2011.08.04

Ronald Dworkin

Justice for Hedgehogs

Ronald Dworkin, Justice for Hedgehogs, Harvard University Press, 2011; 506pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674046719.

Reviewed by Gerald Doppelt, University of California, San Diego


In Justice for Hedgehogs (JH), Ronald Dworkin has written a truly remarkable philosophical work.[1] It advances a bold treatment of all the fundamental issues in meta-ethics, moral epistemology, ethics, and political theory. The work is systematic not just in the broad sweep of its subject matter, but in its defense of an economical set of substantive principles that informs each part of Dworkin's story and integrates them into a striking account of ethical life as a whole. Dworkin's central principles assert (1) the independence of moral judgments, (2) the unity of moral values, and (3) the interpretive character of these values. His principle of independence advances the claim that moral convictions are true or false, and are established as such by modes of reasoning that invoke other moral values in a framework that is independent of empirical, scientific, or metaphysical inquiry. Thus moral truths cannot be dislodged by empirical or metaphysical truths. Dworkin's principle of the unity of value advances an account of values (e.g., the good life, duties to others) in which these values are not in conflict, but support each other. The third principle concerning the interpretive character of moral values argues that their meaning requires an 'interpretation' that aims to identify their moral ground and implications. Dworkin's account of interpretation takes aim against the view that moral concepts possess criteria which philosophers can discover through analysis, then utilize to guide moral decisions. Instead, ethical inquiry should abandon the quest to define the meaning, logic, or function of moral language and seek value-laden interpretations of moral concepts that determine their application to cases.

Dworkin attempts to defend these three principles in a wide variety of contexts, a task daunting but engaging. The book is extremely well-written, in a conversational style that invites readers into the narrative and suggests other paths they may want to take. In this review, I provide an account of some of Dworkin's most provocative arguments. My focus will center on his notion of interpretation and his conceptions of ethics ('living well'), morality ('duties of others'), and politics ('political rights, equality, liberty, democracy, and law'), as his practical conceptions provide the best test of his accounts of moral truth and interpretation.

1. The Independence of Value (23-94)

Half of JH is devoted to a meta-ethical inquiry (23-191) in which Dworkin establishes the autonomy of moral judgment, true moral convictions as the aim of such judgment, and 'interpretation' as the sole and sufficient guide to truths about value. His aim in defending the 'independence' of value judgments is (1) to vindicate 'the ordinary' view that moral convictions are straightforwardly true or false, and (2) to defeat skeptical arguments against the possibility of moral truths. He seeks to demonstrate that the practice of making moral judgments, and of defending them, forms a self-sufficient framework independent of scientific standards of proof and the verdict of fact.

Dworkin defends the common sense view that moral judgments involve assertions about value which are straightforwardly true or false. When we assert that torture is wrong, we mean that torture is really, truly, objectively wrong. We may also be expressing disapproval or a prescription for conduct. But we do so by doing something else: expressing a belief about the action which grounds the emotion or prescription. We may also seek to explain a moral belief, or why people hold it -- the aim of anthropologists, sociologists, psychologists, etc. Such explanations of moral convictions do not bear on their truth or falsity; this is what makes them moral convictions. Making a case for our moral convictions requires an appeal to other moral convictions. Are these sources sufficient to make one's moral convictions true? While Dworkin's answer awaits his account of interpretation, the burden of his argument concerning the independence of moral judgment is to neutralize various forms of skepticism about moral truth.

Dworkin distinguishes an 'internal' skepticism from an 'external' form. Internal skeptics draw on some moral convictions to undermine our belief in the truth or falsity of others, whereas external skeptics seek to stand outside every framework of moral convictions in order to raise doubts about all of them. 'Partial Error' skeptics utilize some moral convictions in order to challenge the credibility of others. Such a skeptic may challenge the credibility of all moral convictions concerning voluntary homosexual behavior on the basis of a more general conviction concerning the features of acts that make them wrong or obligatory and the conviction that voluntary sexual choices lack these wrong-making (or right-making) features. Because such general moral convictions may be true, partial-error skeptics get it right in certain cases. 'Global Internal' skeptics aim to defeat the credibility of all first-order moral judgments on the basis of a second-order moral claim concerning the entire class. These skeptics may hold that all moral convictions concerning persons' behavior are neither true nor false because human behavior is always caused by events beyond human control and it is wrong to hold people morally responsible for choices they cannot avoid. Global internal skeptics may deny the credibility of all universal moral principles (they are neither true nor false) on the basis of the moral conviction that right and wrong -- what is true or false -- is entirely relative to the culture of particular peoples. Dworkin does not challenge internal skepticism as a whole because internal skeptics always assume the truth of some moral convictions that can be evaluated on the terrain of interpretation.

