2007.05.10

Iain Hamilton Grant

On an Artificial Earth: Philosophies of Nature after Schelling

Iain Hamilton Grant, On an Artificial Earth: Philosophies of Nature after Schelling, Continuum, 2006, 232pp., $140 (hbk), ISBN 0826479030.

Reviewed by Joseph P. Lawrence, College of the Holy Cross


Grant has written a difficult and important book. The argument is a complicated one that unfolds on two different levels. On the one hand, Grant is determined to defend a "materialist" reading of Schelling as constituting the most radical possible alternative to the narrow transcendentalism of Kant and Fichte. His is a Schelling who, together with a small band of likeminded supporters and colleagues, understands nature as having its own history that extends far deeper into the past than was ever before acknowledged, while even now producing forms in steady excess of what human understanding might make of them. Dispensing with the sharp separation between organic and inorganic, Schelling unveiled in nature a material vitalism that rescues matter from the category of the inert and mechanical to which Kant and Fichte had relegated it. In this way, he understood nature as always more subject than object, the ground and condition of human subjectivity rather than simply the object of human reflection. 

On a second front (and thus the title's reference to what comes after Schelling), Grant interweaves remarks on Deleuze that are meant to show that contemporary French philosophy is (at its best) groping toward a reconstitution of a philosophy of nature like the one offered by Schelling. Implicit in his remarks is the assumption that German and Anglo-American philosophy are still lost in the shadow of Kant, with only the French offering a serious challenge to Schelling's verdict that "the whole of modern European philosophy since its inception (through Descartes) has this common deficiency -- that nature does not exist for it" (Schelling: VII, 356). If contemporary French philosophy has involved a post-structuralist reduction of the world to textuality, it also includes its antidote. A minor deficiency of Grant's book is that, by focusing so narrowly on nature-philosophical texts, it evades an explicit confrontation with the neo-idealist reading of Schelling championed by Manfred Frank. As such, what could have crystallized as a bold challenge to the critique of French theory (by thinkers such as Frank and Habermas) falls a bit flat. Clarity is not Grant's great strength.

Even so, I want to stick by my judgment that Philosophies of Nature after Schelling is an important, indeed a groundbreaking work. Slavoj Žižek has certainly done a commendable job over the years of reminding us that Schelling, not Heidegger, is our most important resource for responding to the steady emergence of the "artificial earth." Not only does Schelling surpass such likeminded literary commentators as Thoreau by offering an actual philosophical demonstration of the erotic excess that lies at the heart of nature, but he gives a thoroughgoing assessment of the psychological response such excess awakens in human beings: it didn't take Heidegger to unveil the mechanism of anxious flight and Seinsvergessenheit.  All of that is in Schelling -- especially in the Philosophical Inquiries into the Essence of Human Freedom, the work that Manfred Frank ignores (for collapsing freedom back into nature) but that both Heidegger and Žižek regard as absolutely central. What makes Grant's book so important in this context is that it uncovers the actual scientific and philosophical evidence behind Schelling's more visionary treatises (both the book on Human Freedom and the Ages of the World). Without the philosophy of nature, the rest of Schelling can appear fanciful.

Others have certainly known this. Heidegger, for instance, asserts (in his Besinnung treatise, recently translated as Mindfulness) that, in explicit contrast to Hegel, "Schelling was granted the profoundest grasp of spirit because he begins with the philosophy of nature" (Mindfulness, p. 233). Whereas Heidegger regarded Schelling's rediscovery of nature as no more than a fortunate but fleeting episode ("Schelling projected-open the most profound gestalt of spirit without, of course, making it last"), Grant asserts that the philosophy of nature is the "core to Schellingianism, rather than just a phase" (p. 3). Because I so wholeheartedly concur with Grant on this point, I wish he had been more diligent in working it out. Instead of stopping with the Philosophical Investigations on Human Freedom (which Grant rightly understands as showing that freedom has to be understood as the highest potency of "generative nature" -- p. 202), it would have been helpful to follow through on the precise areas that Schelling regards as manifestations of nature in human history: art, mythology, and religion. A discussion of the concluding section of the System of Transcendental Idealism (on "art as the organ of philosophy") would have made the connection fully explicit.

