Nicholas Dent


Nicholas Dent, Rousseau, Routledge, 2005, 248pp., $17.90 (pbk), ISBN 0415283507.

Reviewed by James Clarke, University of York, UK

Nicholas Dent's work will be familiar to anyone interested in Rousseau scholarship. Dent has written several excellent articles on Rousseau, a Rousseau 'dictionary' and an important monograph -- Rousseau: An Introduction to his Psychological, Social and Political Theory (which is, unfortunately, out of print). In Rousseau Dent seeks to provide an accessible and comprehensive introduction to Rousseau's thought as a whole.

The book consists of eight chapters, a chronology of Rousseau's life, a brief glossary and bibliography. Most chapters conclude with a summary and each chapter is followed by suggestions for further reading. Chapter 1, the Introduction, provides an outline of the aims of the book. Chapter 2 provides a brief and engaging account of Rousseau's life and work, and a discussion of his key ideas. Chapter 3 discusses Rousseau's three Discourses, paying particular attention to the second discourse, the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality. Chapter 4 focuses upon Émile, or On Education, whilst Chapter 5 deals with The Social Contract. Chapter 6 discusses the role assigned by Rousseau to culture and religion, and his attempts to apply his ideas to political reality. Chapter 7 treats of Rousseau's autobiographical writing and Chapter 8 discusses his influence upon politics, philosophy and literature.

In Chapter 1, Dent singles out seven themes in Rousseau's thinking to which his account will give 'prominence' (p. 4). These are: 1) Rousseau's 'account and critique of the corruption of man that civilization brings'; 2) his concern with 'power relations between people'; 3) his 'celebration of "natural man"'; 4) the 'role of the sentiments of amour de soi and amour-propre'; 5) his 'account of the foundations of political legitimacy and the role of the general will'; 6) his 'emphasis on liberty, fraternity and equality in a just and humane society' and 7) his 'account of the role of national culture and religion in the lives of individuals in a just society' (p. 4). Although these themes are discussed throughout the text, certain chapters focus upon specific themes.

Chapters 1 and 2 are introductory in character. In Chapter 3, Dent discusses the three Discourses. According to Dent, Rousseau's account of the corruption of civilized man and his analysis of 'power relations' between agents turns upon the notion of amour-propre. Dent provisionally defines amour-propre as 'a desire or need to secure recognition from others, for an acknowledgement of oneself in their eyes and actions' (p. 40). This demand can be manifested as the desire to attain a position of superiority over others and to elicit their respect and acknowledgment. According to Dent, Rousseau thinks that many scientists and artists are motivated by this desire for superiority and distinction, and that it is this, rather than the search for truth or authentic expression, that determines the nature of much scientific and artistic endeavour. Rousseau further argues, again according to Dent, that this desire for 'invidious distinction' (p. 55) lies at the origin of inequality. The desire for distinction leads to the subordination and abasement of others, and the elevation of oneself to a position of mastery and domination. Yet such domination is itself a form of subordination insofar as one is dependent upon the esteem and good opinion of others. One becomes a slave to the opinion of others and must, if one is to maintain one's superior position, seek to conform to this opinion. Amour-propre is thus central to Rousseau's diagnosis of the ills of civilized society. Nevertheless, Dent argues that this is only one form of amour-propre -- 'damaging' or 'combative' amour-propre. The bare concept of amour-propre is simply the demand for recognition and acknowledgment as a being of worth. Whilst this demand may typically be manifested as a desire to prove one's worth by establishing one's superiority over others and eliciting their admiration and esteem, this is not the only form it can take. There is also, Dent stresses, a 'positive and constructive' form of amour-propre (p. 40). This form of amour-propre consists in the demand that I am recognized as a human being possessing 'intrinsic worth', and this demand does not entail the subjection of others. It entails, rather, that I recognize other agents as possessing intrinsic worth like myself, and that I treat them as equals. As those familiar with Dent's work will know, this distinction between 'constructive' and 'damaging' amour-propre is his major contribution to Rousseau scholarship. Dent sees in the notion of 'constructive' or 'benign' (as he calls it elsewhere) amour-propre the basis of Rousseau's solution to the ills of civilized society. Dent's concern with benign amour-propre leads him to place particular emphasis on Émile in which Rousseau develops an account of positive intersubjective relations.

In Chapter 4, Dent provides a discussion of Émile which centres upon the notion of amour-propre. Of particular interest is Dent's discussion of Rousseau's conception of nature and the natural. Dent argues that Rousseau does not always maintain that what is natural is incompatible with what is social, and does not advocate a return to an asocial state of nature as a solution to the ills of modern life. According to Dent, Rousseau has a rich and nuanced conception of nature and the natural. The term 'nature', as Rousseau uses it, does not always refer to that which is free from human artifice. It often refers to the basic condition, circumstances and capacities of human beings. It also refers to that which is conducive to human flourishing. On this latter, distinctly Aristotelian, sense of the term something is 'natural' insofar as it promotes human flourishing, and something is 'unnatural' insofar as it impedes or retards such flourishing. Given this understanding of the term, relations of mutual recognition and respect -- relations expressing benign amour-propre -- are 'natural' inasmuch as they facilitate the full realization of human nature (pp. 41-2, 96-101, 106). In his account of the development of such relations, Dent emphasizes the sentiment of 'pity' or 'compassion' (pitié) as enabling a positive, non-agonistic relationship to others. Pity, and the gratitude it elicits, establishes a bond of feeling between agents and prepares Émile for his accession to the 'moral order'. It is upon entering the moral order that Émile enters into relations of mutual acknowledgement with his fellow beings. In such relations each person is recognized as a being possessing intrinsic dignity and worth, and recognized to the same extent. The 'struggle for recognition' characteristic of inflamed amour-propre is thus 'resolved through mutual acknowledgment and esteem' (p. 149). In the rest of the chapter, Dent discusses the 'Profession of Faith of the Savoyard Vicar', Rousseau's unfortunate opinions concerning women and Émile's political education. The discussion of the 'Profession' is noteworthy insofar as Dent argues, following O'Hagan, that its account of human nature is at odds with the 'naturalist' account of human nature that Rousseau usually endorses (pp. 113-114).