Not so with 'external skepticism', which he treats as a deadly affliction of academic philosophers and 'post-modern' intellectuals. Because external skeptics seek a non-moral account of moral convictions, their project is a non-starter, a founding mistake rooted in incomprehension of the independence of moral convictions. Dworkin argues that external skepticism reduces to internal skepticism and thus stands or falls on the basis of the moral convictions on which it tacitly depends. Consider the skeptic who argues that moral truths require the existence of moral facts or properties. Because there are no such moral facts, it follows that there are no moral truths. On Dworkin's reading, this skeptical argument depends on the moral conviction that were there moral facts and properties in the world, humans would have those moral obligations that correspond to them. Consider any external skeptic who denies the existence of moral obligations. Such a skeptical position contradicts moral convictions which assert that certain acts are morally prohibited and others morally required. This is itself a moral conviction fraught with ethical significance. External skepticism rests on an untenable dichotomy separating meta-ethical claims about moral judgments from moral judgments themselves.

External skeptics may reject this stance because they think it is question-begging or trades on a bogus notion of what counts as a 'moral' conviction. Dworkin's arguments force us to examine the assumptions of skeptical arguments and recognize that evaluating these assumptions already engages us in the web of moral judgments. Dworkin shifts the burden of argument onto skeptics and meta-ethical theorists who would deny the independence of value. There is a wealth of additional arguments (concerning causation, motivation, supervenience, etc.) which support the core idea that 'morality stands or falls on its own credentials'. But how do particular moral claims stand or fall? These problems lead to Dworkin's account of 'interpretation.'

2. Interpretation and Moral Responsibility (94-123)

Dworkin treats interpretation as a practice in the lives of individuals essential to the achievement of moral responsibility. His account of ethics begins with a view of agents who take responsibility for acting on moral convictions and interpreting what they imply in concrete settings of life. Agents fail their moral responsibility when they lack moral convictions, violate them, invoke them insincerely or hypocritically, bend them to their self-interest, or compromise them in myriad ways. Agents fail their responsibility to actively interpret their moral convictions when they act thoughtlessly, inconsistently, whimsically, impulsively, arbitrarily, or unreflectively. The practice of interpretation is essential because our ethical values are general, abstract, and unordered; they need to be applied in order to determine the truth concerning what they ought to do in local circumstances. But one's present situation may evoke diverse moral convictions. Agents bear the responsibility to create integrity and unity among their moral convictions and by so doing actualize their own integrity and authenticity. The act of interpretation is central to moral life and the virtues of moral agents.

The practice of interpretation seeks true moral claims as its intrinsic goal. A necessary condition for true moral convictions is that these convictions, and the agent who embraces them, reconcile and unify what appear to be conflicting values. Dworkin defends a 'full value holism' and a principle of 'the unity of value'. Our moral convictions and values form a coherent whole -- a mutually reinforcing system in which every 'true' value coheres with and supports every other true value. But this coherence is not pre-ordained, static. It is made, not found, through the practice of interpretation. The best interpretation of our moral convictions creates mutual support among them. The truth of a moral conviction depends on the case that can be made for it, in light of other moral convictions taken to be true, and depends on its power to introduce the unity of value characterized above.

How can Dworkin deny the phenomenon of conflict between values? Take the example of deciding what to tell a colleague concerning her book. Isn't it obvious that the values of honesty and kindness conflict in such a case? For Dworkin, this situation simply sets up the problem of interpretation central to responsible moral life. 'Honesty' and 'kindness' do not conflict until we determine what each of these values means, how it speaks to the case at hand. An agent tries to create a kind way of being honest, and an honest way of being kind -- perhaps supported by the sense that dishonest kindness is patronizing, or a false kindness, and unkind honesty is demeaning or insulting. A true moral conviction about such a case generates a unity of the values at stake.