That said, I want to return to Grant's positive achievement. It begins with his correct (and rather uncontroversial) assessment of Schelling's philosophy as representing a "material vitalism." In a word, Schelling understands nature not through the inert particle, but through the forces that constitute it. Einstein's E=mc2 would have made sense to him, even though he was concretely familiar only with gravitational and electromagnetic forces and not with their more powerful subatomic counterparts. What Grant adds to the general vision of physical dynamism is the thesis (and, yes, this too is very much in Schelling) that nature itself is therefore history. Schelling not only anticipated what Darwin had to say about the evolution (and decline) of species, but he had already anticipated such contemporary thinkers as Stephen Jay Gould who go beyond Darwin by untying evolution from teleology. To the degree that the life-building forces within matter itself are always already geared toward excess, biological evolution is not a process aimed at the "fittest". This is why Grant devotes so many pages to a discussion of Carl Friedrich Kielmeyer, the great comparative anatomist who represented for Schelling "the advent of a completely new epoch in natural history" (Schelling: II, 565). By focusing on biological extinction events, Kielmeyer is able to completely undercut transcendental philosophy's obsession with fixed form. For Kant, any diversion from mechanical rigidity (any organism) is a direct invitation for reflective reason to ask about "purpose." In contrast, the vision of a nature that scatters its seeds to excess can only shatter the transcendental perspective altogether (until the indeterminacy of species reflects the indeterminacy of inorganic matter). In a time of ecological crisis such as ours, in which humanity has just begun to acknowledge the ultimate necessity of its own collective mortality, it is interesting to note that at least one philosopher in the tradition was capable of an expansively non-anthropocentric vision of nature. Grant's specific contribution is that he makes clear that Schelling was that philosopher.

This is not to suggest that the book has a narrowly historical intention. Grant's most helpful philosophical innovation is to follow the suggestion of the very young Schelling by interpreting the German das Unbedingte not simply as the unconditioned (in the sense of the necessarily and self-evidently posited) but as the actively unthinged. The most suggestive chapter in his book is thus called "the natural history of the unthinged." Because the vital forces within matter deliver never more than shifting appearances of substantial entities (appearances that utterly override our phenomenological capacities to "capture" them), nature has a history in the most emphatic sense of the word. The deep "unthinging" at the bottom of nature shatters the Kantian conception of nature as the totality of the objects of experience -- as well as the Aristotelian assumption that the universe is a collection of material substances.

Grant's surprising move is that he not only pits Schelling against both Kant and Aristotle, but does so in the name of Plato and Plotinus. His evidence is a commentary on Plato's Timaeus written in the years 1792 and 1793 by a very young (17 and 18 year-old) Schelling during his time as a student in Tübingen. Central to the text is the idea that, fully independent of the Demiurge, the world had not only primal matter at its base, but matter in movement, which indicates the existence of a separate world soul.  Following movement provides insight into the ground- (or better: the unground-) up deduction of matter. Indeed, the entire earth can be understood as arising out of and through the force of its own inner magnetism. What Schelling offers is not simply a speculative physics but a specifically Platonic physics that endeavors to understand that which is darkest and most obscure: matter itself (Cf. Timaeus 49a5). The two-world way of understanding Plato is swept away once one grasps the auto-productivity of the indeterminate dyad. Schelling's speculative physics was an attempt to retrace precisely that problematic. Being is to be thought in its becoming. Behind nature as product, Schelling seeks to disclose nature as pure productivity.

To the degree that science knows nature through its own models, it remains fixated on nature as product. To the degree that nature retains the power to break through any objectification whatsoever, it will withdraw itself from scientific understanding -- and from the possibility of human manipulation. The discontinuities and ruptures that provide the final evidence for the indeterminate side of the dyad (prefigured in the floods and earthquakes that form the backdrop for so many Platonic dialogues) serve as a clear enough warning to a humanity intent on controlling nature. A metaphysics of nature recommends itself in an historical moment when the superficial and one-sided science of nature has "fixed" things to the point that nature seems bent upon revenge. Species are not eternal.

To live wisely is to be aware of the destructive edge of excess. Grant's book serves as a powerful reminder of this dilemma. His recommendation is one that I wholeheartedly endorse. We need to do more than to relegate Schelling's philosophy of nature to our museum of interesting philosophies past. The point is to pursue philosophies of nature after Schelling. There are some philosophers who can only be understood insofar as we philosophize anew. Such a philosopher was Schelling. I will make Grant's concluding remark my own: "Schelling is not a forerunner of anything, but a precursor of philosophical solutions, or 'experiments in dynamic physics,' yet to come" (p. 205).