Tim Lewens


Tim Lewens, Darwin, Routledge, 2006, 289pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780436382.

Reviewed by Michael T. Ghiselin, California Academy of Sciences

Although Darwin has had a profound influence on philosophy, he generally is considered a biologist, not a philosopher.  Nonetheless he was an active participant in philosophical discussions that are if anything even more relevant in our day than they were in his.  Therefore it seems quite appropriate to include him, along with other philosophical scientists, such as Kant and Freud, in the Routledge Philosophers series edited by Brian Leiter. 

Tim Lewens describes his book as a "philosophical introduction to Darwin."  He says that its ambitions are similar to those of my first book, The Triumph of the Darwinian Method (University of California Press, 1969).  It is of some interest to see how a book that was written by a young philosophical biologist at a time when the philosophy of biology was not yet a profession compares with one written by an outstanding representative of the new generation of professional philosophers of biology.  The idea that Darwin was seriously interested in philosophy, and much better at it than many authors have claimed, has certainly stood the test of time.  On the other hand, the perspectives of a philosophical biologist and a philosopher of biology, however complementary they may be, give a somewhat different slant on the same subject matter.  Lewens's professed goal is to consider what light Darwin's ideas can shed on matters of philosophical importance.  We might differ somewhat with respect to the relative importance of such matters.   To avoid giving a misleading impression I should state from the outset that the book succeeds admirably in presenting Darwin and his ideas to its intended audience.

In the first chapter Lewens gives his readers a general overview of Darwin's life and accomplishments.  As one might expect, he draws attention to various philosophers who at least attracted his attention, beginning with James Mackintosh whom Darwin met at his uncle's home while still in his teens.  It is all the more evident that Darwin was seriously concerned with epistemology, ontology, psychology, ethics and theology. 

The second chapter is on the philosophical implications of evolution and natural selection.  One topic, or group of topics, that might have received more attention somewhere in the book, is the epistemology of the historical sciences.  Darwin was a geologist, and a follower of Charles Lyell.  It seems to me that Darwin's ability to deal with the apparent lack of evidence for evolution in the fossil record was a major intellectual accomplishment.  He also was a comparative anatomist and a biogeographer.  Lewens not only says very little about such topics, he largely skips over the evidence for evolution both in general and for particular historical narratives.  Perhaps such topics as the principles of phylogenetics are not of much interest to contemporary philosophers.  Biologists on the other hand consider that aspect of their science very important, and that is one reason why systematic biology is so philosophical these days.

Lewens rather emphasizes the mechanistic aspect of Darwin's contribution, including the evidence for natural selection.  It is good to see sexual selection treated as important, though the point that sexual selection provides evidence for selection theory in general might have been made more forcefully.  In various places the exposition might have been improved by not saying that selection "acts" on something.  Selection is not an agent, and talking about it that way can be most misleading.  Perhaps this is as good a place as any to remark upon the tradition of treating philosophy as if it were just a lot of talk about talk.  I am pleased to see Lewens getting away from that tradition and grappling with the more substantive ontological and epistemological issues. 

Lewens says a lot about Darwin's views on purpose and design, and agrees with me that Darwin's use of the term "contrivance" was ironic.  On the other hand, he goes along with the notions of Daniel Dennett, a philosopher who wrote a book on such matters without having understood either the biology or the philosophical problem.  It is not a question of whether we might talk about evolution and sometimes mean the same thing irrespective of whether we invoke God or natural selection.  As I pointed out in my book The Economy of Nature and the Evolution of Sex (University of California Press, 1974), teleological thinking is undesirable because it so often leads to serious errors.  The mere fact that a fallacious argument can sometimes lead to true conclusions does not mean that it never leads to false conclusions.  We do not even need to ask what intentions are involved when we can get the right answer by asking the historical question of what has happened and why.

Lewens stumbles in his analysis of the struggle for existence.  He denies that modern evolutionary theory has an "essential" commitment to the Malthusian view.  He claims to have established this by showing that when there is a surfeit of resources there is no struggle for existence.  He uses the example of two kinds of wolves, slower and faster ones, with the faster wolves gaining relatively more resources than the slower ones.  The race may or may not be to the swift, but a race is a struggle in the theories of Malthus and Darwin.  Lewens should have read Malthus and Gause. 