The remainder of Part 2 develops accounts of interpretation 'in general' as a practice in various fields (123-157); and the interpretation of moral concepts (157-191).

3. Interpretation in General

Dworkin's discussion of interpretive judgment covers various fields of inquiry. First he argues that all interpretation seeks true judgments concerning the objects of interpretation; e.g., truths about the meaning of a poem. Secondly, he advances the view that all interpretation is a value-laden practice in that it makes judgments about (1) the value of the object being interpreted and (2) the value of interpretation itself in a given domain of inquiry. Interpretations of the meaning of a poem involve judgments concerning what gives that poem its value and gives the practice of interpreting poetry its value. What determines the credibility of such judgments? Such judgments presuppose a tradition of interpretation and make claims concerning the aims and standards of interpretation in that tradition. Dworkin draws a sharp line between interpretation and scientific inquiry. Interpretation is value-laden in that the standards of success governing interpretive judgments depend on the best understanding of the value or point of interpretation in some tradition. Scientific claims are not value-laden in this way because their success or truthfulness is not similarly dependent on an interpretation of the value of scientific inquiry. Dworkin holds that the intrinsic goal of science is truth (true theories, laws, etc.) and that alone provides 'the' standard of success.

Dworkin's dichotomy of interpretive and scientific judgments embodies a familiar conception of science which can no longer be taken for granted. Post-positivist philosophers have argued that the goals of science require interpretation and that standards of success require the best understanding of these goals. Some claim that scientific inquiry cannot attain true theories of unobservables and must satisfy itself with predictive success. Others who hold that theoretical truths are the goal of science disagree over whether this goal requires explanatory success or mere predictive success, and whether true theories need to embody ideals of simplicity, unification, consilience, internal consistency, coherence with other theories, etc. It would be difficult to understand these debates as anything other than rival interpretations of the goal of science -- on a par with rival interpretations of the point of literary criticism or moral philosophy. The odd result is that Dworkin's conception of interpretation may have wider scope than he imagines, covering scientific judgment and its framework of epistemic values.

4. The Interpretation of Moral Concepts (166-188)

Dworkin defends an account of moral inquiry as a practice of interpreting central normative concepts, such as responsibility, duty, and justice. His defense of this interpretative model rests on a key claim that such moral concepts are essentially 'interpretive concepts', sharply distinguished from 'criterial concepts'. Criterial concepts are ones whose meaning is governed by defining criteria -- properties that provide a decisive test for determining whether or not something is an instance of the concept, e.g., the concept of a triangle, bank, or book. When people disagree concerning the application of such a concept, it is a disagreement over whether the particular in fact satisfies the criteria. Are all moral concepts criterial? Dworkin answers that moral concepts are used without criteria. Such concepts are interpretive and their application to cases is contestable.

Dworkin's interpretive conception implies a powerful alternative to meta-ethical inquiry as a quest to produce analyses, definitions, and criteria for key moral and legal concepts, which are neutral concerning the value at stake in these concepts. Any attempt to get at them through a value-neutral analysis of their meaning or criteria is a non-starter, misguided from the get-go! Any definition of justice or the good life is in reality a moral interpretation of how we should understand them, staking out a position concerning what is valuable in the ideal. Dworkin's model of value-laden interpretation is just as skeptical about the quest for value-free analyses of 'moral reasoning' or justification. Giving an interpretation of them would require providing an evaluation of the values at stake in these activities, as Dworkin has done in arguing that such activity is essential to a morally responsible agent and thus ethical life itself.

Can moral interpretation ground a single true account of justice? Dworkin treats truth as an interpretive concept, not a criterial one. Because this claim must apply to scientific truth, it supports the criticism I advance above, that interpretive and scientific inquires cannot be sharply distinguished on the ground that science does not require interpretation of its goal(s) -- even if we take truth to be the goal. Dworkin holds that interpretations of truth claims in various areas of inquiry must interpret the value of truth in these areas of practice. He presents a persuasive case that the correspondence theory of truth fails this interpretive test. But is there any general interpretation of the concept of truth and its value across different domains of inquiry?

