimization, and thinks that only by recognizing and transcending this ontotheology can we hope to uproot the most deeply entrenched problems facing our historical age. Indeed, this is the project he hopes to accomplish through his later perfectionist philosophy of education.

The failure to fully appreciate Heidegger's critique of metaphysics as ontotheology generates several distortions in de Beistegui's account. First, as already mentioned, it leads him to misleadingly generalize Heidegger's pro-metaphysical views, thereby obscuring the later perfectionism Heidegger develops precisely in order to transcend ontotheology. Second, it prevents de Beistegui from understanding, in an otherwise excellent chapter on Heidegger's critique of technology, the precise sense in which Heidegger thinks that "technologization … has its roots in metaphysical thought" (102). Not recognizing Heidegger's view that technologization is rooted specifically in our current, Nietzschean ontotheology of eternally recurring will-to-power, since only this understanding of being reduces all entities to mere resources awaiting optimization, de Beistegui instead advances the overly general and untenable views that "Western metaphysics itself … is essentially technological" (113) and even that "history as such … is intrinsically technological" (114).

Third, while de Beistegui's chapter on Heidegger's view of art is generally very illuminating (although I would take issue with his understanding of poetry), omitting Heidegger's critique of metaphysics as ontotheology makes it impossible to fully articulate the connection Heidegger discerns between the "danger" of technologization and the "promise" of art. Without the account of ontotheology, Heidegger's saving idea of developing a "free relation to technology" (99) remains too obscure. Finally, in his otherwise insightful chapter on Heidegger's Nazism, ignoring ontotheology allows de Beistegui to read Heidegger's critique of technology back into the Rectorial Address (173), repeating a mistake he made in Heidegger and the Political.[7] In fact, the political program Heidegger set out in 1933's "The Self-Assertion of the German University" is closer to the pro-metaphysical view de Beistegui himself elaborates and defends.

The sophisticated final chapter on Heidegger's Nazism also contains one striking moment of naive good conscience, in which de Beistegui writes of Heidegger:

I believe there is nothing in his thinking that suggests any anti-Semitic tendencies (were this to be the case, taking his thought seriously, teaching it and writing about it would amount to nothing less than a complicity in what ought to be characterized outright as an immoral and criminal endeavor). (160)

Although the rest of the discussion is more careful, de Beistegui paints himself into a corner here by accepting the terms advocated by the most virulently polemical of anti-Heideggerians, Emmanuel Faye, who takes this loose logic of contagion only one step further in order to conclude that teaching Heidegger should be criminalized. For, if one interprets de Beistegui's "any anti-Semitic tendencies" at all broadly, for example, in the senses proposed by Horkheimer and Adorno in the Dialectic of Enlightenment or by Bambach in Heidegger's Roots (Cornell, 2003), then Heidegger's philosophical opposition to uprootedness, cosmopolitanism, capitalism, Bolshevism, and so on, can certainly "suggest" a philosophically sublimated anti-Semitism. The lesson is, first, that Heidegger's life cannot be so easily cordoned off from his thought, and second, that this should be the beginning rather than the end of our discussion.

I mentioned earlier that de Beistegui seems not to have read much analytically-informed Heidegger scholarship. That is a shame, not only because he thereby overlooks some of the most insightful recent work on Heidegger, but also because the most important breakthroughs -- in which genuine progress is made on the most difficult issues raised by Heidegger's thinking -- will continue to come from the struggle to explain Heidegger's insights in terms much clearer than his own. A few pretentious sophists continue to reinforce the worst stereotypes about continental philosophy by writing barely intelligible and, under scrutiny, hollow books (for an egregious example, see the quote from Phillips's Heidegger's Volk provided by Sluga at the end of his NDPR review), but de Beistegui has never been one of these epigones. Instead, he continues to develop his own voice, his own ideas and style of communicating them, learning from but refusing to conform to outdated models of philosophical expression, and I admire him for this.

