It is finally here. Wrapped in a stunning jacket design featuring the author's own photographs and embossed gold and black titling, the two massive volumes of Derek Parfit's On What Matters will be the most beautiful philosophy books on any shelf they grace -- a worthy start to living up to over a decade of being "the most eagerly awaited book in philosophy", according to Oxford University Press's promotion materials. Given the enormous stature of Parfit's 1984 Reasons and Persons (my colleague Jake Ross calls its part IV 'the Platonic Form of philosophy') and Parfit's selective publication schedule, it should be no surprise that his second book should be so anticipated. But with Brad Hooker's  advance notice that it is "probably . . . the most important publication in moral philosophy since Henry Sidgwick's The Methods of Ethics in 1874" and Peter Singer's  front-page Times Literary Supplement gush that it is "the most significant work in ethics since Sidgwick's masterpiece was published in 1873," On What Matters certainly has a lot to live up to.
Lofty expectations aside, there is no doubt that On What Matters is an epochal work. Philosophers my age and younger have never experienced a philosophical world in which there were not conferences and symposia being organized for Parfit to present drafts of the material collected in this work and critics to evaluate it before it was even finished. It is at the same time one of the most collaborative philosophical works ever created (Parfit thanks hundreds for their input) and one of the most intensely personal. And the book is indeed a remarkable achievement, giving us a truly comprehensive picture of the moral outlook -- both normative and metaethical -- of one of the greatest moral thinkers of our time. Whether or not its many specific arguments are widely accepted, the comprehensive picture of the normative terrain it outlines is one with which future work will need to grapple.
Unfortunately for a reviewer like me, however, there is a prima facie difficulty in saying just what the book is about. Each dust jackets reads (in full):
This book is about reasons, value, and morality. There are summaries near the start of both volumes. Each volume can be bought and read on its own.
A brisk read of the 58 pages of the mentioned summaries, however, allows the reader to get a sense of the vast scope of the topics covered, but little more than that. Optimistically, you might turn to the preface for an overview or statement of the book's goals, plan, or ambitions -- the sort of question, argumentative task, or at least guiding principle around which you have come to expect a work of philosophy, or indeed any other book, to be organized. But Parfit's preface consists instead in an extended meditation on why he admires Kant and Sidgwick, and says little about what the book itself is about.
Though Samuel Scheffler tries valiantly in his editor's introduction to justify the inclusion of all of this material under a single title, there is just no getting around the fact that On What Matters really consists of four separate books collected into two volumes under one title: a fairly long monograph in parts 2 and 3 about the value of Kant's contributions to normative moral theory that is based on his 2002 Berkeley Tanner lectures, a full monograph about reasons and rationality in part 1, an edited volume of critical work on the Tanner lectures (part 4) together with Parfit's replies (part 5), and an immense monograph on metaethics in part 6, one of the longer books ever published on pure metaethics in its own right.
At 4.8 pounds together, all of this material clocks in at over twice the combined weight of five of Thomas Nagel's most important books, at a total of 1440 pages, the exact total of Rawls's A Theory of Justice, Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia, and Scanlon's What We Owe to Each Other combined. It is not at all obvious why Parfit decided to include a 26-page appendix covering the topic, 'Why does the Universe exist?' (just one appendix out of ten between the two volumes) and a full 40 pages on the actualism/possibilism debate in the metaphysics of modality (Parfit defends not just possibilism, but the thesis that Alvin Plantinga is also a possibilist). It’s hard to find anything more to say about what ties all of this material together, other than that it is, in the words of Oxford University Press's promotional materials, “a major work in moral philosophy . . . the long-awaited follow-up to Derek Parfit's 1984 book Reasons and Persons, one of the landmarks of twentieth-century philosophy.”
