2006.11.10

Thomas Sattig

The Language and Reality of Time

Thomas Sattig, The Language and Reality of Time, Oxford University Press, 2006, 232pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199279527.

Reviewed by Berit Brogaard, University of Missouri


The Language and Reality of Time (LRT) is a brilliant book -- one of the best essays in metaphysics since Ted Sider's Four-dimensionalism. Sattig tackles a difficult question: that of how ordinary temporal facts are grounded in facts about physical spacetime. Sattig's answer proceeds in three steps. First he argues that ordinary temporal facts supervene on facts about spacetime. He then offers an analysis of predicational claims of the form 'a is F at t'. Finally, he uses this analysis to develop a new account of how ordinary facts about persistence and change supervene on facts about spacetime. Along the way, he fends off a vast number of competing views.

The main aim of LRT is to offer an account of how ordinary temporal facts supervene on facts about physical spacetime. Sattig assumes a pre-relativistic conception of spacetime (though he allows "excursions" to Minkowski spacetime, see p. 21). Pre-relativistic spacetime is a four-dimensional manifold of spacetime points ordered by the simultaneity and earlier-than relations. Accordingly, on the spacetime conception, there are points and regions, but no times or spatial locations. Admittedly, times could be defined as maximal sets of simultaneous spacetime points or regions. But if one is giving an account of how properties are instantiated in spacetime, it will not do to say that objects have their properties relative to times. For, as Sattig argues,

since property instantiation is meant to be explained purely in spacetime terms, saying that an occupant of spacetime has a property at a time does not amount to an account of spatiotemporal instantiation. The concept of a time as distinct from a place is confined to the ordinary conceptual scheme. Spacetime contains only points and regions. As a consequence, having a property in spacetime is unmodified by a time. (p. 23)

According to Sattig, 'truths about spacetime' cannot be tensed or 'modified by times' (p. 37). So, if ordinary temporal facts supervene on facts about spacetime, then tensed truths and truths modified by times must be reducible to tenseless truths that are not modified by times. As far as Sattig is concerned, the tensed claims of ordinary language can be reduced to temporal claims of the form 'a is F at t'. But, as claims about spacetime cannot be modified by times, claims of the form 'a is F at t' cannot be claims about spacetime. So, Sattig says, the first step toward an account of how ordinary temporal facts supervene on facts about physical spacetime is to show how claims of the form 'a is F at t' can be reduced to claims that are not modified by times.

Sattig takes the temporal adverbial 'at t' to function as a temporal operator that can be semantically reduced as follows (pp. 97ff):

a is F at t iff according to t, a is F

According to t, a is F iff t represents a as being F

x represents a as being F iff a has a representative at x that is F simpliciter

So, on Sattig's account of temporal predication, 'a is F at t' ultimately reduces to 'a has a representative at t that is F simpliciter'. A temporally extended object thus inherits the property of being F at t by being appropriately related to an entity that is F simpliciter. I discuss the two main candidates for being entities to which temporally extended objects are appropriately related below.

Ordinary temporal facts include facts about how objects persist and change over time. So, to show that ordinary temporal facts supervene on facts about spacetime, one must give a supervenience base for ordinary facts about persistence and change. The two main supervenience bases for such facts, Sattig says, are those specified by endurantism and perdurantism (or three-dimensionalism and four-dimensionalism, as they are also sometimes called).[1] As the views are standardly characterized, endurantism is the view that objects persist by being wholly present at different times, whereas perdurantism is the view that objects persist by having different temporal parts at different times. On the most popular version of the latter view, temporal parts just are spatio-temporal regions. Endurantists, on the other hand, typically insist that objects are never identical to spatio-temporal regions.[2]

Sattig offers an endurantist supervenience base (chap. 5). Objects are wholly present at multiple times; yet, they have properties at the times at which they are wholly present only insofar as the spatio-temporal regions they occupy at those times have those properties simpliciter. For example, Brit is a physical entity at t in virtue of the fact that Brit has a representative at t that is a physical entity simpliciter, viz. the instantaneous region at which she is located at t.