Still, those of us caught between the philosophical territories (coyotes, as we say in New Mexico, that is, border-crossers, smugglers, tricksters) -- too "continental" for the analytics, too "analytic" for the continentals -- may worry over signs that de Beistegui, one of the most prolific and creative Heidegger interpreters now writing, seems to be considering taking up residence on one side of the divide, as if he could rest content with translating Heidegger into a language readers of Deleuze and Derrida will understand. Facing ignorance or even hostility from a wider philosophical audience, and enthusiasm from a broader intellectual public, that might be a strategically and psychologically understandable decision, but it would still be disappointing to those of us who hope that by suffering the tension between analytic and continental philosophy we might help pull the poles closer together and so work toward eventually healing the divide. Perhaps that is a pipe dream, but the alternative, the perpetuation of separate but unequal philosophical traditions, seems worse.


[1]Heidegger and the Political: Dystopias (Routledge, 1998) is a clearly written and insightful analysis of the philosophical significance of Heidegger's Nazism and his later contributions to our understanding of "the political" (i.e., the ontological question of what it is that makes something "political"). Thinking with Heidegger: Displacements (Indiana UP, 2003) creatively develops Heidegger's views on human being, science, art, and architecture. The difficult Truth and Genesis: Philosophy as Differential Ontology (Indiana UP, 2004) seeks to synthesize and transcend Heidegger and Deleuze, and is, in my view, one of the most ambitious and provocative works of recent continental thought.

[2]I develop this view in "Heidegger's Perfectionist Philosophy of Education in Being and Time," Continental Philosophy Review 37:4 (2004), pp. 439-467, and in Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education (Cambridge, 2005).

[3]The chapter opens with de Beistegui's extended reflections on a "recurrent nightmare" about becoming nothing he experienced as a child. The bridge this literary device is used to build, however, remains a bit tenuous. De Beistegui interprets this childhood nightmare in terms of Heidegger's thinking of "the nothing," thereby retrojecting difficult Heideggerian ideas onto what seems more likely to have been a straightforward case of separation anxiety in a sensitive child. Whether or not these dreams were catalyzed by an early struggle with the idea of death, de Beistegui could strengthen the intended connection to Heidegger by clarifying the mysterious link, in Heidegger's work, between anxiety, death, and the nothing. Of course, some may think that our philosophical needs should not drive our psychological analyses, nor, conversely, should our psychological needs direct our philosophical analyses. If Nietzsche was right, however, philosophy will always be more or less obliquely autobiographical, and de Beistegui is just courageous enough to try to chart those oblique angles in public.

[4]Here reading more contemporary work on Heidegger might have helped de Beistegui appropriately complicate matters. In The Open: Man and Animal (Stanford, 2004), Agamben suggests that Heidegger's claim is only uncontroversially true about creatures like the "ticks" Heidegger was in fact researching while formulating his tripartite distinction between the worldless stone, the world-poor animal, and the world-disclosing Dasein or human being-here. I discuss the broader issues at stake in "Ontology and Ethics at the Intersection of Phenomenology and Environmental Philosophy," Inquiry 47:4 (2004), pp. 380-412.

[5]De Beistegui expresses this view of Heidegger's metaphysical perfectionism quite poetically: "We are this being for whom its own being is always an issue for it. This is our strength, and this is our burden. It is our fate. We can never say: I am, once and for all, I am done with being… . Only when we are dead can we be done with having-to-be (with existence). Existence is our essence. And by virtue of this essence itself, we are responsible for our own being. This responsibility demands that we embrace existence not as a burden, but as a chance. We must convert our fate -- the fate of freedom -- into deeds and words that reflect the openness of our being to the future and indicate that, for us, life is something that is still to come, still outstanding. This fate -- our fate as free, metaphysical beings -- is what the experience of nothingness reveals. By revealing ourselves as open and exposed to what, from the start, is in excess of things in the world, the nothing reveals our metaphysical nature and destiny. If we are destined to metaphysical thought (to metaphysics), it is because of our meta-physical being." (15-16)

[6]De Beistegui believes that: "If [Heidegger's] later work does constitute a reorientation of the earlier work, it does not break with it in any way" (94).

[7]On the last point, see Heidegger on Ontotheology, p. 121 note 86. I would like to thank K. Becker and A. Johnston for helpful discussions of ideas developed in this review.