Fortunately, however, I do think that there is a simple way of characterizing what On What Matters is about, and that if we read it in this way, it gives us an illuminating insight into the intellectual journey of one of the greatest contemporary moral thinkers. The right way to think about the unifying content of On What Matters, I think, is as an extended argument for the possibility of moral progress. Moral progress is also what Reasons and Persons was about, but in a very different way. In Reasons and Persons Parfit self-consciously sought to demonstrate the possibility of moral progress by example. This was the secret of its enormous influence, as a whole generation of moral philosophers was inspired by the questions it asked, the way it asked them, and the methods it employed to answer them. According to the penultimate paragraph of its introduction, “Many introductions attempt to explain how, when discussing morality, we can hope to make progress. Since the best explanation would be provided by making progress, this is the only explanation I shall try to give.” (Reasons and Persons, x)
Reasons and Persons was also the work of a younger and more optimistic philosopher. Its final words are: “Non-Religious Ethics is at a very early stage. We cannot yet predict whether, as in Mathematics, we will all reach agreement. Since we cannot know how Ethics will develop, it is not irrational to have high hopes.” (Reasons and Persons, 454)
On What Matters, in contrast, is the work of an older and more reflective philosopher, very conscious of the disagreements among his peers. Rather than focusing on asking new questions or pursuing old questions in fresh ways, it is concerned to argue much more explicitly and directly for the thesis that moral progress is possible. At the culmination of volume 1, Parfit writes: “It has been widely believed that there are such deep disagreements between Kantians, Contractualists, and Consequentialists. That, I have argued, is not true. These people are climbing the mountain on different sides.” (vol. 1, 419, italics added)
This difference from Reasons and Persons makes it a fundamentally different kind of book, and -- in keeping with Parfit's own prediction that "the best explanation would be provided by making progress" -- I suspect it will be important for the kind and scope of influence that On What Matters will ultimately have. But the concern with the possibility of moral progress is the very same.
There are two quite different complementary components to the extended and implicit argument in On What Matters for the possibility of moral progress. The first strand consists in the core argument of Parfit's 2002 Tanner Lectures, published as parts 2 and 3, and is often characterized as the core of the book. The master argument of these chapters is that the best and most defensible Kantian principle, the best version of Rule Consequentialism, and the best version of Scanlonian Contractualism will all agree about which actions are wrong. Parfit calls the common ground between what he argues are the best versions of each of Kantianism, Consequentialism, and Contractualism the Triple Theory. The Triple Theory undermines pessimism about the possibility of moral progress by encouraging us to think that separate developments in the respective camps of Kantians, Consequentialists, and Contractualists are not just recursive wheels on fundamentally different moral outlooks, but are leading toward convergence on a single moral truth -- climbing the same mountain from different sides, in Parfit's metaphor.
The other major strand in Parfit's argument for the possibility of moral progress is the extended defense in part 6 of his own distinctive metaethical theory, a kind of non-reductive, non-naturalistic, 'non-metaphysical' (in his words), normative realism. Originally conceived as material for early chapters of the book, and later conceived as an appendix, the published part 6 is a complete treatise on metaethics in its own right, aspiring to survey and reject every possible competitor to Parfit's own view as well as to defend his own view from every major objection. It's obvious that Parfit is deeply gripped by the project in part 6; in more than one place he tells us that if one of the competitors to his metaethical theory turns out to be correct, then his life 'has been wasted'. It is substantially less obvious why a 360-page book defending these views is really part of the same project as the arguments in normative theory of parts 2, 3, and 5, or why he shouldn't have simply published it as a separate book entirely. But I think it's clear that Parfit perceives metaethical competitors to his own view as challenges to the idea of moral progress. This is, I suggest, why confronting them feels like part of the same project -- and why it really is, if that project is construed broadly enough, as a defense of the idea that moral progress is possible.
I believe that there is much to be said in favor of reading On What Matters as unified in this way. Even the apparently irrelevant appendix D, pursuing the question, 'Why does the universe exist?', is repeatedly concerned with the idea of philosophical progress, and it's difficult to see what else can be said to justify the inclusion of parts 3 and 6 under a single title. But framing the task of On What Matters in this way also gives us some perspective on the main arguments in both major parts of the book, which allows us to ask not just whether those arguments succeed in establishing their conclusions, but what sort of significance those conclusions have, and, in particular, whether they can really serve a grander defense of the possibility of moral progress.
Let's first take the master 'climbing the mountain' argument from part 3. According to the core part of this argument, the best and most defensible comprehensive moral principle inspired by Kant's own ideas in the Groundwork agrees with Rule Consequentialism. By no coincidence, the structure of the argument superficially resembles Sidgwick's master argument in Methods that "the intuitional method rigorously applied yields as its final result the doctrine of pure universalistic Hedonism" (Methods of Ethics, 406-7). Like Sidgwick, Parfit thinks there are three major approaches to moral theory that are worth seriously engaging with, and like Sidgwick, Parfit is centrally concerned with a master argument which suggests a kind of convergence among these major approaches.