Dworkin advances the interpretive hypothesis that truth is whatever convictions constitute the best solution to the problems central to a domain of inquiry. Truth is the result of 'successful inquiry' and interpretation of the goals and standards of the inquiry. This interpretation of truth justifies a reasonable internal skepticism or relativism concerning the truths available in a given context. Can we expect one true interpretation of the meaning-cum-value of Hamlet? While it is possible, often a director of the play seeks to find the interpretation which will work best for a specific time, place, and audience. This phenomenon may ground an 'internal' skepticism or relativism concerning 'the' meaning of the play, independent of context. It is a virtue of Dworkin's framework of interpretation that he explains how some claims of internal skepticism are justified without calling into question the veracity of all interpretive judgments in a domain.

5. Ethics (191-255)

Dworkin interprets moral life as composed of three interrelated areas of inquiry: Ethics concerns the question of how persons ought to live if they are to 'live well' and have 'a good life'. Morals deals with the question of how persons ought to treat one another, and their duties in this regard. Politics deals with what the members of a political community owe to one another. The three last parts of JH seek interpretations of these ethical, moral, and political concepts that support Dworkin's principle of 'the unity of value' and overcome apparent conflicts between them. His interpretive strategy aims to reconcile the alleged conflict between self-interest ('living well') and morality (duties to others), and thus the conundrum of "Why should anyone be moral?" His interpretation of political concepts seeks to reconcile the values of liberty and equality, which are often taken to conflict. The danger in this approach is that conflicts are circumvented by fiat -- arbitrary characterizations of values that are tailored to generate harmony. But Dworkin's conception of value-laden interpretation aims to show that there are certain core values -- principles of human dignity -- that undergird familiar ideals and provide them with a unity of mutual support.

Ethics requires that we interpret the notion of 'living well' and having 'a good life'. Dworkin's interpretation of these concepts is readily intelligible if we recall that all moral choice depends on ethical responsibility -- which in turn requires that persons interpret and act on moral convictions concerning what makes life worth living. Living well is a moral responsibility of individuals and a continuing exercise of this responsibility. It is a process and 'performance', not an end-state or static condition of character. Living well depends on whether the things one desires are worthy of desire and possess an objective value, apart from the preferences and pleasure embodied in them. Living well is not identical with having a good life, though it involves striving for a good life. One may live well but fall short of a good life due to bad luck, futile efforts, gambles that fail to pay off, accidents and calamities, illness, bad timing. Living well is thus not the same as a successful life, and can involve choices that jeopardize success. On the other hand, the ideal of a good life fails to imply that of living well. On Dworkin's interpretation of living well, a person who attains genuine personal goods through a pattern of deception, cheating, harming others, or neglecting basic obligations fails to live well, even through she may have a good or better life as a result. The value of living well is more fundamental to ethics than a good life, on the basis of the underlying value of ethical responsibility. Living well is a central exercise of one's ethical responsibility, just as living less well or badly in order to obtain a good life is a failure of one's ethical responsibility.

Dworkin's interpretations connect moral virtues (honesty, fair play, respect for others) to the concept of living well, while disconnecting them from the notion of a good life. This is puzzling. Living well is supposed to involve the striving for a good life and both require the pursuit of objectively valuable goods. Presumably honesty, fairness, integrity, sincerity, and respect for others are objectively valuable goods and part of what one strives for in the attempt to live well. Why then are they excluded from Dworkin's interpretation of a good life? The result is a disunity of value because his notion of a good life will support implications for behavior that directly contradict the implications of his interpretation of living well. This result reintroduces the conflict between 'self-interest' and 'morality' that Dworkin aims to overcome through interpretation supporting the unity of value.

But Dworkin further grounds this interpretive scheme by making human dignity central to living well -- and on this basis, reading morality into the conditions of living well. This interpretation of human dignity as the ground of both ethical and moral value -- living well and respecting duties to others -- provides Dworkin's desired unity, integrity of fit, between these two values. But does this interpretation of human dignity explain why the notion of a good life does not also require a life of dignity? The price of disconnecting the concept of a good life from human dignity may be a disunity between the value of a good life and both that of living well and moral duties to others.

