2007.04.12

Steve Fuller

The Philosophy of Science and Technology Studies

Steve Fuller, The Philosophy of Science and Technology Studies, Routledge, 2006, 191pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415941059.

Reviewed by Ronald N. Giere, Center for Philosophy of Science, University of Minnesota


Fuller begins by claiming that "it is difficult to write a book about the philosophy of a field as resolutely disrespectful of academic philosophy as Science and Technology Studies" (ix). It is true that the founders of the new sociology of science, such as David Bloor and Harry Collins in the 1970s and 80s, explicitly developed their own ideas in direct opposition to some philosophers' views, particularly Popper's doctrine of falsifiability.  But these sociologists also embraced philosophical ideas suitable to their purposes: incommensurability, as developed by Kuhn and Feyerabend, and Quine's indeterminacy of theory by observation. The use of such philosophical ideas by sociologists of science has been well documented by John Zammito (2004). As the author of a book on Kuhn (2000), Fuller of course discusses the influence of Kuhn on STS, but, as one "who follow[s] the developments in STS from a high altitude" (30), he does not attach influences to specific members of the STS community. What he mainly does is consider aspects of these two fields in socio-cultural terms, inspired by his involvement with approaches to the "public understanding of science" and the "science wars" as well as by his own "project of social epistemology" (5). His idea of what he calls "perennial philosophy" applied to STS is the question: What is a life in STS? His answer, which differs from current orthodoxy in STS, is to regard STS "as a vocation that is also a vehicle for social transformation" (5). As hard as it may have been to write this book, it may be even harder to review. Those familiar with just a few of Fuller's works will know how wide-ranging his thought is. He glides easily from Plato to Comte to Logical Positivism, or from the French Revolution to World War I. The result is almost always interesting and often provocative, as, for example, his comparisons of philosophy and science with religion. Having decided that it is beyond my abilities to review this book thematically, I will proceed chapter by chapter, concentrating on just a few ideas or issues in each.

Fuller's conception of science is displayed already in the second page of the "Introduction.

The power of science seems to rest on three pillars. One is science's distinctive social organization, which enables concentrated periods of both teamwork and criticism, nowadays done on a global scale with considerable material resources. Another is concerted political effort to apply the results of scientific research to all aspects of society. Finally is the control that scientists continue to exert over how their history is told. Past diversions and failures remain largely hidden, resulting in an airbrushed picture of "progress" otherwise absent from human affairs.

Missing from this list is what most people would call the "success" of science. I suspect Fuller regards what others call "success" as being like "progress," an artifact produced by the operation of his "three pillars." Fuller is indeed a social constructivist regarding science, but with important qualifications that emerge throughout the book.

In Chapter II, "The Sociology of Knowledge: The Philosophical Backdrop to STS," Fuller argues that, under the influence of both Kuhn and anthropology, STS has developed a "sociology of science that is not a sociology of knowledge" (28-30). Knowledge, for Fuller, has a normative dimension that he finds lacking in STS, thus providing grounds for the charges of "relativism" that are a staple of criticisms of STS. But, for Fuller, things are not so simple. In agreement with Ian Hacking (1999), Fuller distinguishes between "refuting" and "unmasking" (18-21). The relativist attempts to refute the claims of scientists to objective knowledge. Scientists correctly see this as a threat to the legitimacy of their claims. A constructivist, on the other hand, only attempts to exhibit the social and rhetorical strategies that scientists use to bolster their claims to objective knowledge. So scientists' claims are unmasked rather than refuted. Scientists can still lay claim to objective knowledge, although the objectivity of knowledge has a different source than most scientists recognize. But the epistemic status of scientists is diminished. For Fuller, "the social epistemology of science must ask how science is to be legitimated once social constructivist accounts are widely accepted. Can science, like religion, survive in a demystified form" (37)? I would say "yes," but demystifying need not go so far as unmasking.

Fuller's summary of Chapter III, "Philosophy In, Of, and Beyond the Scientific Field Site," begins with the claim that "STS not only defines itself in opposition to philosophy but also requires a philosophy it can call its own" (45). He laments "the implosion of the philosophy of science as a normative enterprise" (45). Philosophers of science, he claims, have become "underlaborers," playing Locke to modern science. He is particularly critical of attempts to historicize and naturalize the philosophy of science. Here he criticizes Larry Laudan's attempt to "test" philosophers' methodological pronouncements against historical and contemporary cases (Donovan, Laudan and Laudan 1988) His harsh conclusion is that

Laudan had unwittingly provided the reductio ad absurdum of what happens when philosophers descend from their second-order privilege over defining the nature of science to compete alongside those who study science empirically: they are reduced to banalities. (47)

 But Laudan may be too easy a target. I wonder what he would say about "cognitive studies of science" as represented, for example, by Nancy Nersessian (2002) in the US and David Gooding (1990) in the UK. Here the goal is not to support banal methodological pronouncements, but, drawing on work in the cognitive sciences, to investigate the cognitive mechanisms employed by scientists in creating and testing scientific concepts.

