2006.09.24

Eric Paras

2.0: Beyond Power and Knowledge

Eric Paras, Foucault 2.0: Beyond Power and Knowledge, Other Press, 2006, 240pp., $29.00 (hbk), ISBN 1590512340.

Reviewed by Michael Mahon, Boston University


Like a good detective or archaeologist (in the common sense) Paras has pursued every lead and grounded his new interpretation of Foucault's archive on Foucault's most obscure and unpublished writings and lectures. Most of these obscurities are available in Dits et Ecrits, but Paras makes a major contribution by meticulously mining nearly two hundred hours of cassette recordings. He treats these lecture courses as independent Foucaultian texts with their own integrity and effectively reveals that they should in fact be so treated. Paras calls these the "starting point" of his work. The reader already familiar with the literature on Foucault will find this a fresh, stimulating, provocative read.

Paras recounts several fascinating confrontations between Foucault and other leading voices of his time. The discussion of The Archaeology of Knowledge as a direct response to Sartre is especially illuminating. The reader will find this treatment much more in line with that of an intellectual historian than the philosophical investigation of Thomas R. Flynn's exploration of the Foucault/Sartre relationship (Sartre, Foucault, and Historical Reason: A Poststructuralist Mapping of History, 2 Volumes, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 2005). Paras reads The Archaeology of Knowledge's conclusion as a confrontation, orchestrated by Foucault, between Foucault and Sartre. The author's juxtaposition of the final remarks of Sartre's The Words and those of The Archaeology of Knowledge provides a chilling -- yes, "cold-blooded" -- conclusion.

Paras provides a very sympathetic discussion of "one of the most indecipherable" and "mystifying" moments in Foucault's career: his positive initial response to the Iranian revolution. Events of the winter of 1978-1979 dampened Foucault's enthusiasm for the revolution, leading him to abandon the concepts of the primacy of the state, ideology, class, repression, the mode of production, and dialectics in his understanding of power, separating himself from Marxism and adopting the liberal categories of rights and the rule of law. Some of these categories reappeared during Foucault's chairmanship of the Marxist philosophy department at Vincennes, but their return was short-lived. Paras, the intellectual historian, traces this transition in Foucault's thought to the influence of the new philosophes -- especially Glucksmann and Levy -- and of his friend Gilles Deleuze. Paras tells this story in a much slower, more careful, thoroughly documented fashion than that recounted here.

The title, Foucault 2.0: Beyond Power and Knowledge, at first seemed a bit pretentious. Yes, like your latest Microsoft program, the company of Foucault students has made a quantum leap beyond previous studies with this new edition. My local computer expert, however, assures me that a "two-point-zero" indicates only a modest incremental advance. But, indeed, we have reached a new level with this exciting new piece of work. What warrants the "two-point-zero" claim is Paras's assertion that Foucault moved "Beyond Power and Knowledge" and abandoned archaeology and genealogy, the hallmarks of his philosophical enterprise. It is certainly a bold claim. Foucault's 1979 course, The Birth of Biopolitics, the spadework for the first volume of The History of Sexuality where Foucault writes extensively of genealogy and power, according to Paras, "saw the gradual abandonment of genealogy… ." Paras asks, "Why did Foucault stop using the word 'archaeology' to describe his researches?" (p. 46).

Well, he didn't. He neither abandoned genealogy (at least in his own mind) nor stopped using the word "archaeology." And, of course, a careful scholar like Paras knows this; his mastery of the appropriate texts is undeniable. Just a year before he died, Foucault was asked about the "shift in the methodological focus" of his work from archaeology to genealogy. Foucault responded that the difference is between method and goal and that he never stopped doing either archaeology or genealogy ("The Culture of the Self" discussion session, available at the Cal Berkeley Language Lab). Just a month before he died, L'usage des plaisirs appeared with a description of the work in terms of archaeology and genealogy. The precise dating is unclear, but "What is Enlightenment?" appeared about this time with an important discussion of archaeology and genealogy. The author might still want to argue his case, but these few obvious discrepancies in the texts call for attention.

Another major claim arises in the form of a question: "How and why does Foucault go from being a philosopher of the disappearance of the subject to one wholly preoccupied with the subject?" Perhaps the question's formulation is too facile. Clearly Foucault in his early writings attacked the subject of phenomenology, but it is not clear that his preoccupation with the subject was a late interest. On one of the many occasions he rejected the "structuralist" label -- and Paras cites this -- Foucault described the early Archaeology of Knowledge and The Order of Things as concerned with the field where "questions of human being, consciousness, origin, and the subject make their appearance" (p. 37).

This reviewer disagrees with a couple of Paras's assertions but finds the work extremely well written and researched and thought-provoking. It is an admirable piece of scholarship.