Living well implies a conception of human dignity which Dworkin interprets to involve ideals of self-respect and authenticity. Authenticity is taking responsibility for making one's own moral judgments and accepting accountability for acting consistently on them. Living well also involves self-respect -- an attitude one takes to one's life and self. Dworkin distinguishes 'appraisal' from 'recognition' respect. Appraisal respect is the respect that one accords oneself or others on the basis of individual achievements and traits. Recognition respect does not depend on such appraisals. Dworkin interprets it as an attitude of caring how one lives, recognizing the objective value of living well, and living in light of a conception of the sort of person one aspires to be. This condition of self-respect already suggests how living well may require moral virtues and duties, insofar as they enter into a person's self-image.

But is recognition respect by itself sufficient for self-respect and living well -- in the absence of appraisal respect? Consider a person who cares about living well and has a conception of the sort of person she aspires to be, but is an abysmal failure in living up to the conception and thus lacks all appraisal respect. This person may lose all trace of self-respect and living well. Under these circumstances, having the right attitude towards oneself -- 'recognition respect' -- still allows any tangible self-respect to simply dissolve. We must be mindful of Dworkin's point that living well does not require the sorts of achievements and 'success' implied by 'a good life'. Living well and possessing recognition respect requires living for the right things, not necessarily success in attaining them.

But notice that a person who lives and acts 'for the right things', or objective values, necessarily manifests particular character traits such as discipline, consistency, perseverance, integrity, etc., that are objects of appraisal respect. Furthermore, on Dworkin's interpretation, living well requires that one seeks goods -- a good life -- without resorting to deception, cheating, harming others, immoral or evil acts. Thus, recognizable moral virtues are required by living well, but these virtues or their opposite -- moral vices -- are important bases of appraisal-respect. It seems that Dworkin needs a more robust interpretation of self-respect to achieve consistency with the role he gives to moral virtue and duty within his account of living well. Recognition respect, by itself, seems insufficient for self-respect and human dignity.

6. Morality and Duties to Others (255-327)

Dworkin's interpretation of duties to others aims to establish the unity of value. He argues that the best interpretation of 'living well' will yield a way to identify and ground our duties to others. The notion of living well is interpreted to require human dignity and related principles of self-respect and authenticity. Self-respect implies that I recognize the objective value of my life and living well. Dworkin sees such self-respect as requiring that I extend respect to the lives of all other persons. Recognizing that my living well is important, because living well is intrinsically and objectively important, will entail recognizing the objective and equal importance of all others' living well and maintaining self-respect.

But my living well is also a subjective value for me in ways that others' lives need not be. That is, I can respect others and hold that their lives are objectively important without taking the same interest in their lives that I take in my own. This is not primarily a psychological truism, but an interpretation of the notion of living well. Living well is the ethical responsibility of the person whose life is at stake. I am the person who has the most control over my life, and thus it is fitting that I am the one who takes primary responsibility for living well ('authenticity'). Yet at the same time, my dignity grounds the recognition that the lives of others and their self-respect possess equal and objective importance, so that they ought not be a matter of indifference to me. This ethical framework sets the key interpretive challenge: What duties to others are implied by the respect I owe them as a condition of my own dignity, consistent with the ethical responsibility each has for her own life?

Dworkin reads this interpretive problem as the apparent conflict between the two principles of human dignity -- (1) self-respect, implying the equal objective importance of everyone's life, and (2) authenticity, or each person taking individual ethical responsibility for her own life. He calls (1) 'the equal importance principle' and (2) 'the responsibility principle'. The first may imply that I share my resources equally among persons because their lives are just as valuable as mine. The second may imply that I ought to keep whatever resources I need to fulfill my personal responsibility to live well. Dworkin rejects the idea that a compromise must be struck between them. Interpretation seeks a unity or relation of mutual support between them. How? By creating an interpretation of their practical implications such that both principles are satisfied and unified. Such interpretations are value-laden because they require value judgments concerning the content which we ought to give to both principles of dignity.

