2007.01.05

Nomy Arpaly

Merit, Meaning, and Human Bondage: An Essay on Free Will

Nomy Arpaly, Merit, Meaning, and Human Bondage: An Essay on Free Will, Princeton University Press, 2006, 158pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691124337.

Reviewed by Angela M. Smith, University of Washington


Nomy Arpaly’s new book represents a nice companion piece to her earlier work, Unprincipled Virtue (Oxford, 2003). In her first book, Arpaly developed a “quality-of-will” based account of moral worth, and argued that agent-autonomy — in the sense of deliberative self-control - is not a necessary condition of moral praise or blameworthiness. Her aim in this first book was to challenge conceptions of moral psychology that give pride of place to the first-person deliberative perspective, and to argue that we need a richer conception of moral agency to accommodate the lived complexity of moral life. In this new book, Arpaly turns her attention to more metaphysical concerns, asking whether the truth of determinism would preclude moral responsibility, reasons-responsiveness, or the ability to lead meaningful lives. Though she answers “no” to these questions — we can still live responsible, rational, meaningful lives in a deterministic setting — she concedes that her own view is still “bittersweet” (p. 5), for there remains a type of freedom that we cannot have if determinism is true. This is the freedom of “absolute self-authorship,” and Arpaly regards the desire for such freedom as entirely understandable, even if it should turn out that such a notion is, ultimately, “incoherent” (p. 127).

In the first chapter, Arpaly provides an overview of the theory of praiseworthiness and blameworthiness she defended in Unprincipled Virtue. On this theory, people are praiseworthy for acts of good will and blameworthy for acts of ill will or lack of good will. Good will, ill will, and lack of good will, in turn, are defined in terms of responsiveness to moral reasons. A person who in fact responds to good moral reasons — whether she herself is aware of this or not — acts out of good will, while a person who in fact fails to respond to moral reasons, or acts for reasons that make his action wrong, displays either moral indifference or ill will. Her view also allows for degrees of praiseworthiness and blameworthiness, depending on the circumstances and how hard or easy it is for the agent in those circumstances to do the right thing. After spelling out her theory of praiseworthiness and blameworthiness, and showing some of its advantages over incompatibilist views that make the exercise of “contra-causal freedom” a precondition of moral assessment, Arpaly briefly discusses the nature of blame and explains why she does not rely on the Strawsonian idea of “reactive attitudes” to ground her account.

In Chapter 2, Arpaly addresses an important objection to her quality-of-will account of moral worth: Can there be such a thing as “reason responsiveness” in a deterministic world? The worry here is that if causal determinism is true, our “responses” to reasons are really no different than a robot moving in response to the inputs of its programmer, or a glass breaking in response to a high, clear note. In response, Arpaly argues persuasively that accepting this view would require us to reject standard materialistic accounts of mental causation in which mental content plays an important role. With the use of many creative and illustrative examples (a hallmark of her work to date), Arpaly distinguishes between what she calls “robot causation,” “content-efficacious causation,” and “reasons responsiveness,” and argues that there is no reason to think that the truth of determinism would leave us stuck at the level of either robot causation or mere content-efficacious causation. Arpaly then goes on to suggest, again quite plausibly, that in everyday life our explanations of people’s behavior usually involve “a mixture of the reason-responsive, the merely-content-responsive, and the robot-like — and woven fine, too” (p. 72).

In Chapter 3, Arpaly argues that the fundamental intuition driving incompatibilism about moral responsibility is the familiar principle that “ought implies can,” and the thought that, in a deterministic universe, there is no sense to be made of the idea that a person can do anything she does not do. Arpaly argues against this principle directly, using the case of responsiveness to epistemic reasons as an example. Most philosophers (and ordinary folk) accept the view that we do not have voluntary control over our beliefs. That is to say, we cannot simply “choose” or “decide” what to believe in the way that we ordinarily can choose or decide to raise our arm. Yet, Arpaly points out, most of us also believe that there are genuine epistemic norms, norms that we sometimes violate: we sometimes believe things we ought not to believe, and draw inferences we should not draw. To say that we “ought not” to believe X or that we “should not” have drawn a certain inference, however, does not imply that we could simply have chosen to believe differently. We can choose to engage in certain activities that will make it more likely that we will come to hold a certain belief, but that is different from saying that we have control over our beliefs themselves. When it comes to beliefs, therefore, it appears “ought” does not imply “can”: “epistemic norms do not come with corresponding abilities to act so as to meet the norms” (p. 101). Arpaly then suggests that a similar claim can be made about moral oughts: we cannot normally choose what we care about, but we “get moral credits for being moved by duty” (p. 108). In this respect, Arpaly claims, “morality and normative epistemology are a lot more similar than it seems” (ibid.).

After engaging in a short interlude to discuss “The Science Fiction of Mind Design,” Arpaly concludes with a chapter discussing the desire many people still have for what she calls “absolute self-authorship” (p. 127). She argues that compatibilists about responsibility, reasons-responsiveness, and meaning in life are often too dismissive of the yearning some people have not only to have their actions be determined by their deepest concerns, but also to have control over what those deepest concerns are. Some of us, she claims, "want a self apart from our mental states that can choose them at will. We want freedom" (p. 126). Though Arpaly herself finds this notion of “absolute self-authorship” incoherent, she argues that, nevertheless, it is still something we can legitimately wish for, and something we can regret not having.