Sattig's view has some unexpected consequences, for instance, that spatio-temporal regions can be female, be happy, be married, be conscious, believe that it is raining, feel that the room is too hot, be mad at their spouse, and so forth. However, Sattig does a good job explaining why these unexpected consequences of his view are not counter to our intuitions (p. 170). The explanation turns on the fact that spatio-temporal regions, on his view, have properties simpliciter, not properties relative to times. Since our ordinary conceptual scheme involves objects that have properties only relative to times, we do not have intuitions about which properties instantaneous regions instantiate. As he puts it,

Since all our intuitions are temporally modified, and since regional instantiation is a doctrine concerning atemporal predications only, a doctrine that does not translate to the ordinary level, the question of the intuitive status of regional instantiation does not arise. (p. 170)

However, Sattig notices a problem for his view: property abstraction (pp. 183ff). Consider the following sentences:

(1) Brit is happy

(2) Brit is such that she is happy

Or: Brit has the property of being a thing x such that x is happy

(2) follows from (1) by property abstraction. Property abstraction is widely regarded as a valid move. But, as Sattig observes, property abstraction appears to make trouble for his view (p. 184). Take:

(3) At t, Brit is identical to Brit.

By property abstraction, we get:

(4) At t, Brit is such that she is identical to Brit.

Or: at t, Brit has the property of being a thing x such that x is identical to Brit.

But if Brit has the property at t of being a thing x such that x is identical to Brit, then the spatio-temporal region she occupies at t has the property of being a thing x such that x is identical to Brit simpliciter. This entails that the spacetime region Brit occupies at t is identical to Brit. But, on Sattig's view, Brit is distinct from the spacetime region she occupies at t.

As Sattig notes, it appears that property abstraction presents a difficulty, not only for his version of endurantism, but for 'any account of a's having a property at a time that ascribes the property to an entity that is distinct from a' (p. 187), for example, a version of perdurantism that ascribes a's having a property at a time t to a proper or improper temporal part of a at t. For if Brit is identical to Brit at t in virtue of the fact that Brit has a proper temporal part at t that has the property of being identical to Brit simpliciter, then Brit is identical to her proper parts!

Sattig offers the following solution to the problem of property abstraction (pp. 188ff). Property abstraction -- for instance, the move from (1) to (2), or the move from (3) to (4) -- is indeed valid, but it is trivially valid. For (2) just has the same logical form as (1), and (4) just has the same logical form as (3). In other words, (2) and (4) are pleonastic paraphrases of (1) and (3). Since (3) does not pose a problem for the regional instantiation account, neither does (4).

However, I think that this move is unlikely to help. Consider the following sentence:

(5) Every one of the students is happy.

(5) contains a partitive noun phrase that embeds a definite description, viz., 'every one of the students'. By property abstraction we get (X is a plural variable, see Boolos 1984):

(6) The students are such that every one of them is happy.

Or: The students X are things X such that every one of the Xs is happy.

But it is widely agreed that sentences like (5) have the logical form given by (6) (Jackendoff 1977: 118-19, Cartwright 1996: 151-52, Abbott 1996, Brogaard forthcoming). Property abstraction reflects genuine syntactical movement.

But now, consider the following sentence:

(7) At t, every one of the US presidents is identical to Bush.

By property abstraction/movement, we get:

(8) At t, the US presidents X are things X such that every one of the Xs is identical to Bush.

Following Boolos (1984), we suppose that plural existential quantification does not incur a commitment to more than one entity of the kind in question. So, if t is some time during 2006, then (8) is true.

Given Sattig's position, it follows that the regions occupied by the US presidents at t are things X such that every one of the Xs is identical to Bush. As we have just seen, the surface form of (8) is syntactically real. So the triviality move won't help in this case. Since it is not an option for Sattig to insist that the regions occupied by Bush at t have the property of being things X such that every one of the Xs is identical to Bush, it appears that Sattig's account of temporal predication must be rejected.