What duties do we have to give aid to strangers in need? Dworkin interprets the equal importance principle and the personal responsibility principle to determine the extent of these duties. How serious a threat to a person's life or power to live well does the person face in the situation? The importance principle focuses the agent's judgment on the impact of action or inaction on the life of the person in need. What sort of cost does an agent face if she provides aid? The responsibility principle focuses the agent's judgment on the impact of giving aid on her own life. How directly is the agent confronted by the victim's need? If someone is dying right before one's eyes, turning one's back expresses an indifference to the value of human life that would not be evident were the agent far more removed in time and place.

A critic may hold that Dworkin's morality of aid simply reduces to (1) a trade-off between the importance of others' lives and responsibility for one's own life based on (2) a metric of three variables: risk to victim, cost to agent, and immediacy of relationships. But Dworkin rejects any general metric that assigns weights to these considerations in advance of a context where an act of moral interpretation is required to give them their proper due. Similarly, there can be no trade-off between the importance and responsibility principles. Such a trade-off would have to fix the meaning and implications of each of these values in the abstract before they are applied to concrete situations. Acts of interpretive judgment determine how these values should be applied, to give values meaning and generate true moral convictions concerning duties of aid. The unity of value is exhibited when an agent finds a way to act that simultaneously embodies a due regard for the importance of others' lives and, at the same time, for one's personal responsibility for her own life. When an agent finds a way to act that brings together the value of others' lives and responsibility for her own, she affirms her dignity and self-respect through the respect accorded the lives of others and she affirms the respect owed to others' lives through the respect she accords her own life. A successful interpretation of one's duty to aid another 'unifies' the components or conditions of human dignity into a mutually reinforcing whole in a single moral act. This is a striking and inspiring result of Dworkin's interpretive paradigm of the unity of value!

How about the duty not to harm or injure others? Is it worse to deliberately kill another than to let him or her die? What is the moral difference between deliberate injury to others and 'competition harm' -- the setbacks some suffer as the result of others' success in a competitive pursuit? Competition harm constitutes no wrong because it is the inevitable result of human dignity -- the principle that each of us takes personal responsibility for her own life and does her best to succeed. Deliberate injury constitutes a wrongful harm because it deprives others of their human dignity, which requires that they alone exercise personal responsibility and individual control over their own bodies, persons, property. Moral injuries transgress the boundaries in which human dignity can survive.

Dworkin also appeals to his conception of human dignity to account for the moral distinctions between killing a person and letting him die: acts and omissions -- the stringent duty that prohibits deliberate injury and the lesser duty to come to others' aid. The consequence of these acts may be equally deleterious. But deliberate killing and injury are an assault on the dignity of the victim, whereas the failure to provide aid is not such an assault, even when it is wrong. But here we must recall that the duties of aid are also supposed to rest on human dignity -- in particular the principle of self-respect and thus respect for the objective importance of others' lives. Thus the refusal to provide aid at little cost to oneself may embody an indifference to the worth of another's life and thus her dignity. Dworkin's rich interpretation of the principles of human dignity seems to blunt his sharp account of the difference between acts and omissions.

Dworkin employs his reading of human dignity to provide illuminating interpretations of obligations rooted in voluntary commitments (promises) and special associational relations (bonds of family, etc., 300-324).

7. Political Morality (327-417)

What do the members of a political community owe to one another? Dworkin focuses on the concept of individual rights because they provide the bases of a political community's obligations to its members. He understands political rights as protections of interests of persons that are so weighty that they trump other social goals, such as economic growth. The problem is how to identify these interests and political rights.

Dworkin's unity of value thesis is embodied in his argument that political rights are grounded in the same principles of human dignity which underlie ethics and duties to others. In the political context, these principles are interpreted to ground a universal right to equal concern and to equal respect. The right to equal concern, or 'equality', is grounded in the right of all persons to have their lives treated as equally valuable. The right to equal respect is grounded in the right of all persons to exercise personal responsibility over their own lives -- which in the political context implies certain basic liberties for all. If successful, Dworkin's project will unify all of morality on the basis of interpretations which make human dignity the common origin of all its various duties and rights. To this end, he must also show that the dignity principles provide 'the best way' to resolve conflicts between equality and liberty, unifying these political values.