In Chapter 5, Dent turns to The Social Contract. Dent claims that the argument of The Social Contract lacks clarity and needs to be supplemented with materials drawn from Émile and the second Discourse (p. 125). According to Dent, the equality demanded by the social contract is precisely that which is demanded by amour-propre in its 'constructive' form. Each agent is entitled to equal standing and regard by virtue of his or her intrinsic worth as a human being and no agent is entitled to greater regard than his or her fellows. Dent further argues that the social contract secures a new form of liberty, which he designates with Rousseau's term 'moral liberty' (pp. 134, 140, 144-52). Moral liberty is the liberty which agents enjoy in relations of mutual recognition and respect. In these relations, agents are able to realize their true potential as human beings. Moral liberty is fundamentally different from 'natural liberty' which is simply freedom from constraint. Natural liberty is enjoyed by agents prior to the contract; moral liberty is enjoyed by agents after the contract. Dent argues that the concept of moral liberty enables us to understand Rousseau's claim that agents are as free after the contract as they were before it (albeit in radically different ways) and his infamous claim that it is legitimate to 'force' noncompliant agents to be free. On Dent's reading, to force agents to be free is to remove them from relations of domination and subordination and to place them in relations of mutual respect. Despite the plausibility of Dent's discussion of moral liberty, it is perhaps worth noting that Rousseau only uses the term once in The Social Contract (at the end of Chapter 8 of Book I), suggesting that it does not play a central role in his argument. Nevertheless, Dent does make it clear that he is augmenting and developing what he considers to be an unsatisfactory argument.

In Chapter 6, Dent turns to a discussion of culture, religion and politics. Patriotism, a shared culture and civil religion serve to establish bonds of solidarity and feeling between agents and thus help to bring their private wills into conformity with the demands of the general will (p 139). The individual comes to identify his or her private good with the common good. Dent's discussion of the nature of this identification is particularly helpful. Dent draws a distinction between a 'maximal' type of identification, in which the individual's private goals are largely replaced by those of the state, and a type of identification in which the individual retains their private goals, but where these goals may, if necessary, be trumped by the goals and interests of the state (pp. 163-5). According to Dent, evidence for both types of identification can be found in Rousseau's writings. Having discussed the socially cohesive function of culture and religion, Dent turns to what he terms Rousseau's 'applied politics', his writings on Poland and Corsica. Dent stresses the way in which Rousseau adapts his ideas to the social and political contexts in which they are to be applied. Thus Rousseau recommends that Polish peasants be liberated only after they have attained the capacity to exercise their freedom responsibly.

Chapter 7 is a brisk and entertaining tour through Rousseau's autobiographical writing. Dent does not attempt to summarize this vast body of work, but provides the reader with select passages. The selection is skilful, bringing out the variegated nature of Rousseau's character, a character that was by turns arrogant, self-mocking, compassionate, passionate and paranoid.

In the eighth, and final, chapter, Dent discusses the influence of Rousseau upon the French Revolution, Kant, Hegel, Marx, Romanticism and contemporary philosophy and literature. The discussion of Kant is impressive, especially as regards Rousseau's influence upon the various formulations of the categorical imperative. The discussion of Hegel is disappointing. Dent focuses upon Hegel's critical discussion of Rousseau in §258 of the Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Dent rightly points out the paucity of this criticism, which seems to equate the general will with the will of all. Yet he almost completely overlooks the positive influence Rousseau exerted upon Hegel. Given Dent's account of amour-propre and his use of the term 'struggle for recognition' it is surprising that he does not mention Hegel's account of the 'struggle for recognition' and the relation of 'lordship and bondage' in the 1807 Phenomenology of Spirit. Dent does mention Hegel in relation to the work of Francis Fukuyama, but provides no account of what 'the more well-known theories of Hegel on this' are (p. 230). In this connection, it is also surprising that Dent does not refer to the vast body of literature on the 'politics of recognition', much of which explicitly refers to Rousseau (see, for example, the work of Taylor, Honneth and Todorov[1]). Dent's discussion of Marx seems correct in its claim that Rousseau's influence is, notwithstanding Engels' claim to the contrary, hard to discern. His discussion of the French revolution is interesting, as is his discussion of Romanticism. The discussion of Rousseau's influence upon contemporary literature with which the book concludes is, in my opinion, rather forced.

These minor criticisms aside, this is an excellent introduction to Rousseau's thought. Dent writes both clearly and intelligently. He quotes extensively from Rousseau's work in order, he states, to acquaint the reader with Rousseau's 'manner and style' (p 2). This makes the book especially suitable for those who are just beginning to study Rousseau. Nevertheless, the book should be of considerable interest to those readers who are familiar with Rousseau and Rousseau scholarship. For it presents, in a concise and accessible way, a coherent and original account of Rousseau's work. The book should also, due to its emphasis on amour-propre, interest anyone concerned with the politics of recognition. For Dent has shown that a concern with mutual recognition runs like a red thread through Rousseau's social and political thought.