Is there a different account of how ordinary temporal facts supervene on facts about spacetime which avoids this undesirable consequence? I think that there is. Before concluding I shall offer a brief outline of such an account.[3] I suggest that we take as our starting point the semantics offered by David Kaplan in "Demonstratives". Kaplan here argues that some sentences express, relative to ordinary contexts, temporal propositions. For instance, the sentence 'Brit is bent-shaped' expresses, relative to ordinary contexts, the minimal structured content that Brit is bent-shaped. This minimal content counts as a temporal proposition iff it determines a function from (worlds and) times to truth-values, or (in a different terminology) a set of centered worlds, in Lewis' (1979) sense.[4] The minimal content that Brit is bent-shaped is true with respect to <w, t> iff at <w, t> Brit is bent-shaped. 'At <w, t>' can either be treated as an irreducible operator on temporal propositions (see below) or be assigned one of the following meta-linguistic truth-conditions: 'at <w, t> a is F' is true iff a has-at-<w, t> a temporal part that has the property of being F, or 'at <w, t> a is F' is true iff a instantiates-at-<w, t> the property of being F (see Johnston 1987: 129).

As minimal structured contents do not contain any time constituents, such entities are not ruled out by the spacetime conception. Granted, minimal structured contents such as Brit is bent-shaped are normally taken to be true or false only relative to times, but if we want our semantics to be expressible in terms of spacetime concepts, then minimal structured contents must be taken to be true or false relative to hyperplanes, i.e., maximal sets of simultaneous spacetime points or regions. More precisely: in a spacetime meta-language, temporal propositions are true or false relative to pairs.

Now, if we follow Sattig (p. 26) in taking facts to be true propositions, then temporal propositions that are true relative to hyperplanes are facts about hyperplanes. But for each temporal proposition, a is F, which is a fact about one or more times, there is a fact about one or more hyperplanes that entails it. For example, the temporal fact that Brit is bent-shaped is entailed by the hyperplane fact that Brit is bent-shaped.[5] It follows that facts about times, such as the fact that Brit is bent-shaped, supervene on facts about hyperplanes.

What goes for temporal propositions without temporal operators goes for tensed propositions. As mentioned above, Sattig thinks that there cannot be tensed claims within the spacetime conception. Here is Sattig:

If there are no times t in spacetime, then there are no temporal modifiers 'at t' either. So truths about spacetime cannot be modified by times. What holds for times, holds for past, present, and future: if there are no past, present, and future in spacetime, then there are no tense operators 'WAS' and 'WILL', and no implicit present tense either. (p. 37)

As Kaplan (1989) made vivid, however, that is not quite right. To see why not, consider the following future-tensed sentence:

(9) There will be people inhabiting the moon

In Kaplan-style semantics, 'it will be the case that' is an operator on content and index. It shifts the time parameter of the default index of evaluation determined by the context of use from the time of speech t* to some time t such that t* is earlier than t. As the embedded content people inhabit the moon determines a function from pairs to truth-values, so does the tensed proposition there will be people inhabiting the moon. Past- and future-tensed propositions are thus temporal propositions.[6]

If there are hyperplanes in the indices of evaluation rather than times, as dictated by the spacetime conception, then tensed propositions will be true or false, not with respect to pairs, but with respect to pairs. Thus, relative to h1>, the proposition that people will inhabit the moon is true iff people inhabit the moon is true relative to h2>, where h1 is earlier than h2. Within the spacetime conception, tensed propositions that are true with respect to a given hyperplane in spacetime are facts about hyperplanes. But, as we have seen, for each temporal proposition, which is a fact about one or more times, there is a fact about one or more hyperplanes that entails it. For example, the temporal fact that people will inhabit the moon is entailed by the hyperplane fact that people will inhabit the moon. It follows that tensed facts about times, such as the fact that people will inhabit the moon, supervene on tensed facts about hyperplanes.

Admittedly, temporal propositions that are true with respect to hyperplanes are facts about hyperplanes, not facts about spacetime in its entirety. But facts about spacetime in its entirety are easy to come by. Consider:

(10) The temporal proposition that Brit has a bent shape is true at hyperplane h.

(11) The temporal proposition that Brit has a bent shape is true with respect to some hyperplane.

On their preferred reading, (10) and (11) do not express temporal propositions; i.e. propositions that are true or false only relative to hyperplanes. Rather, (10) and (11) express eternal propositions, propositions that have the same truth-values with respect to all instantaneous regions of spacetime. Such propositions determine functions from worlds (or spacetimes) to truth-values.

