2006.11.17

Stefano Predelli

Contexts: Meaning, Truth, and the Use of Language

Stefano Predelli, Contexts: Meaning, Truth, and the Use of Language, Oxford University Press, 2005, 198pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199281734.

Reviewed by Ben Caplan, Ohio State University


Stefano Predelli's deft and pithy first book, Contexts: Meaning, Truth, and the Use of Language, is sometimes surprising and always rewarding. But, contrary to what one might infer from its title and subtitle, it isn't really a work of semantics about the role of context and the relations among meaning, truth, and the use of language.

First, Predelli's book isn't as much a work of semantics as it is a work of meta-semantics. Instead of defending the details of this or that approach to this or that linguistic construction, Predelli defends a highly general view that lots of people who take different approaches (following e.g. Richard Montague, Donald Davidson, David Kaplan, David Lewis) to various linguistic constructions can agree on. The view is the traditional one that interpretive systems, which map inputs (something like sentence-context pairs) to outputs (something like truth-conditions), play a role in assigning truth-conditions to utterances. Despite being widely held, the traditional view is worth defending, since it has recently been attacked by radical contextualists (e.g. François Recanati, Charles Travis, Robyn Carston).

Second, Predelli's book isn't as much about contexts, which are worldly situations in which speakers utter sentences, as it is about indexes, which are something like ordered n-tuples of agents, times, locations, and worlds. Predelli is a neo-traditionalist. Unlike traditional traditionalists, he argues that the inputs of interpretive systems include, not worldly contexts, but rather abstract indexes. (Predelli also argues that the inputs include pre-disambiguated clauses rather than potentially ambiguous sentences, but that difference is less momentous.)

Third, Predelli's book isn't as much about the relations that meaning, truth, and the use of language do stand in as it is about the relations that they don't stand in. Traditional traditionalists might have thought that meaning, at least insofar as it pertains to what interpretative systems do to their inputs, has something to do with truth, at least in the form of truth-conditions. But Predelli's neo-traditionalism isn't limited to denying that interpretive systems have as their inputs sentence-context pairs; he also denies that interpretive systems have as their outputs truth-conditions, which assign truth-values to worldly situations. Instead, Predelli argues that interpretive systems have as their outputs what he calls "t-distributions," which assign truth-values to points of evaluation. (Points of evaluation include worldly situations. But they also include something more: standards of evaluation, purposes of classification, or the like. Other neo-traditionalists (e.g. John MacFarlane) have been arguing for this sort of view.) Since t-distributions are not truth-conditions, Predelli thus denies that, on their own, interpretive systems tell us anything about truth-conditions.

There is a further respect in which Predelli thinks that meaning, on the one hand, is divorced from truth and the use of language, on the other. This has to do with logical truth, which Predelli identifies with truth in virtue of meaning. One might have thought that a sentence is a logical truth if and only if it cannot be uttered falsely. But Predelli argues that some sentences that cannot be uttered falsely (e.g. 'I exist', 'I am here now', 'Something exists') are not logical truths and, conversely, that some sentences that are logical truths (e.g. 'If this table is 120cm long, then this table is at least 119.999cm long', 'I never address youinformal formally if and only if I never address youformal formally'[1]) can be uttered falsely.

In Chapter 1, Predelli presents his neo-traditional view. In Chapter 2, he argues against the view that the inputs of interpretive systems include contexts and for the view that the inputs include indexes instead. He shows how the index-friendly view can handle voicemail messages (e.g. 'I am not here now') and truth in fiction (e.g. 'Salieri poisoned Mozart', uttered while talking about the film Amadeus). In Chapter 3, he argues against the view that the inputs of interpretive systems are sentence tokens (rather than clause-index pairs), and he shows how the index-friendly view can handle approximation (e.g. 'This table is 120cm long', uttered when the table is exactly 119.995cm long). In Chapter 4, he uses the distinction between truth-conditions and t-distributions to show how the traditional view can accommodate the sorts of intuition (e.g. the intuition that different utterances of 'The leaves are green' have different truth-values, even though the worldly situation remains unchanged) that radical contextualists have used against it. And, in Chapter 5, he uses the distinction between truth-conditions and t-distributions again, this time to show how the traditional view can accommodate the sorts of intuition about belief ascription (e.g. the intuition that utterances of 'Pat believes that Bush did not receive a majority of votes in 2000' and 'Pat believes that Dubya did not receive a majority of votes in 2000' can have different truth-values, even if Pat's cognitive situation is unchanged) without giving up the assumptions (e.g. that names are directly referential, that belief reports are relational) that are often thought to lead to trouble.