But there are very important differences between Parfit's argument and Sidgwick's. For Sidgwick, it was very important that his argument lead to utilitarianism wholly on the basis of intuitionist-internal principles. He extensively justifies his conception of how intuitionism must regard rules in order to be a distinctive method of ethics at all, and his argument that "when rigorously applied" this method "yields as its final result the doctrine of pure universalistic Hedonism" relies entirely on that conception. As a result, Sidgwick's result is a very strong one. If his argument works, then by their very own terms intuitionists, by appeal only to principles that are most central to a coherent development of the intuitionist method, must converge on the very same ideas about right conduct as utilitarians.
Some of Parfit's remarks suggest that his strategy will be similar. For example, even though he admits that the Kantian view that he defends was not actually accepted by Kant, he emphasizes that the changes he makes from Kant's own views are "wholly Kantian". This is reminiscent of Sidgwick's insistence that he is concerned with the intuitionist method "rigorously applied" -- that is, on its own terms. But in fact the structure of Parfit's argument is quite different from Sidgwick's. Central to the argument are background views about the relationship between rationality and reasons, about the relationship between reasons and value, and about the relationship between partial and impartial reasons. Though Parfit defends each of these theories in part 1, they are not defended on either Kantian or Consequentialist grounds. So in contrast to Sidgwick, there is no attempt to show that these background theories, needed for his argument, are acceptable wholly on Kantian or Consequentialist grounds.
One of the reasons why this contrast between the aims of Parfit's and Sidgwick's arguments is important is that it is the high standards for success that Sidgwick placed on his argument for utilitarianism on intuitionist grounds. This led him to believe that no such similar argument could be offered for utilitarianism on egoist grounds, a view that played a key role in his famous 'dualism' of practical reason. By Parfit's lights, in turn, Sidgwick's thesis on the dualism of practical reason was one of his biggest mistakes, and in fact Parfit's contrary views about the relationship between partial and impartial reasons play an essential role both in his defense of his Kantian principle and in his master 'climbing the mountain' argument itself.
But this difference between Parfit and Sidgwick is also very important to keep in mind when assessing the broader philosophical significance of Parfit's convergence arguments, even if we accept that they are sound and agree with Parfit that the Triple Theory is in fact the correct moral theory, or at least a close approximation to it. Whatever kind of support Parfit's convergence arguments give for the idea that real moral progress is possible, it needs to be consistent with the dialectical structure of his underlying arguments.
For example, in his editor's introduction, Samuel Scheffler describes the upshot of the convergence arguments as that "it is a mistake to think that there are deep disagreements among Kantians, contractualists, and consequentialists" (vol. 1, xxiii). It's easy to see why showing that apparent disagreements are not really deep might help to undermine pessimism about the possibility of moral progress. Insofar as that pessimism is driven by the perception that even brilliant philosophical peers seem to have vast disagreements about what constitutes progress, the discovery that proponents of the Kantian, Consequentialist, and Contractualist traditions do not really disagree deeply would indeed be the right antidote to this sort of pessimism.
In his only brief explanation of why he is so interested in establishing the "climbing the mountain" result, Parfit himself seems to describe exactly this significance for his result:
If we and others hold conflicting views, and we have no reason to believe that we are the people who are more likely to be right, that should at least make us doubt our view. It may also give us reasons to doubt that any of us could be right.
It has been widely believed that there are such deep disagreements between Kantians, Contractualists, and Consequentialists. That, I have argued, is not true. These people are climbing the mountain on different sides. (vol. 1, 418-9)
But things can't be so simple. If the background assumptions that Parfit has used to evaluate which Kantian principle is most defensible and his derivation of Rule Consequentialism are rejected by Kantians, then it looks like a large overstatement to say that Parfit's convergence argument shows that there are no "deep disagreements" between Kantians and Rule Consequentialists. For what the argument actually shows is that there is a principle that Kantians don't necessarily actually believe, but which is more defensible than what they actually believe by standards they don't actually accept, such that, given background assumptions Kantians reject, it is equivalent to Rule Consequentialism. To say that this shows that the apparent disagreement between Kantians and Rule Consequentialists is not deep appears to overstate the case considerably.