The assumption that there are eternal propositions is not at odds with the assumption that there are temporal propositions. As Kaplan (1989) points out, sentences have structured contents as their semantic values. These contents determine an intension, i.e., a function from indices to truth-values. The content of present-tensed sentences such as

(12) I am giving a talk at 1 p.m. on July 5, 2006 European Central Time

which make explicit reference to a time, will determine a function from worlds to truth-values. The contents expressed by such sentences, if true (false) at any time, are true (false) at all times, and so are eternal. The content of sentences without temporal adverbials may also determine functions from worlds to truth-values rather than functions from pairs to truth-values. Consider, for instance:

(13) Socrates is self-identical

(14) There is someone who is identical to Socrates

(15) Objects persist over time

(16) The universe is four-dimensional

On their typical uses, the contents expressed by (13)-(16), if true (false) at any time, are true (false) at all times, and so are eternal.[7] Since they are eternal, they determine functions from worlds to truth-values. So, if they are true with respect to the world as a whole, then they are facts about the world as a whole.

Facts about persistence and change can also be captured within the semantic framework outlined by Kaplan (1989).[8] According to our ordinary conceptual scheme, objects persist through change by having different properties at different times. The supervenience base for ordinary facts of the form 'a has the property of being bent-shaped at t1 and the property of being straight-shaped at t2' are facts of the form 'the temporal proposition a is bent-shaped is true relative to hyperplane h1 and false relative to hyperplane h2'. In standard semantics, a proposition p and its negation are contradictories iff they are evaluated at the same index of evaluation. So, 'a is bent-shaped is true relative to h1 and false relative to h2' is not contradictory.

Sattig considers and rejects an account of change that is akin in spirit to the account just offered (pp. 77ff). Let us follow Sattig in calling the account he considers the 'intensional account of change'. The intensional account is one that takes temporal adverbials of the form 'at t' to be a semantically irreducible operator on temporal propositions. Sattig notes that given the intensional account, a sentence like 'Brit is happy at t1 and unhappy at t2' does not imply the contradictory 'Brit is happy and unhappy'. But he thinks the intensional account is unsuccessful.

One problem for the intensional account, Sattig says, is posed by cases of cross-temporal predication (p. 83). As an example of cross-temporal predication, consider the following sentence (from Sattig):

(17) Brit, and only Brit, is happy at t1 and sad at t2

(17) requires cross-temporal predication. (17) must be read as 'at t1(Brit is happy) and at t2(Brit is sad) and for all x, if x is happy at t1, and x is sad at t2, then x = Brit'. So the universal quantifier and the identity predicate are not within the scope of any temporal operators.

However, the problem of cross-temporal predication is not insuperable. It can be avoided as follows. Given Kaplan-style semantics, whether or not a given structured content of a sentence determines a function from worlds to truth-values or a function from worlds and times to truth-values is not encoded in the structure of the sentence or the linguistic meaning of the sentence constituents. So, it is open to argue that the (structured) semantic value of a predicate can determine two kinds of intensions: a function from worlds to extensions or a function from pairs to extensions (Brogaard forthcoming: chap. 4). The relevant reading of the identity predicate in cross-time predicational claims is, of course, one where the semantic value determines a function from worlds to objects that stand to themselves in the identity relation. So, (17) is unproblematic for the Kaplanian account.

Sattig raises another problem for the intensional account: that of property sharing. If an abstract object has a property, then it does not have it relative to a particular time, for it does not exist in time. But, Sattig says, on the intensional account, physical objects instantiate properties only relative to times. So, it would seem that physical objects cannot have any property in common with abstract objects (not even the property of being identical to something!).[9]

However, the problem of property sharing arises only if one takes the intensions determined by the contents of predicates to be properties. But, pace Egan (2004), properties are not functions from indices of evaluation to extensions. At best, properties are the contents of predicates. So when an object has a given property, it has that property simpliciter. For example, the structured minimal content expressed by 'Brit has the property of being happy', on its standard reading, is true or false only relative to a time. But with respect to the times at which it is true, Brit instantiates the property of being happy simpliciter. In other words, if the semantic values of predicates are properties, then it is these properties that determine intensions. But the intension of a predicate can be either a function from worlds to extensions or a function from pairs to extensions. So, the property itself cannot be a function from worlds to extensions or a function from pairs to extensions. But now, if a physical object can have a given property simpliciter, then it can, of course, also share this property with an abstract object.