According to traditional traditionalists, the route from utterance to truth-conditions is fairly direct: take the sentence that was uttered; pair it with the context that it was uttered in; and an interpretive system will yield the desired truth-conditions. According to Predelli, by contrast, the route from utterance to truth-conditions is doubly indirect. First, we need bridge principles ("suitable additional hypotheses," 159) to get us from the sentence that was uttered and the context that it was uttered in, on the one hand, to a clause-index pair, on the other. As Predelli argues in Chapter 2 (and in previous work), getting to the appropriate clause-index pair isn't always a trivial task: sometimes the appropriate index will contain an agent who isn't located at the time, location, and world of the index (Predelli uses such indexes for voicemail messages like 'I am not here now'); and sometimes the appropriate index will contain a non-actual world (Predelli uses such indexes for truth in fiction). Second, we need bridge principles to get us from t-distributions to truth-conditions. These principles tell us what standards or purposes are appropriate. (Although Predelli doesn't elaborate on this, the principles in effect tell us which point of evaluation is included in the appropriate index.) As Predelli argues in Chapters 4 and 5, getting the appropriate standards or purposes isn't always a trivial task either: sometimes the appropriate standards or purposes shift across utterances of the same sentence, even when the worldly situation is otherwise unchanged (Predelli uses such shifts for 'The leaves are green'); and sometimes the appropriate standards or purposes will shift across utterances of different sentences that have the same t-distribution, again even when the worldly situation is otherwise unchanged (Predelli uses such shifts for 'Pat believes that Bush did not receive a majority of votes in 2000' and 'Pat believes that Dubya did not receive a majority of votes in 2000'). Without both sets of bridge principles, no interpretive system tells us anything about the truth-conditions of any utterance. One might find this result disheartening, if one were expecting interpretive systems to tell us something about the truth-conditions of utterances. But Predelli encourages us to revise our expectations: "there is little point in demanding an analysis of an utterance's truth-conditions from structures that are not devised either to take utterances as their input or to yield truth-conditions as their output" (185). (In much the same vein, Predelli remarks that, although on their own, interpretive systems are incapable of assigning truth-conditions to utterances, they are also "inefficient at making a good cup of coffee or resolving domestic disputes" (27).)

The need for bridge principles of the first sort (those that take us from sentence-context pairs to clause-index pairs) reveals a weakness in one of Predelli's arguments against a context-friendly (as opposed to index-friendly) view. On what Predelli calls "The Many Characters View," indexical expressions (like 'I', 'now', or 'here') are associated with many characters, each of which is a function from worldly contexts (rather than abstract indexes) to contents. Predelli objects to The Many Characters View on the grounds that "it could take [certain examples] into account only by associating the indexical expressions at issue with new characters, devised in an ad hoc fashion in order to obtain the desired interpretations" (57). But Predelli has to come up with bridge principles that take us from contexts to indexes; and either he does so in "an ad hoc fashion in order to obtain the desired results," in which case those who endorse The Many Characters View can justly accuse him of a tu quoque, or he does so in a principled way (say, by appealing to speaker intentions), in which case those who endorse The Many Characters View can steal his principles and use them to associate the indexical expression with the right characters.

The need for bridge principles of the second sort (those that take us from t-distributions to truth-conditions) raises the question of what is at issue between neo-traditionalists and radical contextualists. In propositional terms, a radical contextualist might say that which proposition is expressed by my utterance of 'The leaves are green' depends on (say) the purposes of the conversational exchange that I'm engaged in (and that that proposition is then evaluated for truth or falsity at something like a world-time pair). By contrast, Predelli would say that, although which proposition is expressed by my utterance of 'The leaves are green' doesn't depend on the purposes of the conversational exchange that I'm engaged in, that proposition is evaluated for truth or falsity at something like a world-time-purpose triple, so whether that proposition -- and hence my utterance -- is true or false does depend on the purposes of the conversational exchange that I'm engaged in. On this view, "so-called pragmatic infiltrations [e.g. purpose] do unquestionably contaminate an utterance's truth-conditional profile" (186). Radical contextualists might want to insist that "pragmatic infiltrations" occur before the propositional stage; or they might be happy as long as those infiltrations occur somewhere or other before the truth-conditional stage. If the latter, then there is nothing about neo-traditionalism for them to find objectionable. If the former, then Predelli has responded to their initial arguments against the traditional view (since neo-traditionalism can accommodate the troublesome intuitions), but he does not consider what further arguments they might have for preferring radical contextualism over neo-traditionalism, nor does he give us reason to prefer neo-traditionalism over radical contextualism. This is an advance, but we are left waiting for the next step.

Since it is a work of meta-semantics, Predelli's book is easier to follow if one is already familiar with various traditional or radical-contextualist semantic views. Still, it is a book that everyone who is interested in those views -- and indeed all philosophers of language -- should read.


[1] Or, in French, 'Je ne t'addresse jamais d'une manière formelle si et seulement si je ne vous addresse jamais d'une manière formelle'.