None of this shows that Parfit's convergence result is not deep and important. There are many ways in which his convergence argument could be important, if it is correct. For example, it could be important simply because it makes the Triple Theory more defensible than competing substantive normative theories. Intriguingly, it could also be what Parfit was hinting at in the penultimate section of Reasons and Persons, when he said that
We should not assume that the objectivity of Ethics must be all-or-nothing. There may be a part of morality that is objective. In describing this part, our claims may be true. When we consider this part of morality, or these moral questions, we may find the Unified Theory that would remove our disagreements. There may be other questions about which we shall never agree. There may be no true answers to these questions. Since objectivity need not be all-or-nothing, moral skeptics may be partly right. These questions may be subjective. But this need not cast doubt on the Unified Theory. (Reasons and Persons, 452-453, italics added)
The convergence result could even be important because it helps defend some important aspect of the idea of moral progress. But the result does not appear to have the right structure to show that there are not really, as Parfit says, "others with conflicting views". Consequently, I do think that we clearly need to be much more careful about interpreting the force of the 'climbing the mountain' metaphor and about understanding exactly what about the climbing the mountain result is important.
Understanding the main goal of On What Matters as arguing for the possibility of moral progress also substantially affects how we read and evaluate part 6. On this interpretation, part 6 is a complementary, full-fledged strand of Parfit's master argument that genuine moral progress is possible, in keeping with the enormous space it takes up. It explains why Parfit's most central objection to reductive or 'naturalistic' theories is called the Triviality Objection, because according to Parfit, they trivialize fundamental moral discovery. This interpretation also explains why Parfit's central objection to noncognitivism is that it cannot consistently allow that moral thoughts could be correct or mistaken. And most importantly, it helps us understand why Parfit not only thinks his own metaethical view is the best metaethical theory, but thinks it matters so much that it is correct that much of his life will have been wasted if it is not.
However, again I think that if we are evaluating the core arguments of part 6 by the light of this understanding of its overall significance, though it helps us to understand a great deal about Parfit's motivations, it casts suspicion on his methods. On the face of it, if the point of part 6 is to defend the possibility of moral progress from metaethical theories which cast it into doubt, then one would expect him to engage philosophically with such metaethical theories. But if Parfit's arguments in part 6 are successful, then he hasn't actually succeeded in locating any metaethical theories which cast the possibility of moral progress into doubt. On the contrary, according to him, few people who have ever contributed to the literature on metaethics even have the conceptual resources required to disagree with him.
Bernard Williams, for example, turns out to lack the concept of a reason. John Mackie turns out to fail to have thoughts about morality, rather than to believe that nothing is wrong. Christine Korsgaard lacks normative concepts. Simon Blackburn and Allan Gibbard's disagreement with Parfit? That's superficial, too -- they don't have normative concepts either. I'm flattered to report that I am among the few metaethicists whom Parfit credits as sharing the required conceptual repertoire to disagree with him. But unfortunately for me, it turns out that we don't disagree either, because, according to Parfit, I don't believe my own view. His sole evidence for this? That I acknowledge the intuitive force of apparent counterexamples.
It's clear that Parfit is uncomfortable with disagreement, and that this discomfort plays a major role in motivating both the reconciliatory project of part 3 and the dismissive arguments of part 6. But the strategy of part 6 takes him to strange places. In particular, it leads him to reject even the views of many of the metaethicists, like me, who seem to agree with him that many things matter, agree about which things matter, and agree that it is possible to make progress in thinking about what matters. Instead of seeking common ground with philosophers who seem to agree with him about these things, however, he sweeps them under the same rug as philosophers who seem to disagree with him about these things.
Even if some of Parfit’s more audacious arguments are successful, therefore, which I think would be very surprising, they eliminate as much agreement as they do disagreement. And I don't see why this puts us in a better position than we were before. Surely if the existence of disagreement about the possibility of moral progress should undermine our confidence in it, this is countered to at least some degree by the existence of widespread agreement. Getting rid of so much agreement along with the disagreement makes it harder to understand how Parfit managed to have strange concepts that so many others lack than it was to understand to begin with how he could be right that there is moral progress, when some thinkers disagree. This simply replaces a familiar problem about peer disagreement with a new and peculiar one about conceptual repertoire.