Before closing, a loose end must be tied. We haven't yet offered an account of the supervenience of ordinary persistence facts on facts about spacetime. However, such an account naturally emerges once we realize that the fact that the A-facts supervene on the B-facts cannot itself be an A-fact or a B-fact. It must be a C-fact, where C-facts encompass A-facts and B-facts. Now, under the ordinary conception, an object persists iff it exists at multiple times. Since 'exists at' figures in both the spacetime and the ordinary conception, let us take the extension of 'B-exists at' to be sets of ordered pairs of objects and hyperplanes, and let us take the extension of 'A-exists at' to be sets of ordered pairs of objects and times. 'B-exist' and 'A-exist' have different intensions in spite of having the same linguistic meaning. Within the C-conception, each fact of the form x A-exists at multiple times is entailed by a fact of the form x B-exists at multiple hyperplanes (see note 5). So, facts of the form x A-exists at multiple times supervene on facts of the form x B-exists at multiple hyperplanes. But since 'A-exist', 'B-exist' and 'exist' are synonyms, facts of the form x exists at multiple times supervene on facts of the form x exists at multiple hyperplanes.

Notice that the Kaplanian account offered here is consistent with both endurantism and perdurantism, which is as it should be. For, the spacetime conception leaves open the question of whether things have temporal parts. As Sider puts it

science is certainly relevant to metaphysics since inconsistency with a firmly established scientific theory is as good a reason against a theory as one could ask for. But science invariably leaves many questions open. One of these, I think, is whether things have temporal parts (2001: xiv).

Moreover, even perdurantists have reasons to accept the account offered here. For, on the temporal parts analysis, 'I am not instantaneous' cashes out to 'I do not have a temporal part that is instantaneous'. But that is false. So, if the perdurantist were to subject all sentences to a temporal parts analysis, then she would be forced to render 'I am not instantaneous' false.

On the Kaplanian approach, the sentence 'I am not instantaneous' expresses, relative to my context of utterance, the minimal structured content that Brit is not instantaneous, where the semantic value of 'Brit' is a worm (if perdurantism is true). As I am using the sentence, the minimal structured content determines a function from worlds to truth-values. Relative to the world at which I am speaking, it is true that Brit -- the worm -- is not instantaneous. Most importantly, unlike Sattig's regional instantiation account, the Kaplanian approach offered here is not threatened by property abstraction. The Kaplanian approach thus appears to inherit the virtues of Sattig's account without suffering from its drawbacks.

As is customary in the business of review writing, I have in the previous sections primarily been engaged in criticism, but I would like to conclude by briefly considering some of LRT's key strengths. LRT is one of the most rigorous, thorough and lucid essays in metaphysics that I have seen in many years. It offers a vast number of ingenious objections to old solutions to the problems of change and persistence, such as, the relational account and adverbialism. Furthermore, by focusing on the puzzle of temporal supervenience, Sattig offers what is, in my opinion, an entirely new way of approaching old metaphysical debates, such as that between endurantism and perdurantism. Though, in a sense, the puzzle of temporal supervenience has lain beneath most of these debates, other works in metaphysics have not placed this puzzle at the center of their investigations. Sattig's new way of approaching the puzzles of persistence and change will no doubt inspire metaphysical debates for a long time to come.

References

Abbott, B. 1996. "Doing without a partitive constraint." J. Hoeksema, ed. Partitives: Studies on the syntax and semantics of partitive and related constructions, Groningen-Amsterdam Studies in Semantics (GRASS) 14, Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter, 25-56.

Boolos, G. 1984. "To Be is to Be the Value of a Variable (or to Be Some Values of Some Variables)", Journal of Philosophy 81, pp. 430-450.

Brogaard, B. Forthcoming, a. "The But not All: a New Theory of Plural Definite Descriptions", Mind and Language.