Political thinkers commonly treat liberty and equality as intrinsic values which conflict and require trade-offs. This view fails to understand that liberty and equality are 'interpretive', not 'criterial' concepts; they do not possess fixed meanings and criteria prior to the act of interpretation. Secondly, the above view fails in treating liberty and equality as fundamental intrinsic values, independent and opposed, which violates our moral convictions in the following way. Suppose we analyze liberty as doing whatever one wants, free from legal coercion. We do not regard this liberty as an intrinsic or fundamental value because the liberty to rape, batter, steal, defraud, cheat, etc. are legally sanctioned and not objects of value. Why do we value certain liberties and not others? To answer this question we require an interpretation that identifies some more fundamental value that underlies and fixes the value of liberty and thus can determine which concrete liberties have this value and which do not. Dworkin extends this argument to show that 'equality', and also 'democracy', are interpretive concepts.

Dworkin rests his interpretation of liberty and basic political right on the ideal of respect for each person's responsibility for her own life -- a key requirement of human dignity. Respect for personal responsibility identifies and grounds (1) some measure of self-government -- political rights that empower individuals to participate in the collective decisions through which their lives are governed ('positive liberty'); and (2) some measure of freedom from collective decisions concerning aspects of persons' lives over which they alone should be making decisions for themselves ('negative liberty'). Basic civil liberties -- freedoms from legal or political coercion -- are worked out by identifying practices of coercion which violate or degrade persons' responsibility for their own lives and practices which do not. For example, religious freedom is based on an interpretation of personal responsibility that implies 'ethical independence.' Religious persecution denies persons their freedom to decide matters central to their ethical independence. Other instances of coercion are wrong because they are justified by ethical convictions which are rejected by some members of the political community and compromise their ethical independence. The appeal to ethical independence allows Dworkin to identify and justify familiar liberal rights -- freedom of speech, artistic freedom, freedom of association, sexual liberty, etc. Other instances of legal coercion are just because they do not undermine ethical independence, such as the legal prohibition of theft, assault, and pollution, or the legal requirement of seatbelts, car insurance, and building codes.

The unity of political morality depends on the fit and mutual support that obtains between liberty and equality. Given the underlying value of human dignity, there is no guarantee that its two components -- equal concern for the value of all citizens' lives and equal respect for their responsibility for their lives -- will be mutually reinforcing when applied to questions of liberty and equality. The problem is that any scheme of equality of goods or resources would seem to diminish individual responsibility for the attainment of these goods, bringing inequality in its wake. Dworkin argues that a libertarian standpoint sacrifices an equal concern for the value of persons' lives on the basis of a distorted view of the role of individual responsibility in free market distributions. Welfarist theories seek to absolutize the equal concern principle by favoring distributions that generate equal happiness, capabilities, or opportunities for wellbeing. But these approaches violate the principle of respect for personal responsibility because they deny persons' responsibility for developing their own notions of wellbeing and the choices they make to achieve them. The upshot is that equal concern should focus on resources of general value such as wealth because their distribution allows personal responsibility for determining one's ends or notion of well-being, as well as the conduct one chooses to use such resources to attain one's ends.

Rawls' conception of primary social goods is a prominent paradigm of this approach. From his standpoint, equality is a function of how society distributes goods like income which are both (1) all-purpose means to the free choice and successful pursuit of one's conception of the good and (2) compatible with personal responsibility for one's conception of the good and its achievement. Dworkin's conception of equality depends on hypothetical decisions we might make in highly imaginary circumstances. We are to imagine that we are shipwrecked on an island with diverse natural resources and are each given an equal number of tokens with which to bid for these resources in an open auction. The auction ends when each has used up her tokens as effectively as possible and no one would trade her package of resources for anyone else's. The resulting distribution may not be one in which any particular resource is distributed equally. But this distribution provides an interpretation of the equal concern and equal respect principles of human dignity: equal concern because each starts with an equal share of tokens, and equal respect because each is responsible for the choice of resources she ends up with and the ends she hopes to pursue with these resources. On the other hand, a command or socialist economy is one where government decides the distribution of prices, wages, and resources. But it would have to deny the principle of equal respect because it would determine the notion of human wellbeing and the resources most valuable to different individuals, which rather should be determined by the exercise of personal responsibility. A just distribution of resources requires some form of a free market, capitalist economy: indeed, an egalitarian form.