Overall, this is an elegantly written, provocative, and refreshingly different approach to questions of free will and moral responsibility. As with her earlier book, Arpaly does not show much interest in discussing or responding in detail to the work of others, but prefers to approach her topic from a more general intuitive perspective. This is not meant as a criticism: I think it is worthwhile to step back from what has become a very technical (and, in my estimation, often rather sterile) literature on these issues to ask more general questions about what kind of freedom, if any, we really need in order to lead responsible and meaningful lives. Arpaly also does an excellent job of reminding us of the many contexts in which we positively embrace notions of necessity: “It had to be you,” “Here I stand, I can do no other,” “This book had to be written,” etc. These cases, which Arpaly refers to as cases of “romantic necessity,” seem to show that we do not always take determinism to be incompatible with deep forms of love, responsible action, and meaning. And her insightful discussion of the complex relations between reason responsiveness and freedom is a real contribution to the literature.

Nevertheless, I do have some quibbles. One quibble concerns the rather large number of passages and, in some cases, whole sections that have been lifted directly from Unprincipled Virtue. This is not a long book to begin with (137 pages of text); yet large chunks of it have simply been reprinted from her earlier book (in many cases without any explicit acknowledgment of this fact).1 This is particularly unfortunate, because Arpaly is such a creative and imaginative writer that it would have been nice to see some new examples and arguments put forward in defense of her views.

More substantively, I would have liked to have seen a more detailed discussion of Strawson’s view and how her own theory departs from it, as well as a more careful sorting out of the difference between judgments of blameworthiness, on the one hand, and attitudes of blame, on the other. Regarding the latter issue, at certain points in the first chapter Arpaly is careful to distinguish these notions, suggesting that to judge a person blameworthy is to judge that she has performed a wrong action out of ill will (or lack of good will), while blaming involves both recognizing that a blameworthy action has been performed and disapproving of such actions and the person who performs them (pp. 25-28). In her discussion of constitutive luck, however, she seems to muddy this distinction:

To hold someone blameworthy is not, in itself, to hold that any course of action is appropriate in regard to him, but to hold that a certain attitude toward him is epistemically rational: there was ill will, there was a wrong act, thus blame is warranted. In this way, on my view, blame is analogous to holding someone to be a bad businessman or a lousy artist. (p. 35)

But it seems clear that we can judge someone to be a bad businessman, a lousy artist, or (to use another of her examples) “stupid,” without thinking that we are warranted in feeling disapproval toward him for these traits. If, as she suggests earlier, blame goes beyond judgments of blameworthiness insofar as it involves attitudes of disapproval, then the analogy with assessments of business acumen, artistic competence, and intelligence seems inapt. While I quite agree with Arpaly that it is a mistake to see blame as analogous to punishment, I think it is also a mistake to see blame as analogous to mere fault-finding assessment. What makes blame so tricky, in my view, is precisely that it falls in between these two categories: to blame is not to punish, nor is it merely to negatively assess; it essentially involves the making of a demand, a demand for reasonable regard. If that is correct, then it seems the question about whether blame is “warranted” cannot simply be reduced to the question of whether a wrong act has been performed from ill will. We must also ask whether the demand for reasonable regard implicit in blame is itself justified in the circumstances. Those who view determinism as a threat to responsibility, presumably, think that in a deterministic setting a demand for reasonable regard is not justified, because the agents to whom it is addressed do not have the ability to meet that demand. While Arpaly indirectly addresses this worry in Chapter 3 (when she discusses the failure of “ought implies can” in the epistemic context), I think much more needs be said about this issue as it applies in the moral context.

This brings me to my most serious concern about the book, which is that Arpaly devotes very little time to explaining why her rejection of “ought implies can” in the epistemic context should be thought to have implications for its validity in the moral context. Though she does have a three-page section in which she asks "is there something special about the moral ought?" (p. 106), she does not seem to take this question seriously, and certainly does not discuss it in any detail. I myself am very sympathetic to the claim that there are close analogies between the epistemic case and moral case, but there seems, prima facie, to be a difference between the rational criticism of beliefs and the moral criticism of actions. It may turn out, at the end of the day, that this apparent difference is illusory (moral criticism may be just one species of rational criticism). But I think Arpaly’s argument would have been strengthened considerably if she had addressed this concern more fully.

Nevertheless, there is much to appreciate in this book. Arpaly’s careful analysis of reason responsiveness (and how it differs from other forms of mental causation) is rich and insightful, and the suggestion that moral philosophers should pay more attention to the way normative demands work in the epistemic context is highly suggestive. Her writing is engaging and blessedly unencumbered by tedious technical jargon. I recommend this book to anyone who is looking for a fresh perspective on this age-old philosophical problem.



1 This is perhaps somewhat more understandable in the first chapter, where Arpaly’s aim is to give a summary of the view of moral worth she defends in her earlier book. But passages from the earlier book appear in all but the final chapter of the new book, and the “Interlude” is taken almost in its entirety from that work.