Fuller is even more critical of the underlaborer role of STS, focusing on Bruno Latour and actor-network theory, although he thinks that work on (non) replication in science "needs to be taken seriously as a normative problem, since that is one of the main reasons why non-scientists believe that science provides a superior form of knowledge" (58). Fuller is also critical of the STS concept of "technoscience." He sees the scientists' conception of science as autonomous and pure during the Cold War (even though the Department of Defense was the major funder of scientific research in the US), reflected in positivist philosophy of science. Similarly, he sees the STS concept of technoscience as particularly well adapted to the Post Cold War period in which much funding for science comes from corporations, and scientists themselves are much more comfortable with a closer connection between science and technology. By contrast, Fuller praises a Swedish STS researcher who exposed methodological flaws in research on attention deficit disorder and documented the influence of pharmaceutical companies who funded much of the research. The uproar in the Swedish press led to the demise of a plan by Sweden's National Social Health Board to administer a new hyperactivity drug to thousands of children. Fuller laments the fact that such actions by an STS researcher were not much recognized by the STS establishment in the US, UK, or France.

Chapter IV, "Postmodern Positivism": STS by Another Name?" has two main goals. One is to review the history of positivism as

the first social and intellectual movement that tried to learn from the mistakes of the Enlightenment project that eventuated, first, in the Reign of Terror following the French Revolution of 1789, and second, in the irrationalism of the Weimar Republic following Germany's defeat in World War I. (79)

The second goal of the chapter is "to demonstrate that STS may be regarded as a postmodern version of positivism that especially updated the idea of 'science' as a societal resource available to more than simply card-carrying members in specific scientific disciplines" (79).

Fuller sees parallels between Plato and positivism, though he admits that the parallel raises some "delicate questions.

These delicate questions arise because ultimately positivism turns Plato on his side by converting a static hierarchy into a temporal order. Where Plato imagined that authority flowed downward from the philosopher-king in a caste-based social structure, positivists have envisaged that all of humanity may pass (at a variable rate) through a sequence of stages -- theological, metaphysical, and scientific… .  Moreover there is a recipe for the conversion of Platonism to positivism. It proceeds by isolating a domain of inquiry from the contingencies surrounding its manifestations so that its essential nature may be fathomed… .  The history of positivism can be neatly captured as a Hegelian dialectic, the three moments of which are epitomized by the work of Auguste Comte (thesis), Ernst Mach (antithesis), and the Vienna Circle (synthesis). (81)

This is all news to someone like me who has always thought that the Enlightenment grew out of the 17th century scientific revolution and that positivism was an extension of Enlightenment thought extending into the 20th century. This is clearly contrary to Fuller's conclusion that "the Enlightenment and positivism pull in quite different directions" (113). But then, I, like Fuller, am no historian.

The commonality Fuller finds between post World War II positivism and STS is this. The positivists pictured science as composed of specialties isolated from the rest of society. And they viewed themselves as specialists likewise insulated from the rest of society. As Fuller notes, Kuhn's picture of paradigm-based normal science is similar to positivism in this regard. Of course it is a hallmark of STS research that science is seen as very much embedded in society and subject to social and political influences of all sorts. But Fuller sees contemporary STS research itself as similarly operating as a paradigm-based specialty, the paradigm now being actor-network theory. The second half of the chapter is framed by the ongoing "science wars," which Fuller regards as a lamentable conflict within the academy which mainly serves the interests of those who distrust, and often denigrate, academics.

Near the end of Chapter V, "Re-enchanting Science: Beyond Puritans and Gnostics," Fuller writes:

In conclusion I want to drive home the main point of this chapter -- that the disenchanted view [of science] seriously misrepresents the spirit that has motivated the conduct of scientific inquiry, which is epitomized by 'scientism,' a recurrent yet repressed theme in the history of science. (152)