In fact, I think the extent of Parfit's claims to the effect that other philosophers either do not share his concepts or do not understand their own views substantially undermines the grounds for his confidence that he, Ross, and Sidgwick share the same normative concepts and understand their own views. It's not clear, for example, that Sidgwick even has room to understand how there could be such a thing as Ross's prima facie duties. One ordinarily wouldn't think of this as an obstacle to their talking about the same thing, but given the enormous role the failure to allow for the possibility of prima facie duties plays in Sidgwick's arguments, it's hard to avoid the conclusion that this difference is much more important than the plausibility of some of Parfit's own crucial premises.
Just to take one example, Parfit's master argument against reductive ('naturalist', in his terms) metaethical theories, the Triviality Objection, aims to refute the naturalist thesis that to be wrong is to be N, for some natural property N, by assuming that the sentence 'when something is N, it is wrong' states or implies that when something is N, it has a different normative property (vol. 2, 343). Since, according to the naturalist thesis, being wrong is not a different property from being N, the naturalist thesis combined with Parfit’s assumption implies that, when something is N, it has some normative property other than being wrong. Parfit calls the question of what this other property is the Lost Property problem, and offers two more objections at this point: first, that it is mysterious what property it might be, and second, that we can re-pose the Triviality Objection to the naturalist's account of this other normative property.
In order for this argument to be probative, Parfit needs several pieces to fall into place. But most importantly, he needs a non-question-begging justification for the argument's key premise: that 'when something is N, it is wrong' states or implies that when something is N, it has a different normative property. Now Parfit's argument clearly isn't question-begging in the trivial sense that its conclusion is numbered among its premises. But by Parfit's own lights, if the different normative property is not the property of being wrong, then we face the Lost Property problem, and it is mysterious what this different property is. But if it is really so mysterious what this different property could be, if it is not the property of being wrong, then the only way Parfit's premise could really be obvious is if it were obvious that being wrong is a different property from being N. But, of course, that is precisely what the argument is supposed to establish.
So the dialectical force of Parfit's argument requires it to somehow be more obvious that sentences like this state or imply the presence of some normative property that is distinct from being N than it is obvious that being wrong is distinct from being N. Now I happen to think that it is extremely unobvious how this could be so. But more important for my purposes here is that whatever makes it so is going to need to be a very subtle point. And given how subtle this point is going to have to be, in order for Parfit's central Triviality Objection to not be question-begging, it is certainly going to be more subtle than Sidgwick's failure to conceive of the possibility of prima facie duties. This is why I think it's at least as plausible to conclude that Sidgwick and Ross must not really be talking about the same thing as it is to conclude that Parfit is not talking about the same thing as a naturalist who fails to find the subtle intuition driving the Triviality Objection compelling. (For further problems with the Triviality Objection, see Schroeder [forthcoming].) But if Sidgwick and Ross -- Parfit's two favorite examples of philosophers who share his concepts -- are not talking about the same thing as each other, then the class of theorists who are talking about the same thing as Parfit is getting very small indeed.
There is far more to be said about both the virtues and vices of all parts of Parfit's book -- about the defensibility of the views he advances in part 1, for example, and about whether he has appreciated the full resources of the Kantian perspective in parts 2 and 3, or only those that fit into his pre-existing framework. There is much to be said about the insightful commentary in part 4 -- I was particularly impressed by Susan Wolf's piece, for example -- and about the ways in which Parfit both succeeds and fails at engaging with the force of those comments in part 5, including his fascinating and insightful discussion of Scanlonian Contractualism, the view with which his own has the most in common. And there is much more to be said about how frustrating many readers will find the fact that in part 6 Parfit is so consistently uninterested in the explanatory virtues or otherwise of his theory and only interested in whether there are knockdown arguments against it. But since others will have much to say about these things, I'll close by returning to a comparison with which we began.
Early on I noted that, according to Hooker and Singer, On What Matters is likely the greatest work of ethics since Sidgwick's Methods. In terms of ultimate impact, I suspect that this prediction is overstated. Yet the comparison is indeed apt, and not only because Parfit acknowledges Sidgwick, along with Kant, as one of his 'masters'. A commentator writes,
[the author] incessantly refines, qualifies, raises objections, answers them, and then finds further objections to answer. Each of these objections, rebuttals, rejoinders, and surrejoinders is in itself admirable, and does infinite credit to the acuteness and candor of the author. But the reader is apt to become impatient; to lose the thread of the argument; and to rise from his desk finding that he has read a great deal with constant admiration and now remembers little or nothing.