But for Dworkin the distribution of resources that obtains in the above desert island auction does not attain a stable justice that accords with human dignity for two reasons. First, ongoing market relations require legal regulation to correct injustices rooted in monopolies and externalities. For example, investment bankers make highly risky decisions that harm the value of assets held by people with no control over these decisions. Similarly, market forces generate the harms of pollution and global warming which degrade the resources and lives of persons who are not responsible for them. Secondly, even though an equality of resources results from the desert island auction, in real life this equality degenerates due to bad luck, illness, market fluctuations, or differences in talent, which create inegalitarian distributions not based on individual choice and responsibility.

How do we discount the effects of bad luck on the distribution of resources, while preserving respect for personal responsibility? Dworkin's answer is to imagine that insurance against bad luck and low income is also a resource at stake in the desert island auction. He then imagines what level of insurance people would purchase with their equal tokens under ideal conditions of knowledge and equality of risk. There is a high degree of uncertainty in any answer, he concedes, but we may assume that there is some minimal level of coverage all would choose and be willing to subsidize. This hypothetical insurance scheme is supposed to assure an equality of resources that meets the principles of equal concern and equal respect.

Dworkin's turn to an interpretation of equality that relies on imaginary, hypothetical constructs makes it difficult to know how resources will in fact be distributed, or what resources would be chosen. In the case of his interpretation of liberty, we know that certain specific civil and political liberties are implied. But what distribution of which resources is implied by his interpretation of equality? Lacking a clear answer to this question, we cannot judge whether he succeeds in unifying the values of liberty and equality, and thus political morality as a whole. Consider the conflicts between liberty and equality which may arise from the requirement that all agree to subsidize a minimal monetary level of coverage for all. Dworkin assumes that responsible agents will embrace different personal ends and thus need or value different resources. Such resources will have different monetary costs and values, thus different prices to insure. If my resources are less expensive to insure than yours, I may think it unfair to subsidize a level of coverage for you which I do not need. A public policy that requires this subsidy may violate the value of personal responsibility and my freedom to use my resources as I choose.

How then might we assure equal concern for the value of all lives and some level of equality of resources, but not one which conflicts with liberty and personal responsibility? In this context, there is a more straightforward moral interpretation of equal concern that may solve the problem in a manner that does not require Dworkin's imaginary circumstances with uncertain outcomes. We might interpret human dignity and the principle of human concern to imply that each person is guaranteed a baseline of goods minimally necessary for living well, however individuals define it, and for cases where they fall below it through bad luck. This is the familiar idea that a just society based on equal concern insures its members against poverty, hunger, homelessness, illiteracy, illness, unemployment, drudgery, idleness, etc., in a way that respects their responsibility for their own lives. This moral interpretation of equality may possess the sort of concreteness that Dworkin needs in order to vindicate the unity of equal concern with equal respect, equality with liberty.

Dworkin's account of political morality also includes rewarding interpretations of human rights, democracy and law.

8. Conclusion

The heart and soul of Dworkin's work is the argument for the unity of value which defends an original account of ethics, morality, and politics. The unity of value rests on Dworkin's paradigm of value-laden interpretation and a conception of human dignity that places it at the core of all spheres of value. The paradigm of interpretation powerfully speaks to the practices of philosophers, but to ordinary moral agents as well, generating remarkable unity between scholarly interpretation and the acts of interpretation involved in everyday ethical conduct. Moral life and its philosophy may both be transformed by the idea that they are not as well understood as the search for abstract principles or fixed moral meanings. Rather, we get a better grip if we grasp that our common values require interpretations to seek out their practical implications for conduct and reconcile them on the basis of more fundamental ideals. This creates a deep shift in our understanding of ethics. The further thought that our values and their implications are best identified and reconciled on the basis of an underlying ideal of human dignity should provoke considerable discussion. Dworkin puts flesh on this ideal and spells out the roles it can serve in dealing with many problems. His work exhibits a profound moral seriousness that engages us and breathes fresh life into the task of living and thinking a good life in a just society. We may be rightfully gratified that at the onset of the new millennium, there is the bright light of this work to renew our quest to grasp the human condition.



[1] A longer version of this review is available from the author.