Some clarifications are necessary. Of "scientism" Fuller writes: "in its simplest form [scientism] is the doctrine that science can justify value commitments" (122). Auguste Comte and Herbert Spencer are among his main examples of scientistic thinkers. In fact, for Fuller, Comte and Spencer represented a "Gnostic scientism" which would overturn the social order in the name of science. Fuller contrasts Gnostic scientism with "scientific puritanism," a position held by many of those scientists, such as Alan Sokal and Steven Weinberg, who have actively participated in the science wars, as well as by philosophers and philosophers of science such as Susan Haack and Elliot Sober. Scientific puritans assert "the intrinsic value of technical proficiency and the need for self-restraint in its applications" (116). Scientific puritans thus uphold a distinction between scientific facts and social values and are reluctant to inject themselves, or their science, into issues involving values, except of course the value of doing science. "In effect," Fuller writes, "Gnosticism is Puritanism taken to its logical extreme" (128). But the differences are substantial. For scientific puritans, the natural world and science itself are "disenchanted." There is nothing in the natural world that confers value or meaning on human existence. Regrettably, according to Fuller, mainstream STS exhibits a puritan attitude toward both itself and the sciences it studies. He wants science re-enchanted, but in a modest Enlightenment way by using scientific knowledge to improve human well-being. Moreover, he thinks that scientists should reject the idea of "value neutrality" for science and actively support public policies that improve well-being and reduce inequality.

In the final chapter, "Citizen Science: Cultivating a Life in STS," Fuller brings his own social epistemology to the fore. At the beginning of his chapter summary he writes:

Although the ancient Greeks are full of false leads, when it comes to defining the nature of scientific citizenship in a democracy, the lineage from Plato to positivism nevertheless does provide a context for understanding the evolution of the modern conception of expertise and the distinct problems it poses to modern democracies. These problems revolve around the issues of institutionalization­ -- specifically, how to design institutions that respect the role of knowledge in collective decision-making without succumbing to rule by expertise (157).

His solution to addressing this problem is the "consensus conference" (or "citizen jury"), "a vehicle for public involvement in setting science and technology policy" (167). A consensus conference has two phases. "In the first [phase], 10-15 members ­of the public are empowered to take testimony from various experts and interest groups." ­In the second phase, "the jurors deliberate among themselves to arrive at policy guidelines for legislation governing the issue" (167). The jurors are selected from the general population, somewhat like a regular jury in the U.S., to ensure that none has a direct personal stake in the outcome of their deliberations. Finally, "consensus conference outcomes must be binding on science and technology legislation" (169). Fuller acknowledges that there are many obstacles to the institutionalization of consensus conferences and attempts to meet some of them. I wonder whether such an institution is even desirable. I will develop my worry in the context of teaching "intelligent design theory" (IDT), an issue that Fuller raises a number of times throughout the book and, indeed, he "support[s] the teaching and research of intelligent design theory in mainstream universities” (131).

Consider the case of a school board that is considering whether IDT should be taught as a serious alternative to evolutionary theory (ET). Would it make sense to settle this issue according to a binding recommendation by a citizen jury? I choose this example because Fuller himself recently testified for the defense in a challenge to a school board decision to have IDT recognized in science classrooms in Dover, PA. (Talbot 2005) The case was heard by a single judge, not a jury, but this case is still relevant here because it would be hard to imagine a citizen jury populated with citizens as knowledgeable as Steve Fuller. And what did he say? It was reported that he "said that he thought evolution offered a better explanation of biological diversity than intelligent design"(77). Good. But he is also reported as saying that it is "bad news" to have "taken-for-granted theories" in any discipline. He was also reported to have said that "it might be interesting if science was 'reconfigured so that the notion of design would be taken as a kind of literal unifying concept'."

At the risk of being labeled a "scientific puritan," this seems to me to be taking the social construction of scientific knowledge, participatory democracy, and the fear of governance by experts too far. While Fuller is right that ET does not impinge directly on much work in biology, it provides unifying principles for all of biology. And it is the product of the best thinking about organic life on Earth for the past 150 years. The problem, as I see it, is that ET is not given enough emphasis in our public schools. Biology teachers and publishers of biology textbooks have been intimidated by the fear of offending the religious sensibilities of students and, more seriously, their parents. It is lamentable that "freedom of religion" is taken to mean that any beliefs are as good as any others. In fact, the US constitution says only that the power of the state cannot be used to enforce any particular religious beliefs. It does not say that students should not be forced to learn about ET in public schools. I would even recommend admitting that both ET and IDT are "theories" of the origin of human life on Earth, but then go on to show why ET is far more worthy of belief than IDT. That might do as much to promote an understanding of science and a unified democratic citizenry as a more politically active STS profession or consensus conferences.

 

References

Donovan, A., L. Laudan and R. Laudan. 1988. Scrutinizing Science. Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Fuller, Steve. 2000. Thomas Kuhn: A Philosophical History for Our Times. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.

Gooding, D. 1990. Experiment and the Making of Meaning. Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Hacking, Ian. 1999. The Social Construction of What? Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

Nersessian, N. J. 2002. "Kuhn, conceptual change, and cognitive science." In Thomas Kuhn, T. Nickles, ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 178-211.

Talbot, M. 2005. "Darwin in the Dock." The New Yorker. 5 Dec., 66-77.

Zammito, J. H. 2004. A Nice Derangement of Epistemes. Post-Positivism in the Study of Science from Quine to Latour. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.