Although these are Broad's words about Sidgwick, they could have been written about On What Matters. Parfit himself quotes this passage from Broad, but responds that Methods, though initially difficult to read and hard to see the forest for the trees, amply repays re-reading, because of its richness in detail. Again, much the same could be said for much of On What Matters, for anyone with the fortitude to make it through more than once. There are hundreds of philosophical gems scattered throughout the book -- far more than will ever receive the commentary they deserve. A review like this could barely begin to do them justice.
Parfit is also the Sidgwick of our era for his use of philosophical examples. Though on a superficial reading Sidgwick may seem to be much more focused on realistic examples and Parfit is accused of using unrealistic ones, I think this misses the deeper fact that both are really focused on the need to avoid overgeneralizing from simple cases. Whereas for Sidgwick this manifests itself in pointing out that some promises are made under duress, for Parfit it manifests itself in cases like the following (one of my personal favorites from On What Matters):
Third Earthquake: You and your child are trapped in slowly collapsing wreckage, which threatens both of your lives. You cannot save your child's life except by using Black's body as a shield, without her consent, in a way that would crush one of her toes. If you also caused Black to lose another toe, you would save your own life. (vol. 1, 222)
For Parfit, as well as Sidgwick, the lesson is not to overgeneralize from paradigm cases. Just as promises under duress show that not all promises are equally important, Third Earthquake is used by Parfit to argue that not all cases of harming someone in pursuit of ends to which they do not consent amounts to using them as a mere means. If you crush one of Black's toes to save your child's life but sacrifice your own life so that she can have nine toes rather than eight, Parfit notes, you are hardly treating her as a mere means in any intuitive sense.
Many more instructive comparisons to The Methods of Ethics could be drawn. In addition to having parallel argumentative aims, they share a common perspective on metaethics and, I believe, a common misconception of just how important that perspective on metaethics is for their normative concerns. They both aspire to a kind of comprehensiveness in coverage that I think has become unrealistic, and they are both unfortunately burdened by a length that discourages more readers than it should.
The greatest virtue of On What Matters, however, consists in another departure from Sidgwick. Though like On What Matters Sidgwick's "great, drab book" takes us on a careful tour through an astonishing range of the important issues raised in ethical theory, Sidgwick himself recedes into the background. In contrast, Parfit's intellectual personality radiates throughout On What Matters, which as a whole presents a gripping and illuminating picture of a single, comprehensive view of the projects of both normative and metaethical inquiry, as seen from the perspective of one of the major moral thinkers of our day. For the most part, it empowers its readers to think within this perspective and to understand its resources for addressing further questions not taken up by Parfit.
It is said that Gauss was the last mathematician to be able to know all of the mathematics of his day. For related reasons I believe that we are past the day when any broad work of philosophy can survey the possibilities with adequate care to definitively argue for its positions, and this applies all the more to a work with such enormous scope. The best thing any work of major scope can reasonably aspire to do, I believe, is to present the kind of clear and compelling picture of a single view and the kinds of argumentative strategies which support it that will empower readers to explore and evaluate its comparisons to others and to test the limitations of those argumentative strategies. Whatever faults the lofty expectations set for this book might lead readers to find with it, On What Matters certainly does this, and in my view, that's what matters.
Hooker, Brad . 'Ideas of the Century: On What Matters.' The Philosopher's Magazine. Published September 22, 2010, http://www.philosophypress.co.uk/?p=1515.
Parfit, Derek . Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Schroeder, Mark [forthcoming]. 'What Matters About Metaethics?' Forthcoming in Peter Singer, ed., Does Anything Really Matter? Responses to Parfit. Forthcoming from Oxford University Press.
Sidgwick, Henry . Methods of Ethics, 7th Edition. Indianapolis: Hackett.
Singer, Peter . 'One Mountain.' Times Literary Supplement. May 20, 2011, 3-4.
 Special thanks to my incredibly supportive colleagues Shieva Kleinschmidt, Stephen Finlay and Jake Ross.