________, Forthcoming, b. Transient Truths -- an Essay in the Metaphysics of Propositions.

Cartwright, H. M. 1996. "Some of a Plurality", Nous 30, 137-157.

Egan, A. 2004. "Second-Order Predication and the Metaphysics of Properties", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 82/1 pp.48-66, 2004. Reprinted in Lewisian Themes, Frank Jackson and Graham Priest, eds., Oxford University Press, 2004.

Haslanger, S. 1989. "Endurance and Temporary Intrinsics", Analysis 49: 119-25.

Jackendoff, R. 1977. X Syntax: A Study of Phrase Structure, Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.

Johnston, M. 1987. "Is There a Problem About Persistence?" Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, supp. Vol. 61: 107-35.

Kaplan, D. 1989. "Demonstratives", Almog, Perry and Wettstein, eds., Themes from Kaplan, New York: Oxford University Press.

Lewis, D. 1979. 'Attitudes de dicto and de se', The Philosophical Review 88: 513--43. Reprinted with postscript in Philosophical Papers I, Oxford University Press, 1983, 133--160.

________, 2002. "Tensing the Copula", Mind 111: 1-13.

McDaniel, K. 2004. "Modal Realism with Overlap", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 82: 137-152. (Reprinted in Lewisian Themes, edited by Frank Jackson and Graham Priest, Oxford University Press, September 2004.)

Sider, T. 2001. Four-Dimensionalism: An ontology of persistence and time, Oxford: Clarendon Press.


[1] See e.g. Sider (2001: intro).

[2] See e.g. Kris McDaniel (2004).

[3] I shall follow Sattig in taking spacetime to be pre-relativistic spacetime. In Minskowski spacetime, simultaneity needs to be treated as relative to frames of reference. Accordingly, there are only frame-relative facts about spacetime regions.

[4] A centered world is just a world marked with a center. The center is often taken to be an individual and a time, but it can also simply be a time.

[5] I do not think 'time' is reducible to 'hyperplane'. For 'time' and 'hyperplane' clearly have distinct linguistic meanings. However, for any time t, there is a hyperplane h whose existence entails the existence of t, not within the spacetime conception, nor within the ordinary conception, but rather within the conception used to state supervenience facts. A-facts supervene on B-facts iff the A-facts are logically entailed by B-facts (or "you cannot wriggle the top facts without wriggling the base facts"). But the fact that the A-facts are logically entailed by B-facts cannot itself be an A-fact or a B-fact. It must be a C-fact, where C-facts encompass both A-facts and B-facts. But now, for any time t, there is a maximal set s of simultaneous spacetime points or regions, such that the existence of s C-entails the existence of t. So, within the C-conception, times logically supervene on hyperplanes.

[6] I shall ignore semantically redundant tense operators, i.e., tense operators that operate on eternal propositions.

[7] Even the structured content Socrates is sitting may determine two kinds of intension: a function from worlds to truth-values, and a function from pairs to truth-values. But the minimal content Socrates is sitting and the negation Socrates is not sitting cannot have the same truth-value. So, if Socrates is sitting is truth-evaluable, then it and its negation must have opposite truth-values. But then Socrates is sitting is not truth-evaluable with respect to worlds where Socrates is sitting at some times and standing at others, for with respect to such worlds, there is no way in which Socrates is sitting or Socrates is not sitting could be assigned opposite truth-values.

[8] See Sally Haslanger (1989). Lewis (2002) is worried that Haslanger's account does not explain the metaphysical problem of change. The endurantist might offer the following meta-linguistic truth-conditions for 'at t a is F': 'at t a is F' is true iff a instantiates-at-t the property of being F' (Johnston 1987). Lewis finds this approach inadequate, as it makes the instantiation relation multi-grade. However, it is open to argue that the requirement that instantiation be a dyadic relation begs the question against the endurantist and the believer in entities wholly present at more than one world. Moreover, even if Lewis' concern is reasonable, it does not cast doubt on the Kaplanian account, as the Kaplanian account remains neutral in the disagreement between perdurantism and endurantism (see below).

[9] Sattig dismisses the problem of property sharing because he thinks even hardcore Platonists might deny that abstract objects have shapes and colors. However, the objection can then be run with the second-order property of existence.