Chapter 3 deals with species and essences.  Lewens discusses Darwin's views on species from the view of nominalism versus realism and comes up with a reasonable characterization.  I would only object that treating the natural system as Darwin saw it as a hierarchical system of resemblance does insufficient justice to Darwin's ontological stance.  The natural system is a hierarchy of genealogical relationships, not one of resemblances or similarities.  At the risk of anticipating what is said later in this review, scholastic philosophy would say that the essence of the natural system is genealogy, whereas the resemblances are mere accidents.  There follows a discussion on individuals and kinds, and especially whether species are individuals or kinds.  That species are individuals, not kinds, was proposed by David Hull and me many years ago, and it would seem that all the young philosophers of biology now accept it.  Lewens is no exception.  I was a bit puzzled by his assertion that "the terms 'individual' and 'kind' are modern inventions" (pp. 78-79), but I suppose he means simply that Darwin did not use those words as we do when discussing such matters.  Darwin did say that families are individuals and in so doing he was using the term 'individual' in a traditional philosophical sense.  Lewens suggests that the polymorphism of species and other biological populations makes it hard to interpret them as kinds.  There follows a discussion on population thinking versus typological thinking based on expositions of the distinction by Ernst Mayr.  It seems to me that Mayr's exposition of the distinction was in many ways unfortunate, for it tended to reinforce the notion that the problem can be solved by treating populations as if they were sets.  Darwin got away from typological thinking by treating species and higher taxonomic groups as historical entities.  That makes them concrete particular things, i.e., ontological individuals, though as Lewens points out, Darwin's statements about such matters are not very clear.  If one accepts the individuality of species, then no species has an essence, for only classes and not individuals can have essences.  Therefore human nature, at least in the sense of an essence, is a metaphysical delusion.  I come back to that point later in this review.

Chapter 4, on evidence, interprets Darwin's epistemology as inference to the best explanation.  It includes a substantial amount of discussion on William Whewell and John Herschel, philosophers with whose works Darwin was intimately acquainted.  There might have been a bit more discussion on Darwin's actual arguments for evolution, but there seems nothing objectionable in Lewens's account.  Some of Darwin's arguments were obviously directed against special creation, and understandably a book intended for philosophers pays a lot of attention to that.  Lewens has a good bit to say about intelligent design creationism and for the intended audience it seems reasonable to include some material on that current topic. 

Chapter 5, on mind, addresses the kind of topic that interests philosophers very much.  We biologists have tended to leave it to psychologists, but again Lewens quotes my remark that for psychologists, "The natural inclination would be merely to impose an oversimplified evolutionary rationalization upon the observations."  Lewens provides ample grounds for thinking that this is a serious problem these days.  He discusses Darwin's major psychological work, The Expression of the Emotions in Man and Animals, and notes how little it has to do with natural selection.  That leads, indirectly of course, to a discussion on what has been called the psychic unity of mankind.  Such unity suggests an essence, or what is often called human nature, that has to be rationalized in the face of polymorphism. 

Chapter 6, on ethics, includes some discussion on Darwin's debt to Adam Smith and other moral philosophers.  Darwin seems to have been quite hesitant to embrace normative evolutionary ethics.  There is a good criticism of Robert Richards's notions on such matters, which turn out to be a form of ethical intuitionism.  That same author has some other odd notions about Darwin, and perhaps his reliance upon intuition explains them.  Richards has attempted to portray Darwin as a Naturphilosoph, or German mystic, rather than a sensate intellect who worked in the rationalist tradition of Erasmus Darwin, Charles Lyell, and Étienne Geoffroy Saint-Hilaire. 

Beyond pointing out that Chapter 7 provides a good discussion on evolutionary epistemology and related topics, I pass it over to go directly to Chapter 8, which is on politics.  In The Descent of Man Darwin says much that has been taken up by political writers, left, right and center.  Evolution by natural selection seems disappointing to everybody with a political axe to grind.  The notion of human nature keeps creeping into discussions of such topics, and to make matters worse, what is meant by human nature is rarely made explicit.  All too often it means an essence.  Let us hope that philosophers who read this chapter will be stimulated to exercise their analytical and critical faculties and bring some clarity into the discussion. 

Chapter 9, on philosophy, is something of a miscellany.  There is much of interest on contingency and necessity, using the argument between Stephen Jay Gould and Simon Conway Morris as an example.  There follows a consideration of Darwin's views on progress, something that Darwin did not consider necessary to the degree that Lamarck did.  I think that Lewens's treatment of Darwin's views on progress in organic evolution would have been somewhat better had he viewed it as analogous to economic, technological, and scientific progress.  In this connection it is amusing that Lewens attributes the rise of naturalism among philosophers to a realization that lack of progress in philosophy during the middle of the twentieth century resulted from too much concern for language and not enough for empirical enquiry.  By naturalism he means "a position which advocates some form of deference among philosophers to our best scientific theories."  Darwinian evolutionary theory is obviously one of our best scientific theories, but what makes it one of them or perhaps even the very best?  It seems to me that Darwin introduced ways of thinking that have been fruitful in exploring a wide range of phenomena.  He was always asking new kinds of questions that give new kinds of answers.  Lewens draws attention to the breadth of Darwin's interests, and contrasts that with the narrow specialization of most scientists these days.  Philosophy has taken on, he says, the work of synthesizing the results of scientific research.  Let us hope that both philosophers and scientists will work together to achieve such synthesis.